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The Capability Approach

First published Thu Apr 14, 2011

The capability approach is a theoretical framework that entails two core normative claims: first, the claim that the freedom to achieve well-being is of primary moral importance, and second, that freedom to achieve well-being is to be understood in terms of people's capabilities, that is, their real opportunities to do and be what they have reason to value. The approach has been developed in a variety of more specific normative theories, such as (partial) theories of social justice or accounts of development ethics. It has also led to a new and highly interdisciplinary literature in the social sciences resulting in new statistics and social indicators, and to a new policy paradigm which is mainly used in development studies, the so-called ‘human development approach’.

This entry will be limited to an explication of the capability approach from a philosophical point of view. Readers who are interested in a discussion of the capability approach from the perspective of the social sciences are referred to Comim, Qizilbash and Alkire (eds., 2008), Deneulin (ed., 2009) and Kuklys (2005). For a brief overview of how the approach has been applied in practice, see Robeyns (2006). For a comprehensive introduction to the human development approach, see Fukuda-Parr (2003) and Fukuda-Parr and Kumar (eds., 2009).

1. What kind of theoretical framework?

Within moral and political philosophy, the capability approach has in recent decades emerged as a new theoretical framework about well-being, development and justice. Although we can trace some aspects of the capability approach back to, among others, Aristotle, Adam Smith, and Karl Marx (see Nussbaum 1988, 1992; Sen 1993, 1999: 14, 24; Walsh 2000), it is economist-philosopher Amartya Sen who pioneered the approach and philosopher Martha Nussbaum and a growing number of other scholars across the humanities and the social sciences who have significantly developed it. The capability approach purports that freedom to achieve well-being is a matter of what people are able to do and to be, and thus the kind of life they are effectively able to lead. The capability approach is generally conceived as a flexible and multi-purpose framework, rather than a precise theory of well-being (Sen 1992: 48; Qizilbash 2008: 53–54; Robeyns 2005: 94–96). This open-ended and underspecified nature partly explains why the term ‘capability approach’ was chosen and is now used in the philosophical literature rather than, say, ‘capability theory’. The terms ‘capability approach’ and ‘capabilities approach’ are both used in the literature to refer to the same thing.

Despite some philosophical disagreements about the best description of the capability approach, it is generally understood as a conceptual framework for a range of normative exercises, including most prominent the following: (1) the assessment of individual well-being; (2) the evaluation and assessment of social arrangements; and (3) the design of policies and proposals about social change in society. In all these normative exercises, the capability approach prioritizes certain of peoples' beings and doings and their opportunities to realize those beings and doings (such as their genuine opportunities to be educated, their ability to move around or to enjoy supportive social relationships). This stands in contrast to other accounts of well-being, which focus exclusively on subjective categories (such as happiness) or on the material means to well-being (such as resources like income or wealth).

Scholars and policy makers use the capability approach in a wide range of fields, most prominently in development studies and policymaking, welfare economics, social policy, and social and political philosophy. Yet across these areas, the capability approach can be employed in both narrower and broader ways (Crocker and Robeyns 2009). In the more narrow way, the capability approach tells us what information we should look at if we are to judge how well someone's life is going or has gone; this kind of information is needed in any account of well-being or human development. Since the capability approach contends that the relevant kind of information concerns human functionings (beings and doings) and capabilities (the opportunities to achieve those beings and doings), the approach provides part of what is needed for interpersonal comparisons of well-being. This makes the approach attractive to a variety of theorists and scholars since interpersonal comparisons are needed for a range of different exercises, such as comparing how well two persons (or groups or societies) are doing at the same time or comparing one person (or groups or society) at two different moments in time. In the narrower use of the capability approach, the focus is often strictly on the evaluation of individual functioning levels or on both functionings and capabilities. However, to apply this approach, we also need to decide which are the beings and doings that matter for the various normative usages of the approach (the selection of functionings and capabilities) and how each person's various functionings or capabilities are to be aggregated into one overall assessment of well-being or of freedom to achieve well-being (the aggregation of the various dimensions). These are crucial challenges for the capability approach, and will be discussed in more detail in Section 3.2.

In its broader uses, the capability approach not only evaluates the lives of individuals (as in the more narrow use), but also includes other considerations in its evaluations. For example, the broader use of the capability approach often pays attention to other normative considerations and other values than only well-being, such as efficiency, agency, or procedural fairness. For example, David Crocker (2008) has extended the capability approach with accounts of agency and participation into a more detailed account of development ethics, but discusses at length that not all versions of the capability approach are embracing agency so explicitly. Similarly, the capability approach can be developed into an alternative evaluative tool which can replace traditional social cost-benefit analysis (Alkire 2002). Or it can be used as a normative framework within which to evaluate and design policies and social institutions, ranging from welfare-state design in relatively affluent societies (Wolff and de-Shalit 2007), to governmental and nongovernmental development policies in poor countries, to policies that affluent countries and international institutions employ (or are advised to employ) in their efforts to aid poor countries (UNDP 1990–2010). In what follows we will discuss the capability approach in its narrow use, except if otherwise indicated.

The capability approach is a normative theory, rather than an explanatory theory: in other words, it is not a theory that will explain poverty, inequality, or well-being, but rather a theory that helps us to conceptualize these notions. Nevertheless, the notions of functionings and capabilities in themselves can be employed as elements in explanations of social phenomena, or one can use these notions in descriptions of poverty, inequality, quality of life, and social change.

Before moving on, one more clarification is in order. Within the analytical strand of political philosophy, there are roughly two different types of answers to the question: “What is the purpose of doing political philosophy?” The first answer is that political philosophy should be truth-seeking, even if that implies, for example, that political ideals such as justice, equality or democracy are unachievable. The truth-seeking strand within political philosophy produces a focused and often highly abstract type of analysis, which does not make the messy compromises that are needed to make the analysis directly relevant for practice (e.g., subjecting the analysis to constraints of feasibility). G.A. Cohen has been a prominent exponent of the truth-seeking strand within political philosophy (Cohen 2008: 1–25). The alternative approach to political philosophy is the practical approach, whose purpose is the direct (or indirect) guidance of our actions and decisions. The practical approach to political philosophy is more likely to take into account several types of constraints on our actions, including feasibility constraints but also facts about the world as we know it, such as the condition of relative scarcity of resources. The practical approach to political philosophy obviously also aims to respect truth (in so far as this is known) in its analyses, but is willing to make some simplifications and the above-mentioned compromises in order to move the analysis forward to the realm of practical recommendations—a realm in which the truth-seeking approach is much less likely to arrive due to the never-ending analysis of yet another detail of the structure or properties of a concept that needs to be analyzed. The distinction between the truth-seeking and the practical approach is very important for properly understanding the capability approach, since with very few exceptions (e.g., Vallentyne 2005), all philosophical work on the capability approach falls into the practical domain of political philosophy. All that follows should therefore be read against the background of the assumption that we are operating within the practical strand of political philosophy.

2. The core ideas

2.1 Functionings and capabilities

Functionings are ‘beings and doings’, that is, various states of human beings and activities that a person can undertake. Examples of the former (the ‘beings’) are being well-nourished, being undernourished, being housed in a pleasantly warm but not excessively hot house, being educated, being illiterate, being part of a supportive social network, being part of a criminal network, and being depressed. Examples of the second group of functionings (the ‘doings’) are travelling, caring for a child, voting in an election, taking part in a debate, taking drugs, killing animals, eating animals, consuming lots of fuel in order to heat one's house, and donating money to charity.

From these examples we can draw a couple of observations. First, these examples indicate that many features of a person could be described either as a being or as a doing: we can say that a person is housed in a pleasantly warm house, or that this person does consume lots of energy to keep her house warm. Yet other functionings are much more straightforwardly described as either a being or a doing, for example ‘being healthy’ or ‘killing animals’. The second observation is that the notion of ‘functionings’ is a conceptual category that is in itself morally neutral. Functionings can be univocally good (e.g., being in good health) or univocally bad (e.g., being raped). But the goodness or badness of various other functionings may not be so straightforward, but rather depend on the context and/or the normative theory which we endorse. For example, is the care work of a mother who is caring full-time for her child a valuable functioning or not? A conservative-communitarian normative theory will most likely mark this as a valuable functioning, whereas a feminist-liberal theory will only do so if the care work is the result of an autonomous choice made against a background of equal opportunities and fair support for those who have duties to care for dependents.

Capabilities are a person's real freedoms or opportunities to achieve functionings. Thus, while travelling is a functioning, the real opportunity to travel is the corresponding capability. The distinction between functionings and capabilities is between the realized and the effectively possible, in other words, between achievements, on the one hand, and freedoms or valuable opportunities from which one can choose, on the other.

2.2 A metric for interpersonal comparisons

According to the capability approach, ‘functionings’ and ‘capabilities’ are the best metric for most kinds of interpersonal evaluations. In other words, those interpersonal evaluations should be conceptualized in terms of people's capabilities to function, that is, their effective opportunities to undertake actions and activities that they have reason to value, and be the person that they have reason to want to be. These beings and doings together are held to constitute what makes a life valuable. Whereas ‘functionings’ are the proposed conceptualization for interpersonal comparisons of (achieved) well-being, ‘capabilities’ are the conceptualization for interpersonal comparisons of the freedom to pursue well-being, which Sen calls “well-being freedom” (Sen 1992: 40).

The relevant functionings can vary from such elementary things as being adequately nourished, being in good health, avoiding escapable morbidity and premature mortality, to more complex achievements such as having a decent and valuable job, not suffering from lack of self-respect, taking active part in the life of the community, and so on. The claim is that functionings are constitutive of a person's being, and an evaluation of well-being has to take the form of an assessment of these constituent elements (Sen 1992: 39). To say that functionings are constitutive of a person's being means that one cannot be a human being without having at least a range of functionings: they make the lives of human beings both lives (in contrast to the existence of innate objects) and also human (in contrast to the lives of trees or tigers). Human functionings are those beings and doings that we take to constitute a human life, and which are central in our understandings of ourselves as human beings. This implies that the range of potentially relevant functionings is very broad, and that the capability approach will in some respects be close to both subjective metrics (for example, by including the capability to be happy), or resources-based metrics (since most functionings require some resources as inputs). Yet not all beings and doings are functionings; for example, being able to fly like a bird or reaching an age of 200 like an oak tree, are not human functionings.

Thus, according to the capability approach, the ends of well-being freedom, justice, and development should be conceptualized in terms of people's capabilities. Moreover, what is relevant is not only which opportunities are open to me each by themselves, hence in a piecemeal way, but rather which combinations or sets of potential functionings are open to me. For example, suppose I am a low-skilled poor single parent who lives in a society without decent social provisions. Take the following functionings: (1) to hold a job, which will require me to spend many hours on working and commuting, but will generate the income needed to properly feed myself and my family; (2) to care for my children at home and give them all the attention, care and supervision they need. In a piecemeal analysis, both (1) and (2) are opportunities open to me, but they are not both together open to me. The point about the capability approach is precisely that we must take a comprehensive or holistic approach, and ask which sets of capabilities are open to me, that is: can I simultaneously provide for my family and properly care for and supervise my children? Or am I rather forced to make some hard, perhaps even tragic choices between two functionings which both reflect basic needs and basic moral duties?

Note that while most types of capability analysis require interpersonal comparisons, one could also use the capability approach to evaluate the well-being or well-being freedom of one person at one point in time (e.g., evaluate her situation against a capability-yardstick), or to evaluate the changes in her well-being or well-being freedom over time. The capability approach could thus also be used by a single individual in her deliberate decision-making or evaluation processes, but these types of uses of the capability approach are much less prevalent in the philosophical literature, let alone in the social sciences.

2.3 The means-ends distinction

The capability approach explicitly endorses and relies upon a key analytical distinction in practical philosophy, namely the means-ends distinction. The approach stresses that we should always be clear, when valuing something, whether we value it as an end in itself, or as a means to a valuable end. For the capability approach, the ultimate ends of interpersonal comparisons are people's capabilities. This implies that the capability approach evaluates policies and other changes according to their impact on people's capabilities as well as their actual functionings. It asks whether people are able to be healthy, and whether the means or resources necessary for this capability, such as clean water, adequate sanitation, access to doctors, protection from infections and diseases, and basic knowledge on health issues, are present. It asks whether people are well-nourished, and whether the means or conditions for the realization of this capability, such as having sufficient food supplies and food entitlements, are being met. It asks whether people have access to a high-quality education system, to real political participation, and to community activities that support them, that enable them to cope with struggles in daily life, and that foster caring and warm friendships.

Much of the critique that capability theorists have advanced against alternative normative frameworks (such as Dworkinian resourcism, or the Rawlsian social primary goods approach), can be traced back to the objection that alternative approaches value particular means to well-being rather than the ends. The main reason why the capability approach holds that it is better to focus on the ends rather than the means, is that people differ in their ability to convert means into valuable opportunities (capabilities) or outcomes (functionings) (Sen 1992: 26–28, 36–38). Since ends are what ultimately matters when thinking about well-being and the quality of life, means can only work as reliable proxies of people's opportunities to achieve those ends if they all have the same capacities or powers to convert those means into equal capability sets. Capability scholars believe that these inter-individual differences are far-reaching and significant, and that theories which focus on means tend to downplay their normative relevance. In the theoretical framework of the capability approach, these inter-individual differences are captured by the notion of ‘conversion factors’ (see Section 2.4).

One could argue, however, that the capability approach does not focus entirely on ends, but rather on the question whether a person is being put in the conditions in which she can pursue her ultimate ends. For example, being able to read could be seen as not an ultimate end in itself, since people's ultimate ends will be more specific, such as reading street signs, the newspaper, or the Bible or Koran. It is therefore somewhat more precise to say that the capability approach focuses on people's ends in terms of beings and doings expressed in general terms: being literate, being mobile, being able to hold a decent job. Whether a particular person then decides to translate these general capabilities in the more specific capabilities A, B or C (e.g., reading street signs, reading the newspaper, or reading the Bible), is up to them. Whether that person decides to stay put, travel to the US or rather to China, is not normatively relevant for the capability approach: the question is rather whether a person has these capabilities in more general terms.

Of course, the normative focus on ends does not imply that the capability approach does not at all value means such as material or financial resources. Instead, a capability analysis will typically also focus on resources and other means. For example, in their evaluation of development in India, Jean Drèze and Amartya Sen (2002: 3) have stressed that working within the capability approach in no way excludes the integration of an analysis of resources, such as food, or other resources. In sum, all the means of well-being, like the availability of commodities, legal entitlements to them, other social institutions, and so forth, are important, but the capability approach presses the point that they are not the ends of well-being, only their means. Food may be abundant in the village, but a starving person may have nothing to exchange for it, no legal claim on it, or no way of preventing intestinal parasites from consuming it before he or she does. In all these cases at least some resources will be available, but it will still leave that person hungry and, after a while, undernourished.

Yet one could wonder: wouldn't it be better to focus on means only, rather than making the normative analysis more complicated and more informationally demanding by also focusing on functionings and capabilities? Capability scholars would respond that starting a normative analysis from the ends rather than means has at least two advantages, apart from the earlier mentioned fundamental reason that a focus on ends is needed to appropriately capture inter-individual differences. First, the valuation of means will retain the status of an instrumental valuation rather than take on the nature of an intrinsic valuation. For example, money or economic growth will not be valued for their own sake, but only in so far as they contribute to an expansion of people's capabilities. Second, by starting from ends, we do not a priori assume that there is only one overridingly important means to that ends (such as income), but rather explicitly ask the question which types of means are important for the fostering and nurturing of a particular capability, or set of capabilities. For some capabilities, the most important means will indeed be financial resources and economic production, but for others it may be particular political practices and institutions, such as effective guarantees and protections of freedom of thought, political participation, social or cultural practices, social structures, social institutions, public goods, social norms, and traditions and habits. As a consequence, an effective capability-enhancing policy may not exist in increasing disposable income, but rather fighting a homophobic, ethnophobic, racist or sexist social climate.

2.4 Conversion factors

Another important idea in the capability approach, especially in the work by Amartya Sen (1992: 19–21, 26–30, 37–38) and scholars influenced by his writings, is the notion of conversion factors. Resources, such as marketable goods and services, but also goods and services emerging from the non-market economy, including household production, have certain characteristics that make them of interest to people. For example, we may be interested in a bike not because it is an object made from certain materials with a specific shape and color, but because it can take us to places where we want to go, and in a faster way than if we were walking. These characteristics of a good or commodity enable or contribute to a functioning. A bike enables the functioning of mobility, to be able to move oneself freely and more rapidly than walking. The relation between a good and the achievement of certain beings and doings is captured with the term ‘conversion factor’: the degree in which a person can transform a resource into a functioning. For example, an able bodied person who was taught to ride a bicycle when he was a child has a high conversion factor enabling him to turn the bicycle into the ability to move around efficiently, whereas a person with a physical impairment or someone who was never taught to ride a bike has a very low conversion factor. The conversion factors thus represent how much functioning one can get out of a good or service; in our example, how much mobility the person can get out of a bicycle.

There are several different types of conversion factors, and the conversion factors discussed are often categorized into three groups (Robeyns 2005: 99). All conversion factors influence how a person can be or is free to convert the characteristics of the resources into a functioning, yet the sources of these factors may differ. Personal conversion factors are internal to the person, such as metabolism, physical condition, sex, reading skills, or intelligence. If a person is disabled, is in bad physical condition, or has never learned to cycle, then the bike will be of limited help in enabling the functioning of mobility. Social conversion factors are factors from the society in which one lives, such as public policies, social norms, practices that unfairly discriminate, societal hierarchies, or power relations related to class, gender, race, or caste. Environmental conversion factors emerge from the physical or built environment in which a person lives. Among aspects of one's geographical location are climate, pollution, the proneness to earthquakes, and the presence or absence of seas and oceans. Among aspects of the built environment are the stability of buildings, roads, and bridges, and the means of transportation and communication. Take the example of the bicycle. How much a bicycle contributes to a person's mobility depends on that person's physical condition (a personal conversion factor), the social mores including whether women are socially allowed to ride a bicycle (a social conversion factor), and the available of decent roads or bike paths (an environmental conversion factor).

The three types of conversion factors all stress that it is not sufficient to know the resources a person owns or can use in order to be able to assess the well-being that he or she has achieved or could achieve; rather, we need to know much more about the person and the circumstances in which he or she is living. Sen uses “capability” not to refer exclusively to a person's abilities or other internal powers but to refer to an opportunity made feasible, and constrained by, both internal (personal) and external (social and environmental) conversion factors (Crocker 2008: 171–2; Robeyns 2005: 99).

2.5 Acknowledging human diversity

A strong acknowledgment of human diversity is one of the key theoretical driving forces of the capability approach. Its criticism of other normative approaches is often fueled by, and based on, the claim that the full human diversity among people is insufficiently acknowledged in many normative theories, such as theories of distributive justice. This also explains why the capability approach is often favorably regarded by feminist philosophers, or philosophers concerned with care and disability issues, since one of their main complaints about mainstream moral and political philosophy has precisely been the relative invisibility of the fate of those people whose lives did not correspond to that of an able-bodied, non-dependent, caregiving-free individual who belongs to the dominant ethnic, racial and religious group. People of color, marginalized people, the disabled and many women do not fit that picture.

The capability approach thus takes account of human diversity in at least two ways. First, by its focus on the plurality of functionings and capabilities as important evaluative spaces. By including a wide range of dimensions in the conceptualization of well-being and well-being outcomes, the approach broadens the so-called ‘informational basis’ of assessments, and thereby includes some dimensions that may be particularly important for some groups but less so for others. For example, in standard outcome assessments, women as a group virtually always end up being worse off than men. But if the selection of outcome dimensions is shifted to also include the quality and quantity of social relations and support, and being able to engage in hands-on care, then the normative assessment of gender inequality becomes less univocal and requires much further argument and normative defense, including being explicit about how to aggregate different dimensions (Robeyns 2003).

Secondly, human diversity is stressed in the capability approach by the explicit focus on personal and socio-environmental conversion factors that make possible the conversion of commodities and other resources into functionings, and on the social, institutional, and environmental context that affects the conversion factors and the capability set directly. Each individual has a unique profile of conversion factors, some of which are body-related, others of which are shared with all people from her community, and still others of which are shared with people with the same social characteristics (e.g., same gender or class or race characteristics).

2.6 Basic capabilities

The terminology in the literature on the capability approach has changed over time, and this has led to some confusing use of certain terms, and also to difficulties in properly interpreting the earlier contributions in this field. This is importantly exemplified by the different interpretations of the term ‘basic capabilities’. Martha Nussbaum (2000: 84) uses the term ‘basic capabilities’ to refer to “the innate equipment of individuals that is necessary for developing the more advanced capabilities”, such as the capability of speech and language, which is present in a newborn but needs to be fostered. Amartya Sen (1980) mentioned the term ‘basic capability’ as his first rough attempt to answer the ‘equality of what?’ question, but changed his terminology in subsequent work (what he called ‘basic capability’ would later become ‘capability’).

In later work, Sen reserved the term ‘basic capabilities’ to refer to a threshold level for the relevant capabilities. A basic capability is “the ability to satisfy certain elementary and crucially important functionings up to certain levels” (Sen 1992: 45 n. 19). Basic capabilities refer to the freedom to do some basic things considered necessary for survival and to avoid or escape poverty or other serious deprivations. The relevance of basic capabilities is “not so much in ranking living standards, but in deciding on a cut-off point for the purpose of assessing poverty and deprivation” (Sen 1987: 109).

Hence, while the notion of capabilities refers to a very broad range of opportunities, basic capabilities refer to the real opportunity to avoid poverty or to meet or exceed a threshold of well-being. Basic capabilities will thus be crucial for poverty analysis and in general for studying the well-being of the majority of people in poor countries, or for theories of justice that endorse sufficiency as their distributive rule. In affluent countries, by contrast, well-being analysis would often focus on capabilities that are less necessary for survival. It is important to acknowledge that the capability approach is not restricted to poverty and deprivation analysis but can also serve as a framework for, say, project or policy evaluations or inequality measurement in non-poor communities. Sen's and Nussbaum's extensive writings on the capability approach may mislead us into thinking that the capability approach is about poverty and development issues only, but there is conceptually or normatively no reason to restrict its scope in this way.

2.7 Capabilities as freedoms

Another frequent misunderstanding in the secondary literature concerns the use of the term ‘freedom’. Especially in his more recent work, Amartya Sen often equates capabilities with freedoms, without always specifying in more detail what kind of freedoms he is referring to. Yet this equation can easily be misunderstood since, as Sen himself acknowledges, there are many kinds of freedom (some valuable, some detrimental, and some trivial) and ‘freedom’ means very different things to different people.

One important misunderstanding to get out of the way is that capabilities as freedoms refer exclusively to the “free market.” Sen does argue that people have reason to value the freedom or liberty to produce, buy, and sell in markets. This point, however, is part of his more general work on development, and is a very different matter than the highly disputed question in economics and politics regarding the benefits and limits of the market as a system of economic production and distribution. Functionings and capabilities are conceptualizations of well-being achievements and well-being freedoms, and the question which economic institutions are the best institutional means to foster functionings and capabilities is both analytically but also politically a question that can only be settled after we first agree what economic outcomes we should be aiming at—and this is a question to which the capability approach gives a (partial) answer.

Yet if Sen and other capability scholars label capabilities as freedoms, then what kind of freedoms are capabilities? A careful reading of Sen's work clarifies that capabilities are freedoms conceived as real opportunities (Sen 1985a: 3–4; 1985b: 201; 2002: chapter 20). For Sen, capabilities as freedoms refer to the presence of valuable options or alternatives, in the sense of opportunities that do not exist only formally or legally but are also effectively available to the agent. As Alexander Kaufman (2006a) has shown, understanding capability as an opportunity concept of freedom, rather than some other kind of freedom, may undermine mistaken critiques on Sen's work.

3. Specifying the capability approach

The capability approach conceptualizes a metric of well-being (in terms of functionings) and well-being freedom (in terms of capabilities). However, clearly this still leaves open a range of very different capability theories to emerge from these metrics. Three components of specification are widely acknowledged in the capability literature. First, is the appropriate focus functionings, or rather capabilities? Second, how are we to select and aggregate the multiple dimensions of the capability approach? And finally, since the capability approach only specifies a metric of justice, what else is needed for a full capability theory of justice to be developed?

3.1 Functionings or capabilities?

Scholars interested in the capability approach have debated the question of whether the appropriate well-being metric should be capabilities or functionings, hence opportunities or achievements. What considerations have been argued to be relevant for this choice?

The first consideration is normative, and this is the argument Sen and Nussbaum most often offer: by focusing on capabilities rather than functionings, we do not privilege a particular account of good lives but instead aim at a range of possible ways of life from which each person can choose. Thus, it is the liberal nature of the capability approach, or an anti-paternalist consideration, that motivates a principled choice for capabilities rather than functionings. Obviously, the strength of this argument depends on how bad one takes paternalism to be. There may be good reasons to believe that some paternalism is unavoidable, or even desired (Nussbaum 2000: 51–56). Moreover, many would hold that there is most likely some paternalism in the selection of capabilities anyway.

A second normative consideration stems from the importance given to personal responsibility in contemporary political philosophy. If one believes that one should strive for equality of capability, then each person should have the same real opportunity (capability), but once that is in place, each individual should be held responsible for his or her own choices. This responsibility-sensitivity principle is widely endorsed not only in political philosophy but also in the mathematical models being developed in normative welfare economics. If one wants to endorse and implement this principle of responsibility-sensitivity, then specifications and applications of the capability approach should focus on capabilities, rather than functionings. Yet even at a highly abstract theoretical level, philosophers disagree on whether we should endorse responsibility-sensitivity in developing the capability approach (e.g., Fleurbaey 2002; Vallentyne 2005; Wolff and de-Shalit 2007). Moreover, for applied work, serious epistemological hurdles may ultimately lead us to drop the responsibility-sensitive principle for practical reasoning about the actual world.

Third, there are cases in which a capability is available to a person but only if other people do not also want to realize that capability (Basu 1987: 74). For example, two spouses may each have the capability of holding demanding jobs which are each on their own incompatible with large caring responsibilities. However, if these spouses also have infants or relatives with extensive care needs, then at best only one of them may effectively realize that capability. Since capability sets may therefore include freedoms that are conditional (because they depend on the choices of other people), it might be better to focus both on the individual's capability set and also on what people have been able to realize from their own capability sets, that is, their functionings or well-being achievements. The question of who decides or should decide this sort of spousal question highlights the importance of agency and procedural fairness, which are generally taken to be part of the capability approach in its broader use (Crocker 2008).

It should also be mentioned that the concept of functioning has particular relevance for our relations to those human beings who are not yet able to choose (infants), who will never be able to choose (severely mentally disabled individuals), or who have lost this ability through advanced dementia or serious brain damage. Whether or not these persons can decide to be well nourished and healthy, it is generally held that we (through families, governments, or other institutions) have the moral obligation to promote or protect their nutritional and healthy functioning.

Finally, the choice between functionings and capabilities can also be bridged by a conceptual move. Sen (1987: 36–7) has proposed the concept of ‘refined functioning’ to designate functioning that takes note of the available alternatives. Sen (1992: 52) notes: “‘fasting’ as a functioning is not just starving; it is choosing to starve when one does have other options.” That is, one could focus on achieved functionings levels but—where appropriate—include the exercise of choice as one of the relevant functionings (Fleurbaey 2002; Stewart 1995).

In addition to these normative and conceptual arguments, there are also concerns related to the application and measurability that influence the choice of capabilities, functionings, or a combination of the two (Robeyns 2006). It is, for example, almost always easier to observe and measure functionings than capabilities (Sen 1992: 52–3).

3.2 Selecting and aggregating of capabilities?

Other major points of debate in the capability literature are the questions of which capabilities should be selected as relevant and who should decide (or how a decision should be made) on the aggregation of the various dimensions into an overall assessment. At the level of ideal theories of justice, some have argued that each and every capability is relevant and should count in our moral calculus (Vallentyne 2005). Others have argued that considerations of justice require that we demarcate morally relevant from morally irrelevant and morally bad capabilities (Nussbaum 2003; Pogge 2002; Pierik and Robeyns 2007). This demarcation could be done in various ways, and most capability scholars think that different answers are appropriate in different normative exercises. In other words, the selection of relevant capabilities would be different when the question is how to arrange a society's basic structure, versus when the question is how to spend the donations Oxfam has collected, or when the normative question is how to raise one's child. Anderson (1999) argues that, for purposes of political justice, the only relevant capabilities are those needed for a person to participate as a citizen. Nussbaum endorses a well-defined list of capabilities, which, she argues, should be enshrined in every country's constitution (Nussbaum 2000, 2003, 2006). Sen has been somewhat vague in responding to the question of how to select and weight capabilities, yet in the secondary literature it has been argued that he draws on his ideal of agency to argue that each group should itself select, weight, trade off, and sequence or otherwise aggregate capabilities as well as prioritize them in relation to other normative considerations, such as agency, efficiency, and stability (Crocker 2008; Crocker and Robeyns 2009).

Moving from ideal theory to non-ideal theory and empirical applications makes the selection of relevant capabilities even more complicated, for other concerns such as feasibility, data availability, practical relevance, and even parsimony may play significant roles. Several proposals are on offer, ranging from substantive proposals with elaborate theoretical underpinnings, through several procedural methods, to the atheoretical practice that an investigator should simply conduct a survey in order to collect rich data (or use an existing survey) and let a statistical technique, such as factor analysis, “decide.” At one end of this spectrum is Martha Nussbaum's well-known list, which contains prescribed capabilities that are grouped together under ten “central human capabilities”: life; bodily health; bodily integrity; senses, imagination and thought; emotions; practical reason; affiliation; other species; play; and control over one's environment (Nussbaum 2006: 76–78).

Nussbaum (2000: 70–77; 2006: 78–81) justifies this list by arguing that each of these capabilities is needed in order for a human life to be “not so impoverished that it is not worthy of the dignity of a human being” (2000: 72). She defends these capabilities as being the moral entitlements of every human being on earth. She formulates the list at an abstract level and advocates that the translation to implementation and policies should be done at a local level, taking into account local differences. Nussbaum argues that this list can be derived from a Rawlsian overlapping consensus and stresses that her list remains open-ended and always open for revision (Nussbaum 2000: 77), yet other philosophers have taken issue with her claim that this would result in a form of political liberalism (Barclay 2003) or have argued that this leaves insufficient scope for democratic deliberation and respect for agency in her capability approach (e.g., Crocker 2008; Robeyns 2003; Sen 2004a,b). Yet this strand of critique has itself been criticized for not understanding the proper role of philosophy and the normative and political status of Nussbaum's proposal (Claassen 2011).

Amartya Sen consistently and explicitly refuses to defend “one pre-determined canonical list of capabilities, chosen by theorists without any general social discussion or public reasoning” (Sen 2005: 158). Of course, groups and theorists might construct lists for various purposes, and lists need not be “pre-determined” or “canonical,” however we might understand these terms. And Sen's refusal to endorse Nussbaum's list has not prevented him from using—for various purposes—particular selections of capabilities in his empirical as well as his normative work. However, beyond stating in general terms that some democratic process and public reasoning should be involved, Sen has never explained in detail how such a selection could and should be done.

Several capability scholars, including Anderson, Alkire, Robeyns, and Crocker, have sought in various ways to fill this lacuna. Anderson (1999: 316) argues that people should be entitled “to whatever capabilities are necessary to enable them to avoid or escape entanglement in oppressive social relationships” and “to the capabilities necessary for functioning as an equal citizen in a democratic state.” Alkire (2002: chapter 2) proposes to select capabilities based on John Finnis's practical reasoning approach. By iteratively asking “Why do I do what I do?”, one comes to the most basic reasons for acting: life, knowledge, play, aesthetic experience, sociability (friendship), practical reasonableness, and religion. Robeyns (2003) has proposed some pragmatic criteria, mainly relevant for empirical research, for the selection of capabilities for the context of inequality and well-being assessments. Crocker (2008: chapters 9–10) explores the theory and practice of deliberative democracy to bring more specificity to democratic procedures and participatory institutions in the development of an agency-sensitive capability approach.

What about weighting different capabilities to come to an aggregate evaluation? If we have a list of relevant capabilities, we would still be left with the question of whether the capabilities should be aggregated and, if so, what their relative weights and the formula to aggregate them will or should be. A closely related question is how different capabilities should be traded off against one another when they cannot all be realized fully. Some have argued against trade-offs on the basis that the different capabilities are incommensurable or that each capability is an absolute entitlement that never should be overridden by another entitlement or other normative consideration. For example, Nussbaum argues that the ten capabilities on her list, being incommensurable, cannot be traded off against one another (and, hence, have no relative weights), and also that the state should provide each citizen with a minimum threshold of each capability.

One possible system of weighting or aggregating is to use a democratic or some other social choice procedure (Chakraborty 1996). The basic idea would be to encourage or prescribe that the relevant group of people decide on the weights. In some contexts, such as small-scale projects or evaluations, such capability weighting (and selection) could be done by participatory techniques. It has also been suggested that we may determine the weights of capabilities as a function of how much they contribute to overall life satisfaction or happiness (Schokkaert 2007). Yet this raises the question to what extent functionings are taken to be merely instrumental to another end, such as happiness, or indeed any other ultimate good or ideal.

Much of the existing literature refers to the issue of ‘weighting’, but this is only one particular form of the more general ‘aggregating’, since aggregation may take a different functional form than simply adding up. For example, if you have no food, your other capabilities will be worth very little. Some capabilities may thus be complementary capabilities, implying that their value to a person depends on the presence (or absence) of other capabilities. (Note the similarity with the notion of ‘complementary goods’ in consumer theory in economics, where it is argued that the utility of some goods is dependent on the quantity of some other goods, as in the case of pencils and erasers, or shoe polish and shoes of the same color).

It is striking that very few proposals on selecting and weighting or aggregating have been worked out by philosophers based on foundational work in ethical theory; instead, most of the proposals on selecting or weighting have been formulated by scholars working in applied ethics, normative political philosophy, or engaged with normative work in the social sciences. It is therefore to be hoped that in the (near) future proposals will be worked out regarding the selection of dimensions and aggregation that are much more theoretically grounded.

3.3 What is needed for a capability theory of justice?

The capability approach is often wrongly taken to be an egalitarian theory or a theory of social or distributive justice. This reading is mistaken, even though it is entirely understandable given the specific debates in which the main philosophers defending the capability approach made their interventions. The capability approach specifies what should count for interpersonal evaluations and thus provides an important aspect of a theory of social or distributive justice, yet more is needed.

Nussbaum's work comes closest to offering us a capability theory of justice, but her theory too doesn't amount to a full theory of social justice. Nussbaum's theory of social justice is comprehensive, in the sense that it is not limited to an account of political justice, or to liberal democracies. Rather, her account holds for all human beings on earth, independently of whether they are living in a liberal democratic regime, or of whether they are severely disabled. The main demarcation of Nussbaum's account is that it provides only “a partial and minimal account of social justice” (Nussbaum 2006: 71) by specifying thresholds of a list of capabilities that governments in all nations should guarantee to their citizens. Nussbaum's theory focuses on thresholds, but this does not imply that reaching these thresholds is all that matters for social justice; rather, her theory is partial and simply leaves unaddressed the question what social justice requires once those thresholds are met.

Moreover, it would be a mistake to think that there can be only one capability theory of justice; on the contrary, the open nature of the capability approach allows for the development of a family of capability theories of justice. But this prompts the question: what is needed to develop a full capability theory of justice, and which of these aspects have already been developed by theorists of justice?

First, a theory of justice needs to explain on what basis it justifies its principles or claims of justice. For example, in Rawls's theory of justice the two principles of justice are justified by the thought-experiment of the original position and the more general social contract framework on which this is based. Dworkin's egalitarian justice theory starts from the meta-principle of equal respect and concern, which he then develops in the principles that the distribution of burdens and benefits should be sensitive to the ambitions that people have but should not reflect the unequal natural endowments with which individuals are born. One could also develop a capability theory of justice arguing that the ultimate driving force is a concern with autonomy or with human dignity. If capability scholars want to develop a full theory of justice, they will also need to explain on what bases they will justify their principles or claims. As mentioned earlier, Nussbaum starts from a notion of human dignity, whereas the Senian strand in the capability approach stresses the importance of what people have reason to value, hence an account of public reasoning. However, little work has been done so far to flesh out this embryonic idea of ‘having reason to value’, and it therefore remains unclear whether the capability approach has a solid unified rationale on the basis of which a full account of justice could be developed.

Second, as indicated above, in developing a capability theory of justice we must decide whether we want it to be an outcome or an opportunity theory, that is, whether we think that we should assess injustices in terms of functionings, or rather in terms of capabilities, or a mixture. At the level of theory and principles, most theorists of justice endorse the view that justice is done if all have equal genuine opportunities, or if all reach a minimal threshold of capability levels. Translated to the capability language, this would imply that at the level of theory and principles, capabilities are the relevant metric of justice, and not functionings. However, not everyone subscribes to this view. Anne Phillips (2004) has been a prominent voice arguing for equality of outcome, rather than opportunities. In the capability literature, Marc Fleurbaey (2002) has argued against the view to take only capabilities into account and has defended a focus on ‘refined functionings’ (being the combination of functionings and capabilities).

Third, a capability theory of justice will need, just as all other theories that are derived from the general and underspecified capability approach, to address the issue of selecting, quantifying and aggregating of dimensions. For the case of theories of justice, the problem of selecting, quantifying and aggregating turns into the question: ‘in which dimensions should we evaluate justice, how should we construct metrics in these dimensions, and how should we aggregate all the dimensions for overall assessments of justice?’ The general challenge of selecting and aggregating which was discussed above therefore also applies here.

Fourth, a capability theory of justice may need to address other ‘metrics of justice’. In the literature on social justice there are several terms used to indicate what precisely we are assessing or measuring: the metric of advantage, the currency of justice, or the informational basis for the interpersonal comparisons for the purpose of justice. Within theories of justice, the main arguments are with Rawlsian resourcists (which will be the subject of section 5), and with defenders of Dworkinian resourcism (for comparisons of the capability view with Dworkin's egalitarian theory, see Dworkin 2000: 299–303; Kaufman 2006b: 125–8; Pierik and Robeyns 2007; Sen 1984, 2009: 264–268; Williams 2002)). Other possible metrics are needs, basic needs, or the many different types of subjective welfare or preference satisfaction. A full capability theory of justice would need to show why it serves better as a metric of justice than these other metrics.

Fifth, a capability theory of justice needs to take a position on the ‘distributive rule’ (Anderson 2010: 81) that it will endorse: will it argue for plain equality, or for sufficiency, or for prioritarianism, or for some other (mixed) distributive rule? Both Martha Nussbaum's and Elizabeth Andersons's theories are sufficiency accounts (Anderson 1999, 2010; Nussbaum 2006), but from this it does not follow, as one sometimes reads in the secondary literature, that the capability approach entails a sufficiency rule. Sen may have given the (wrong) impression of defending straight equality as a distributive rule, by asking the question ‘Equality of what?’ (Sen 1980), though a careful reading shows that he was merely asking the question ‘If we want to be defending equality of something, then what would that be?’ In fact, Sen has remained uncommitted to one single distributive rule, which probably can be explained by the fact that he is averse of building a well-defined theory of justice but rather prefers to investigate how real-life unjust situations can be turned into more just situations, even if perfect justice is unattainable (Sen 2009). The capability approach clearly plays a role in Sen's work on justice, since when assessing a situation he will investigate inequalities in people's capabilities and analyze the processes that led to those inequalities. Yet Sen has an eclectic approach to theorizing, and hence other notions and theories (such as human rights or more formal discussions on freedoms from social choice theory) also play a role in his work on justice. The presence and importance of the capability approach in Sen's work is thus undeniable, but should not be seen as the only defining feature.

Sixth, a capability theory of justice needs to specify where the line between individual and collective responsibility is drawn, or how it will be decided, and by whom, where this line will be drawn. There is a remarkable absence of any discussion about issues of responsibility in the capability literature, in sharp contrast to political philosophy and welfare economics where this is one of the most important lines of debate, certainly since the publication of Ronald Dworkin's (1981, 2000) work on justice and equality which led to what Elizabeth Anderson (1999) has called ‘luck-egalitarianism’. Nevertheless, whether one wants to discuss it explicitly or not, any concrete capability policy proposal can be analyzed in terms of the division between personal and collective responsibility; but this terminology is largely absent from the capability literature.

In part this might be explained by the fact that much of the work on capabilities deals with global poverty, where issues of individual responsibility seem to be less relevant since it would seem outrageous to suggest that the world's most destitute people are personally responsible for the situation they are in. That doesn't mean that the responsibility question is not important: it is indeed of utmost importance to ask who is responsible for global poverty reduction or the fulfilling of the Millenium Development Goals, on which political philosophers have written a great deal (e.g., Pogge 2008, Singer 2009). The point is rather that philosophical puzzles, such as the issues of expensive tastes (for expensive wine, caviar, fast cars, or you name it), are simply beyond the radar screen of the child laborer or the poor peasant. However, while this may perhaps justify the absence of any discussion about personal responsibility among capability scholars concerned with poverty, it does not absolve theorists of justice who deal with justice in affluent societies (or affluent sections of poor societies) from discussing the just division between personal and collective responsibility (Pierik and Robeyns 2007: 148–149).

This brings us to a related issue: a theory of justice generally specifies rights, but also duties. However, capability theorists have remained largely silent on the questions who should bear the duties for the expansion of the selected capabilities. Nussbaum passionately advocates that all people all over the world should be entitled, as a matter of justice, to threshold levels of all the capabilities on her list; but apart from mentioning that it is the governments' duties to guarantee these entitlements (2006: 70), she remains silent on the question who precisely should bear the burdens and responsibilities for realizing these capabilities. Yet as Onora O'Neill (1996: chapter 5) has argued, questions of obligations and responsibilities should be central to any account of justice.

This section makes clear that a capability theory of justice is theoretically much more demanding than the basic presupposition of the capability approach that ‘functionings’ and ‘capabilities’ are the best metric for most kinds of interpersonal evaluations. While much has been written on the capability approach in recent years, by an increasing number of scholars, including philosophers, much of the philosophical work needed for turning the open-ended capability approach into a specific theory of justice remains to be done.

4. An alternative for utilitarianism?

The capability approach explicitly aims at providing an alternative to normative views that rely exclusively on mental states in their evaluative exercises. This theme was present in Amartya Sen's launching of the capability approach in his 1979 Tanner Lectures (Sen 1980), and can be seen as an important move in the development of the capability approach (Qizilbash 2008: 54). Sen (1999: 59) characterizes welfarist theories as those consequentialist theories that restrict “the judgments of states of affairs to the utilities in the respective states (paying no direct attention to such things as the fulfillment or violation of rights, duties, and so on)”. He rejects such theories because, whatever their further specifications, they rely exclusively on utility and thus exclude non-utility information from our moral judgments (Sen 1999: 62).

Sen is concerned not only with the information that is included in a normative evaluation, but also with the information that is excluded. The non-utility information that is excluded by utilitarianism includes a person's additional physical needs, due to being physically disabled for example, but also social or moral principles, such as human rights or the specific principle that men and women should be paid the same wage for the same work. For a utilitarian, these features of life and these principles have no intrinsic value. Men and women, for example, should not be paid the same wage as long as women are satisfied with lower wages or total utility is maximized. But Sen believes it mistaken to think that such egalitarian and other moral principles would not be taken directly into account in our moral judgments. However, note that is a matter of philosophical dispute whether a moral defense of basic liberties can consistently and convincingly be derived from a capabilities theory; Henry Richardson (2007) has argued that the idea of capabilities cannot well capture the social, institutional and deontic aspects of basic liberties. If Richardson is right, then the capability approach may, perhaps, have a valid critique on the blind spots of utilitarianism, but not the answer of how to rectify this.

Thus the normative theories that Sen attacks include those that rely exclusively on mental states. This does not mean that Sen thinks that mental states, such as happiness, are unimportant and have no role to play, for they too are functionings that we sometimes have reason to value. Rather, it is the exclusive reliance on mental states that he rejects.

One could question whether the attack of Sen and some other capability scholars on utilitarianism is as successful as it may seem to them. One worry is that capability scholars attack the most simplified version of utilitarianism, or that they exaggerate the difference between (some versions of) utilitarianism and the capability approach. Based on a reading of J.S. Mill's work, Qizilbash (2008: 58) concludes that “the strong contrast which Sen sometimes makes between classical utilitarianism and his capability view is overdone.” The current state of the literature seems to lead to the conclusion that it has not yet been shown that all versions of utilitarianism are vulnerable to the capability critiques.

5. An alternative for Rawlsian justice?

The capability metric has been proposed by capability philosophers as an alternative for, and improvement on, the Rawlsian social primary goods metric, which focuses on general purpose goods, such as income and wealth, opportunities and liberties, and the social basis of self-respect (Rawls 1971). Sen argued that “the primary goods approach seems to take little note of the diversity of human beings. … If people were basically very similar, then an index of primary goods might be quite a good way of judging advantage. But, in fact, people seem to have very different needs varying with health, longevity, climatic conditions, location, work conditions, temperament, and even body size. … So what is being involved is not merely ignoring a few hard cases, but overlooking very widespread and real differences” (Sen 1980: 215–216). A person with a disability, however severe, would not have a claim to additional resources grounded in his impairment under Rawls's two principles of justice. Sen argues that Rawls's difference principle would not justify any redistribution to the disabled on grounds of disability. Rawls's strategy has been to postpone the question of our obligations towards the disabled, and exclude them from the scope of his theory. Rawls certainly does not want to deny our moral duties towards the people that fall outside the scope of his theory, but he thinks that we should first work out a robust and convincing theory of justice for the “normal” cases and only then try to extend it to the “more extreme cases” (Rawls 2001: 176).

Sen's critique in his 1979 Tanner lecture, however, was not only about the case of the severely disabled. Sen's more general critique concerned what he saw as the inflexibility of primary goods as a metric of justice. Capability scholars thus believe that the more general problem with the use of primary goods is that it does not adequately deal with human diversity, since it does not focus on ends but rather on means, and since it excludes some groups from the scope of justice.

Yet while capability scholars initially seemed rather sure of their case against Rawls (Sen 1980, Nussbaum 2006), a more recent wave of philosophical enquiry has highlighted how complicated the comparisons between Rawls's theory of justice and the capability view are (Pogge 2002, Robeyns 2009, Brighouse and Robeyns eds. 2010). One reason is that the capability metric is a general metric of well-being and well-being freedom, whereas the social primary goods metric emerges as one element of an integral and complex theory of political justice (rather than social justice more broadly, let alone the even wider category of moral evaluations). Also, Rawls's theory of justice is an ideal theory of justice, in contrast to the capability approach. This means that it is very hard to compare Rawls's work on justice with the philosophical work on the capability approach, since their scope and theoretical aims are not the same.

Regarding scope, Rawls's theory of justice is limited in scope to (1) the basic structure of society (that is, the set of most important social institutions), (2) to liberal democratic societies rather than also to nondemocratic and illiberal societies, (3) and to the principles of justice insofar as they apply to people in their capacity as citizens. The scope of the capability approach can be summarized as “justice applies everywhere”—that is, it applies to all human beings independently of their country of birth or residence, and not only to social institutions but also to the social ethos and to social practices.

Regarding theoretical aims, one can safely say that most capability scholars tend to disfavor top-down theorizing, and prefer to find out how theory or philosophy can help us make the actual world, a social institution or a practice more just, rather then to work more abstractly on the principles of justice and their justification. This last difference has been a main point of attention in Sen's more recent work (Sen 2009).

Moreover, Rawlsians have criticized the capability approach too, and not all of their critiques have been sufficiently rebutted (Pogge 2002; Freeman 2006; Kelly 2010). Firstly, the capability approach is claimed to be endorsing a particular comprehensive moral view, which Rawlsians find objectionable. Another main Rawlsian objection to the capability approach concerns the publicity criterion, which stipulates that the conception of justice must be public and the necessary information to make a claim of injustice must be verifiable by all, and easily accessible. Rawlsians argue that a theory of justice needs a public standard of interpersonal comparisons, as otherwise the obtained principles of justice among citizens with diverse conceptions of the good life will not prove stable. The suggestion is that as capabilities are very hard to measure or assess in such a public fashion, and as they would require very large amounts and difficult sorts of information, the capability approach is unworkable as a theory of justice. Finally, some Rawlsians, like Richardson (2006) believe that the Rawlsian principles of justice can be adapted if we want to include human beings with non-standard needs such as the disabled, and that this may result in the justification of a mixed social primary goods/capabilities metric of justice. In short, this debate, too, is far from closed (e.g., Pogge 2002, Anderson 2010, Robeyns 2009).


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For very helpful comments, I am grateful to Thomas Pogge and my colleagues at the Erasmus University Rotterdam.