Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Catharine Trotter Cockburn

1. There has recently been some controversy raised regarding Cockburn's dates. According to Margaret Connor in her article entitled “Catharine Trotter: An Unknown Child?,” Cockburn makes reference to her son's approaching marriage in a letter of December 13,1707 [ANQ, vol. 8, #4, 1995: 11-14]. On the basis of this evidence, Connor concludes that Cockburn's dates would seem to have been altered by herself or Birch, as she would very likely have been older than 28 in order to have a grown son.In response to this, however, Anne Kelley, in her book Catharine Trotter points out that the manuscript version of this letter is a copy, not written in Cockburn's handwriting. It is very possible, she writes, that there was a mistake in the transcription, rather than any of the dissembling about birth dates suggested by Connor's article, "Catharine Trotter: An early modern writer in the vanguard of feminism" (Hampshire, Eng., Ashgate, 2002, p.39). I will continue to refer to the dates provided in the biography Thomas Birch included in the Works, as it is impossible with the limited information we currently have to determine whether or not her dates are correct.