Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Philosophy of Chemistry

1. DG abbreviates De Generatione et Corruptione. All quotations from Aristotle are from The Complete Works (ed. Barnes) unless otherwise indicated.

2. This can be confusing for modern readers with some knowledge of chemistry in view of the distinction commonly drawn between compounds and solutions, both of which may well be homogeneous. But in deference to philosophical tradition we follow this usage here conscious that Aristotle recognized no such distinction.

3. Mendeleev writes:

However, everybody understands that in all changes in the properties of simple substances, something remains unchanged and that, in the transformation of the elements into compounds, this material something determines the characteristics common to the compounds formed by a given element. In this regard only a numerical value is known, and this is the atomic weight appropriate to the element. The magnitude of the atomic weight, according to the according to the actual, essential nature of the concept, is a quantity which does not refer to the momentary state of a simple substance but rather belongs to a material portion of it — a portion which it has in common with the free simple substance and with all its compounds. The atomic weight does not belong to coal or to the diamond but rather to carbon. (1869/2005, 24-25)

4. A body with different temperatures in different parts doesn't have a temperature, only its parts do. A body not at equilibrium might not be so turbulent that the laws of irreversible thermodynamics apply, in which case the intensive properties, such as temperature, are ascribed to points and these vary smoothly from one to another. Even here temperature is intensive, the fact that points don't have proper parts notwithstanding, since it still holds that all the parts of a point which has a temperature have the same temperature.