Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Chaos

1. Different authors use the terms ‘geometric growth’ and ‘exponential growth’ differently than I define them here.

2. Some authors advocate characterizing chaos in terms of notions from ergodic theory. For some discussion and references, see (Sklar 1995, pp. 235-40; Berkovitz, Frigg and Kronz 2006).

3. There is an additional problem in that many of the maps in chaos studies (e.g., the baker’s transformation) have purely mathematical origins rather than being derived from some more complex model for a target system. What connection these maps are supposed to have with the space of possibilities of real systems is difficult to see.

4. As long as there is some uncertainty in the initial data of a target system even a very faithful model’s output will diverge away from the behavior of the target system. This is because any uncertainty in ascertaining the true initial conditions leads to divergence in the model behavior from the system behavior; and, there is no way to reduce this uncertainty to zero (e.g., Bishop 2003).

5. For difficulties marrying up classical and quantum phase spaces, see (Bishop and Kronz 1999, pp. 135-136).

6. Control parameters are particular variables or other features of a system–e.g., temperature, voltage, flow rate–that we can change in a precise fashion and then observe how the system behaves as this parameter varies. These parameters make reference to structural aspects of the systems in question, like changes in temperature reflecting the energy input into the system.

7. Note that Smart’s objection presupposes mind-brain identity (see The Identity Theory of Mind).

8. Many authors have concluded that Prigogine and collaborators were arguing that trajectories did not exist, but this is not the case. The matter is somewhat technical and the Brussels-Austin Group has been notoriously unclear in writing about this point (see Bishop 2004).