Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Descartes' Theory of Ideas

1. In the above, the Adam and Tannery volumes, Oeuvres De Descartes, (11 volumes) are cited. Such citations are abbreviated as AT, followed by the appropriate volume and page numbers. I have whenever possible used the Cottingham, Stoothoff, and Murdoch translation, The Philosophical Writings Of Descartes (3 volumes), abbreviated as CSM. Volume 3 includes Anthony Kenny as a translator. This has been abbreviated as CSMK, followed by the appropriate volume and page numbers. The AT and CSM/CSMK numbers are cited side by side, separated by a semicolon. Thus, the citation for the letter to Gibeuf is: AT III 474; CSMK III 201.

2. It is worth mentioning that early in Descartes' career he appeared to think of ideas as also being corporeal, that is, as modes of extension. For example, in the early L'Homme de Rene Descartes (written sometime before 1632), which Claude Clerselier (1614-1684) edited and then published (giving it this title) in 1664, fourteen years after Descartes's death, Descartes tells us that the figures "traced in the spirits on the surface" of the pineal gland are ideas. (AT XI 176; CSM I 106) But by the time he was writing the Meditations Descartes' view is clear: ideas are modes of thought.