Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Bodily Awareness

First published Tue Aug 9, 2011

We are aware of our bodies. I see the world by opening my eyes and in so doing, I feel the motion of my eyelid. I feel that my legs are crossed and that my arm is raising; I feel tired and thirsty; I feel cold; I feel my teeth begin to chatter; my back itches. The way we relate to our body, including the way we perceive it, control it and affectively react to what happens to it, is unlike the way we relate to other objects.

Despite its richness, bodily awareness has attracted relatively little attention from philosophers with the notable exception of phenomenologists. Neuropsychologists and psychiatrists, however, have confronted the multi-faceted phenomenology of bodily awareness through a wide variety of disorders. In addition, the study of the body has recently boomed in cognitive neuroscience. The study of bodily illusions has raised a wide range of philosophical questions about the underlying mechanisms of bodily self-awareness.

The notion of bodily awareness is at the crossroads of philosophical debates on the self, action and space. This entry will focus on two main questions: (i) How does the awareness of one's body differ from the awareness of other objects? (ii) What are the roles of action and mental representations of the body for bodily awareness?

1. Characterizing bodily awareness

Bodily awareness may seem less rich and detailed than visual awareness, which can be analysed as full of fine-grained colour shades and well-individuated three-dimensional shapes that move around. All we experience is this constant blurry fuzzy “feeling of the same old body always there” (James, 1890, p. 242). Yet, as soon as we pay attention to our body, we become aware of the position and movements of our limbs, of the contact of our clothes on our skin, of the muscle pain in our legs, of our sensation of thirst. It may be difficult to describe what we feel, but what we feel can be so intense that we are sometimes not able to think of anything else than our body.

1.1 The phenomenology of bodily awareness

Although introspectively familiar, it is hard to exactly pinpoint the nature of the specific relation that we have with our body. Let us compare, for instance, the experience of moving our hand and the experience of moving a cursor on the screen. The movements of the cursor match our intentions in the same way as the movements of our hand, though the cursor movements require intermediate hand movements. Yet, even if we were able to move the cursor with only the support of our brain activity (now possible with brain-machine interfaces), it seems that there would still be a difference between the experience of controlling the cursor and the experience of controlling our hand. In particular, we would have a different type of anticipatory knowledge of the movements (O'Shaughnessy, 1980; Wong, 2009). In the non-bodily case, our knowledge results from inferences drawn on the basis of systematic observations. By contrast, in the hand case, there is no such mediation. We immediately know from the inside that our hand will move at will.

What makes our body so special may be that unlike other physical objects, not only do we perceive it through external senses, but we have also an internal access to it through bodily sensations. One way to characterize the relation that we have only with our body (or what we experience as our body) is thus to say that only our body appears to us from the inside. In contrast, many bodies, including our own, can appear to us from the outside. The duality of access to our body is best expressed in what is known as the touchant-touché phenomenon. When we touch our knee with our hand, we have a tactile experience of our knee from the outside (touché), but we have also a tactile experience of our knee from the inside (touchant), and the same is true of the hand.

Despite the constant flow of information about our body from the inside, our bodily awareness is surprisingly weak. While typing on a laptop, we do not vividly experience our fingers on the keyboard. Our conscious field is primarily occupied by the content of what we are typing, and more generally by the external world rather than by the bodily medium that allows us to perceive it and to move through it. We use the body, but we rarely reflect upon it.

This is not to say, however, that we are completely unaware of our body. Our attention can turn to our body for instance in acute sensations of pain, or in motor learning. In addition, one may claim that we are constantly conscious of the presence of our body, though at the margin of the stream of consciousness. As James (1890, 242) says, “Our own bodily position, attitude, condition, is one of the things of which some awareness, however inattentive, invariably accompanies the knowledge of whatever else we know.” Similarly, Gurwitsch (1985, 31) asserts: “There is no moment in our conscious life when we are completely unaware of our bodily posture, of the fact that we are walking, standing, sitting, lying down”.

The question then arises: how detailed is marginal bodily awareness? Are we constantly conscious of the body in all its details or only as a unitary whole without any internal differentiation? At first sight, bodily awareness seems to be reducible to the unarticulated “feeling of the same old body always there” (James, 1890, 242). However, both James and Gurwitsch describe a more specific phenomenology, not only global feelings of bodily presence, but also particular sensations of bodily posture and state. In The Will, O'Shaughnessy (1980) argues that in order to act, we need to be pre-attentively conscious of all the points of the body at any moment. However, he later criticizes his own view for lack of parsimony and plausibility (O'Shaughnessy, 1995). Instead, he suggests that we are permanently aware of our body as an undifferentiated whole, except when acting. Actions then automatically trigger a precise awareness of the bodily effectors, while the other parts of the body recede in awareness.

Yet, some may question whether action requires bodily awareness, and if it does, in what sense (Wong, 2010). Action requires detailed information about the long-term and short-term properties of the bodily effectors. But does the information need to reach the threshold of awareness, even at the margin? Several empirical results cast some doubts on the necessity of bodily awareness for action control. For instance, patients suffering from peripheral deafferentation no longer receive tactile and proprioceptive signals. In other words, they partially lack the awareness of their body from the inside. Yet, they retain their ability to control their movements as long as they can see their limbs moving. More generally, it was found that we have limited awareness of the details of our bodily movements (Fourneret and Jeannerod, 1998). The body is not always immediately present in all its details to the subject, even when acting

The body therefore has this peculiar feature. It is always immediately present to the subject (Merleau-Ponty, 1945; O'Shaughnessy, 1980), but the most permanent and preponderant object in life may also be the most elusive one (Leder, 1990).

1.2 Sources of bodily awareness

One strategy to analyse the phenomenology of bodily awareness is to track its origin. As said earlier, we perceive our body not only from the outside, but also from the inside. Although widely accepted, the distinction between the two experiential modes of presentation of the body is rarely spelled out and often reduced to the dichotomy between external senses and body senses, which include touch, proprioception, the vestibular, the nociceptive and the interoceptive systems.

Touch is mediated by cutaneous mechanoreceptors. It carries information both about the external world (shape of the touched object) and about the body (pressure on the specific part of the skin) (Katz, 1925). Furthermore, touch is said to process many types of properties including texture, temperature, solidity, humidity, contact, weight, pressure, force, vibration, and so on.

Proprioception provides information about the position and movement of the body. The mechanisms of proprioception include muscle spindles, which are sensitive to muscle stretch, Golgi tendon organs, which are sensitive to tendon tension, and joint receptors, which are sensitive to joint position.

The vestibular system in the inner ear provides information about the balance of the body. It includes three roughly orthogonal semicircular canals, which are sensitive to motion acceleration as our head moves in space, and two otolith organs, which are sensitive to the pull of gravity.

Nociceptors respond to dangerously intense mechanical stimuli, to mechanothermal stimuli or to thermal and chemical stimuli. According to the dominant theory, noxious signals are inhibited, enhanced or distorted by various factors via a gating mechanism at the level of the spinal cord that controls the amount of signals from the periphery to brain structures and via a central gating mechanism (Melzack and Wall, 1983).

Interoception provides information about the physiological condition of the body in order to maintain optimal homeostasis, namely, cardiovascular, respiratory, energy (feeding and glucose), and fluid (electrolyte and water) balances. The parasympathetic system is sensitive to mechanical, thermal, chemical, metabolic, and hormonal status of skin, muscle, joints, teeth and viscera.

At the cortical level, tactile, proprioceptive and nociceptive signals are processed in the primary and secondary somatosensory cortex. Interestingly, the primary somatosensory area (SI) generally follows the natural anatomical divisions of body parts, having receptive fields confined to single fingers or limbs (Penfield and Rasmussen, 1950; Blankenburg et al., 2003). Penfield and Boldrey (1937) described the somatotopical organization of SI that associates cortical areas to specific parts of the body surface resulting in the metaphor of a “Homunculus”. The Homunculus, however, is a distorted representation of the body. In particular, some body parts are over-represented, whereas others are under-represented. For instance, a relatively large cortical area responds to hand-related signals and a relatively small cortical area responds to torso-related signals. Furthermore, SI does not represent the anatomical contiguity of body parts. For instance, the hand-specific area is next to the face-specific area. In addition to the somatosensory cortex, the body is represented at the level of several brain areas, including the insula (for nociceptive and interoceptive signals), the extrastriate and the fusiform body areas (for visual information about the body) and the right parietal cortex (for multimodal representations of the body) (Blanke et al., 2010; Craig, 2003; Berlucchi and Aglioti, 1997, 2010; Mancini et al., forthcoming).

Through body senses, one gains information about the body, which can lead to bodily experiences of various types. David Armstrong (1962) proposes distinguishing bodily sensations, like pain and touch, which are experienced as being located in a particular part of the body and bodily feelings, like hunger, thirst and tiredness, which are not. Within the category of bodily sensations, he then distinguishes transitive bodily sensations, in which there is an object independent of the sensations (for example, tactile sensations), and intransitive bodily sensations, in which there does not seem to be such an independent object (for example, tickles). Most of the debate in philosophy has focused on intransitive bodily sensations like pain (see the entry on Pain). By contrast, bodily feelings are rarely mentioned in the philosophical literature, though recent work in neuroscience on the interoceptive system posits them at the core of bodily awareness (Craig, 2003) and even of the self (Damasio, 1999).

1.3 Disorders of bodily awareness

Another way to analyse the phenomenology of bodily awareness is to investigate the variety of bodily disorders. As reported by one amputated soldier with a phantom leg, “I am more sure of the leg which ain't than of the one that are” (in Mitchell, 1871, 566). As soon as one component of bodily awareness is disrupted, the body is brought to the foreground of consciousness and one realizes the complexity and the richness of the experience of the supposedly ‘same old body’. Bodily disorders are not rare, and can be encountered in both neurological (after brain lesion, peripheral lesion, migraine and epileptic seizure) and psychiatric conditions. By analysing a few of those disorders, one may shed some light on what it is like to feel embodied.

These are only a few examples of the many ways bodily awareness can be distorted (see Vignemont, 2010 for a comprehensive list of bodily disorders). Each of them highlights some aspects of ordinary phenomenology of bodily awareness, which normally remain dim and elusive. To experience one's body is to experience one's body as a whole in a specific location in the external space, which constitutes the centre of one's visuo-spatial perspective on the world (cf. out-of-body experience). To experience one's body is to experience from the inside the presence of parts of one's body (cf. supernumerary limbs). To experience one's body is to experience the body parts as one's own, as part of oneself (cf. somatoparaphrenia). To experience one's body is to experience the shape and size of the body parts (cf. Alice in Wonderland syndrome). To experience one's body is to experience the posture and the location of the body parts (cf. deafferentation). To experience one's body is to feel sensations, which are sometimes endowed with an affective value, pleasant or unpleasant (cf. thalamic syndrome). To experience one's body is to experience the limbs immediately available to carry any movement one may intend to perform (cf. anosognosia for hemiplegia).

2. Theories of bodily awareness

In the small philosophical literature on bodily awareness, one can distinguish two main approaches. These can be called the representationalist approach and the sensorimotor approach. They both give a privileged significance to bodily awareness and they share the same interest in pathological disorders, action and the spatiality of bodily experiences. The claims they respectively defend, however, are radically different in both their methodology and their content. Where the representationalist approach is mainly anchored in analytic philosophy, the sensorimotor approach is mainly anchored in the phenomenological tradition. Whereas the former posits mental representation(s) of the body at the core of bodily awareness, the latter highlights the importance of interacting with the world.

2.1 The representationalist approach

Until the end of the 19th century, bodily awareness was typically understood in terms of a bundle of internal bodily sensations. Bonnier (1905) first introduced the term schema to refer to the spatial organization of these bodily sensations. But it was only in Head and Holmes (1911)'s fundamental paper (discussed in the next section) that one finds the first systematic analysis of the way(s) the brain represents the body. They initiated what might be called the representationalist approach to bodily awareness (e.g., O'Shaughnessy, 1980; Schilder, 1935; Longo and Haggard, 2010; Berlucchi and Aglioti, 2010; Paillard, 1999; Vignemont, 2010; Carruthers, 2008; Sirigu et al., 1991; Schwoebel and Coslett, 2005).

Proponents of the representationalist approach claim that in order to account for bodily awareness one needs to appeal to mental representations of the body. On a minimal definition of the notion of representation, a body representation is an internal structure that has the function to track the state of the body and encode it, that can misrepresent the body and that can be decoupled from the body.

Interestingly, a large number of the representationalist advocates argue that there is more than one type of body representations, leading to several taxonomies of body representations (Head and Holmes, 1911; O'Shaughnessy, 1980; Paillard, 1980; Gallagher, 1986; Vignemont, 2010; Carruthers, 2008; Sirigu et al., 1991; Schwoebel and Coslett, 2005). Before describing them, let us consider several motivations to posit the existence of body representation(s).

2.1.1 Why body representations?

Three main reasons have been offered to explain why bodily awareness might require body representation(s). The first reason finds its origin in disturbances of bodily awareness. Most of the literature on body representation can be found in patient studies (Schilder, 1935; Lhermitte, 1942; Cole and Paillard, 1995, Schoebel and Coslett, 2005; Sirigu et al. 1991). With the help of the notion of body representation, and thus of body misrepresentation, one can easily explain how the way the body is experienced can be at odds with the physical reality of the body. Phantom limbs may be one of the clearest expressions of the existence of body representations (Schilder, 1935; Hilti and Brugger, 2010). Patients feel the presence of their amputated limb because the physically missing limb is still represented. On the other hand, the body can be physically intact while its representation is impaired. For instance, patients with autotopagnosia are not able to correctly identify the parts of their body. According to Schwoebel and Coslett (2005), autotopagnosia results from a deficit of the representation that normally encodes spatial and functional relations among body parts (i.e. body structural description). Most bodily disorders are thus interpreted in terms of disruption of representations of the body.

The second reason focuses on the spatial organization of bodily awareness (Bonnier, 1905; O'Shaughnessy, 1980, 1995). Over an extended period, all bodily experiences share the same spatial content of the structural shape of the body. To account for this commonality, O'Shaughnessy posits the existence of a long-term body image (similar to the notion of body structural description) that plays a structural role in spatially shaping bodily experiences. Consequently, if the long-term body image is distorted, if it represents, for instance, an octopus-shaped body, if it represents a part that no longer exists like an amputated limb or if it represents an artificial extension like a cane, then one can have bodily experiences in one's tentacle, phantom limb or at the tip of the cane.

The last reason to postulate body representation is to account for our ability to move our body (Paillard, 1980; Sirigu et al., 1991; Schwoebel and Coslett, 2005; O'Shaughnessy, 1995; Vignemont, 2010). As noted by Schilder (1935, 53), “The beginning of every movement is dependent on the model of the body”. In order to act, one needs to know where one's limbs are and how far they can reach. However, on the model of the Perception-Action model of vision (Milner and Goodale, 1995, 2008), it has been suggested that what is needed for action is different in many respects from what is needed for bodily experiences. If so, action may recruit a specific type of body representation, which is encoded in a sensorimotor format (Paillard, 1999; Djikerman and de Haan, 2007; Sirigu et al., 1991; Schwoebel and Coslett, 2005; Vignemont, 2010).

2.1.2 How many body representations?

There is therefore more than one reason to posit the existence of body representations. However, these reasons may also be a source of difficulty for the representationalist approach, as they lead to posit a multiplicity of body representations. Clearly, one single body representation cannot suffice to account for the variety of bodily disorders and for the variety of aspects of bodily awareness. There needs to be more, but how many? Two? Three? Four?

The first taxonomy was offered by Head and Holmes (1911). They distinguished between three types of body representations. The postural schema encodes the relative position of body parts after each movement. The superficial schema is the model of the skin surface of the body used for localizing bodily sensations. The two body schemata are “before they enter consciousness” (p. 187). In contrast, the body image is when “recognizable change enters into consciousness” (p. 187). Head and Holmes's taxonomy reflects differences among body representations at various levels. At the temporal level, the postural schema is a short-term representation whereas the superficial schema is a long-term representation. At the level of accessibility, body schemata are unconscious whereas the body image is conscious. At the functional level, the postural schema is for action whereas the superficial schema is for the localization of bodily sensations.

Head and Holmes's complex taxonomy was soon forgotten. For a long time, the terms of body schema and body image were indifferently used (see for instance Schilder, 1935). As for the fine-grained distinction between postural and superficial schema, it has completely disappeared. Nonetheless, since the eighties there has been a renewal of interest for distinguishing various types of body representation (O'Shaughnessy, 1980; Paillard, 1980; Gallagher, 1986). However, there is little agreement, neither on the way to individuate the distinct types of body representations, nor on their precise number (for review, see Vignemont, 2010). One can distinguish at least three main taxonomies of body representation.

The temporal dyadic taxonomy (O'Shaughnessy, 1980; Carruthers, 2008) is based on the dynamics of body representations. In a nutshell, one can contrast the representation of long-term bodily properties such as limb size and the representation of short-term bodily properties such as limb posture. Long-term body representations are relatively stable in adulthood. They may include some innate components that carry information about the structure of the human body (for example, two-arm/two-leg). On the other hand, short-term body representations are constantly updated on the basis of afferent and efferent information.

The functional dyadic taxonomy (Paillard, 1999; Dijkerman and de Haan, 2007; Vignemont, 2010) is based on the functional role played by each body representations. The underlying assumption is that the way one uses information about the body determines the way the information is encoded. It draws a distinction between the body image and the body schema on the Perception-Action model of vision (Milner and Goodale, 1995). The body schema is used for action planning and action control. It consists in sensorimotor representations of bodily properties that are relevant for action. The body image groups all the other representations about the body that are not used for action, whether they are perceptual, conceptual or emotional (Gallagher, 1995).

The triadic taxonomy (Schwoebel & Coslett 2005; Sirigu et al. 1991) introduces another way to take apart the various types of body representations, which is based on their format. This new criterion leads to a three-fold distinction: sensorimotor body representation (also called body schema), visuospatial body representation (also called body structural description) and conceptual body representation (also called body semantics).

To recap, there has been a diversity of criteria used to individuate the distinct types of body representation, including availability to consciousness (unconscious versus conscious), dynamics (short-term versus long-term), functional role (for action versus for perception) and format (sensorimotor, visuospatial and conceptual). The taxonomies may thus be conceived as more orthogonal than contradictory. The problem, however, is that they result in opposite interpretations of the very same bodily disorders. For instance, personal neglect (i.e. lack of exploration of half of the body) has been interpreted as resulting from a deficit of body schema (Coslett, 1998), from a deficit of body image (Gallagher, 1995) or from an attentional deficit (Kinsbourne, 1995). Furthermore, although most taxonomies rely on neuropsychological dissociations, it does not seem likely that they can account for all bodily disorders. Even three types of body representation might not suffice to explain all the possible dissociations. On the other hand, one may wish to avoid a quasi-infinite list of body representations.

Some may then conclude that the project of individuating distinct types of body representations is a “slippery issue” (Holmes & Spence, 2005, p. 16) that should be avoided:

We allow ourselves to speak of the body image and other such scheme or ghosts, which, I think, we would well be rid of. (Spicker, 1975, p. 182)

But should we then give up the notion of body representation itself or merely the enterprise of classifying distinct body representations? We shall see now an alternative approach, the sensorimotor approach to bodily awareness, which favors the most radical solution.

2.2 The sensorimotor approach

Although strongly influenced by Husserl (1913) and by Gurwitsch (1985), the most comprehensive treatment of the phenomenology of bodily awareness within the sensorimotor approach can be found in Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology of Perception (1945) (see Carman, 1999 for a systematic comparison between Husserl's and Merleau-Ponty's views of bodily awareness). The sensorimotor view can be articulated into three related claims: (i) the body is not an object that can be represented; (ii) the presence of the body is the presence of the body in the world, and (iii) the body we experience is the body in action. By positing action at the core of bodily awareness, Merleau-Ponty initiated a long tradition of phenomenological investigation of bodily awareness (Henri, 1965; de Preester, 2007; Gallagher, 2005; Legrand, 2006; Mishara, 2004; Thompson, 2005; Zahavi and Parnas, 1998), as well as the recent sensorimotor theories of consciousness (O'Regan and Noë, 2001; Noë, 2004; Hurley, 1998; Thompson, 2005).

2.2.1 The lived body

“The body is not one more among external objects” (MP, 1945, 92). Merleau-Ponty draws the distinction between the objective body made of muscles, bones and nerves and the lived body, that is, the body that we experience in pre-reflective awareness. He argues that the lived body is not an object that can be perceived from various perspectives, left aside or localized in objective space. More fundamentally, the lived body cannot be an object at all because it is what makes our awareness of objects possible. This explains to some extent the rejection of the notion of body representations. According to Merleau-Ponty, representing the body necessarily involves adopting an objective stance on the lived body. The objectified body could then no longer anchors the way we perceive the world. Further criticisms against the notion of representation can be found in some of more recent embodied theories. There is a constant worry throughout the embodied approach to avoid putting too much in the head. Its more radical form completely rejects the traditional notion of internal representation as inadequate and unnecessary to account for our mental life (Thelen and Smith, 1994; Turvey and Carello, 1995; van Gelder, 1995; Gallagher, 2008). On their view, representations are inadequate because they are too costly and they are unnecessary because they can be easily replaced by sensorimotor loops.

Rather than to “degenerate into a ‘representation’ of the body” (p. 94, my underline), Merleau-Ponty appeals to the notion of action to account for the lived body. The lived body is understood in terms of its practical engagement with the world. The bodily space is a space of actions endowed with existential meanings, of ways of existing towards objects. The body schema therefore consists in a sensorimotor function rather than a sensorimotor representation (Gallagher, 2005). The unity of the lived body derives from comprehensive bodily purposes. The action needs not be performed, but can remain virtual movements, what Siewert (2005) calls bodily know-how (i.e. practical knowledge of how to act with or towards a part of one's body). In Merleau-Ponty's words, the lived body consists in an “I can” (p. 137). He illustrates his view with a series of dissociations between the lived body and the objective body. For instance, the patient Schneider was unable to localize where a mosquito was stinging him, and yet, was able to scratch his leg where he was stung. As for phantom limbs, Merleau-Ponty interprets them as resulting from the preserved readiness to move the amputated limbs.

Merleau-Ponty argues in favour of the constitutive role of action for consciousness in general. As such, he can be considered as one of the ancestors of the recent embodied approach, which elevates the importance of bodily interactions with the world in explaining cognitive activities. In particular, the recent enactive approach defends the hypothesis that conscious experiences are inseparable from bodily activities or from sensorimotor expectations (Siewert, 2005; O'Regan and Noë, 2001; Noë, 2004; Hurley, 1998; Thompson, 2005). On this view, what we feel is determined by what we do and what we know how to do.

2.2.2 Dissociation between bodily awareness and action

That the body is not experienced like an object among others is one thing. But that the lived body is not and cannot be an object at all is another. It seems indeed that the lived body can be an intentional object without being transformed into an object among others. Furthermore, if the lived body cannot be an object at all, then this arguably forbids any scientific investigation of the lived body (Bermudez, 2005).

This consequence may seem surprising in the light of the extensive use that Merleau-Ponty makes of neuropsychological data, including his constant appeal to the patient Schneider. This appeal is problematic for two reasons. First, the neurologist Georg Goldenberg (2003) convincingly argues that Schneider may have faked part of his symptoms. Second, if Merleau-Ponty accepts Schneider's dissociation, then he is committed to accept other dissociations that have been found both in patients and in healthy subjects. Those recent findings, however, raise difficulties both for his view and for the enactive approach of bodily experiences in general (Vignemont, 2011b).

If bodily awareness consisted in bodily know-how (i.e., how to reach the bodily location that was touched or how to move it), then one could not have one without the other. However, it has been recently found that the possession of accurate bodily know-how does not guarantee that one consciously feels touch or feels where the touch occurs (Paillard et al., 1983; Anema et al., 2009). For instance, patients with numbsense have no tactile awareness, but retain a surprising ability to point to where they were touched: “But, I don't understand that. You put something there; I do not feel anything and yet I got there with my finger. How does that happen?” (In Paillard et al., 1983, p. 550).

Indication that bodily know-how can be at odds with bodily experiences can also be found in studying bodily illusions like the Rubber Hand Illusion (Kammers et al., 2009). Botvinick and Cohen (1998) found that if one looks at a rubber hand, while one's own hand is hidden, and both the rubber and the real hands are synchronously stroked, one mislocates one's hand toward the rubber hand. Proponents of the sensorimotor approach might have tried to explain this illusion in terms of erroneous bodily know-how. For instance, they might argue that one feels one's hand closer to the rubber hand because one is misleadingly induced to expect that if one reaches the location close to the rubber hand, one will touch one's own hand. However, a recent experiment has shown that participants accurately grasped the stimulated hand with their opposite hand at its real location, and not at the illusory location that they reported. Similarly, when they moved their stimulated hand to grasp their opposite hand, they had the right know-how of where their stimulated hand was. The complete absence of illusion was also confirmed in a bimanual task, where participants had to grasp a stick in front of them. Furthermore, when asked a second time to make a perceptual judgment about the location of their stimulated hand after having moved, participants still experienced their hand as being closer to the rubber hand than it was.

Proponents of the sensorimotor approach may deny that bodily know-how, as displayed in these tasks, includes the type of actions that are constitutive of bodily experiences (Noë, 2010). This answer assumes that there are two types of bodily know-how, only one of which being constitutively linked to bodily experiences. Proponents of the sensorimotor approach then need to clarify and defend their distinction at the conceptual level (how does one draw the line between the ‘right’ bodily know-how and the ‘wrong’ bodily know-how?) and at the empirical level (is there evidence of dissociation between two types of bodily know-how?).

To conclude, the relation between bodily awareness and action is complex. This is not to say that action plays no role in bodily awareness. As noted by Schilder (1935, p. 112), “we do not know much about the body unless we move it”. And indeed action intervenes in many stages to inform us about our body. During the first few years of our life, we learn about our body through action and self-exploration. We later update our representation of our body while moving. For instance, after tool use we include the spatial and functional parameters of the tool in the representation of our body (Cardinali et al., 2009). One may then conceive of a compromise between the representationalist approach and the sensorimotor approach. On this view, action plays a major role, but this is not incompatible with the existence of body representations, including what may be called action-oriented representations (Clark, 1997).

3. Bodily awareness and perception

Is bodily awareness a kind of perceptual awareness? In other words, am I aware of my body in the same way as I am aware of the sea in front of me? One difference is that I see and hear the sea, but I am aware of my body from the inside thanks to various informational channels (tactile, proprioceptive, vestibular, interoceptive). Yet, if those informational channels behave like sensory systems that lead to perceptual experiences, then there seems to be little difference between my awareness of the sea and my awareness of my body. Another way for bodily awareness to be perceptual would be if it resulted not only from information conveyed by body senses, but also from information conveyed by more classic sensory modalities, including vision and audition. The literature on bodily awareness often takes for granted the fact that our bodily experiences are exclusively based on body senses. However, this view neglects the essential role that vision plays in our bodily experiences, which has been recently revealed by the experimental literature on multisensory interactions.

3.1 Do bodily experiences qualify as perceptual experiences?

Many debates on bodily experiences concern their perceptual nature. The perceptual debate has been the most vivid in the case of pain (see Aydede, 2006), but it can be raised for other bodily experiences as well (Gallagher, 2003). There are at least five worries that may disqualify bodily experiences from being perceptual. First, not all body senses are under voluntary control. I cannot decide to proprioceive my body or to check my glycaemia. Second, they rarely give rise to distinct conscious experiences. For instance, both the interoceptive and the vestibular system are continuously active even at rest, but we are not continuously aware of the state of our viscera and of gravity. Third, it has been argued that bodily sensations do not contribute to bodily knowledge (Anscombe, 1962). Fourth, for some bodily experiences, there does not seem to be any appearance/reality distinction. This is particularly salient for pain but also for interoceptive feelings like hunger, which seem subjective and incorrigible. Fifth, body senses may appear as giving access only to a single object, namely our body.

However, some of the worries outlined above may just evaporate if one gives up theories of perception that treat vision as the paradigm of sense perception (Shoemaker, 1994, for instance). Actually, it is even controversial that every external sense, including olfaction for example, meets all the constraints posited by visuo-centric models. Other worries may be unjustified. It is false to assume that body senses convey facts only about one's body (for debate, see Gallagher, 2003 and Bermudez, 1998). For instance, the vestibular system encodes the motion of the head relative to the outside world. Even proprioception is not exclusively restricted to one's body. In combination with touch and haptic exploration, proprioception also carries information about location, posture and shape of other bodies. Imagine that I am holding your hand with my eyes closed. Thanks to proprioception, I have access to the location of your hand. The nociceptive and the interoceptive systems might be the only informational channels restricted to one's body. However, even this claim might be challenged by recent results on empathy for pain and disgust, which was found to recruit the very same systems that are activated when one feels pain and disgust (Singer et al., 2004; Wicker et al., 2003) (see section 7.3).

At this stage, it may be useful to appeal to Armstrong's classification to articulate the perceptual debate of bodily experiences. Transitive bodily sensations are the easiest to account for in perceptual terms. It is generally accepted that we have a perceptual sense of touch, bodily posture, movement, and of balance (Armstrong, 1962; Bermudez, 1998; Martin, 1995). Intransitive bodily sensations, like pain, are more of a problem (Aydede, 2009), though Armstrong himself defends a perceptual view of all bodily sensations. Finally, bodily feelings seem to be the most resistant to a perceptual account.

3.2 The importance of vision for bodily experiences

Classically, one draws a contrast between bodily awareness and visual awareness of the body. Vision does indeed give access to our own body as well as to many other bodies and we can fail to visually recognize the body that we see as our own. Most literature on visual awareness of the body is restricted to the analysis of face recognition in mirror, and its possible failures. Just to give one of the most striking examples, it was found that some patients suffering from Alzheimer's disease or right-hemisphere lesions systematically fail to recognize their own image in the mirror, though they can recognize other people's image (mirror sign or mirrored-self misidentification, cf. Breen et al., 2000).

However, the discovery of the Rubber Hand Illusion, along with other recent empirical findings on multisensory interaction, raises new fascinating questions about the consequences of seeing one's body for bodily experiences. In particular, it has encouraged psychologists and neuroscientists to study proprioception and touch no longer in isolation but in their interaction with vision. The Rubber Hand Illusion indeed results from the incorrect integration of somatosensory information and visual information about the rubber hand. It can be explained by three major facts about the sensory systems. First, optimal estimates of bodily properties require combination of information from various sensory channels. Second, vision can dominate over proprioception and touch because it often offers more accurate and precise spatial information (Welch and Warren, 1980). Third, visual information can affect the phenomenal content of bodily experiences. What we feel is determined not only by information from body senses, but also by information from external senses.

The various ways bodily experiences are affected by visual information are too many to be listed here. Let me just mention a few effects, including visual enhancement of touch, mirror-touch synaesthesia and cross-modal congruency effect. It was shown that viewing the body part that is touched (without viewing the touching object) enhances tactile acuity and accuracy (Tipper et al., 1998; Kennett et al., 2001). The mere presence of visual information can suffice to induce bodily experiences (Durgin et al., 2007). For instance, individuals with mirror-touch synaesthesia experience tactile sensations on their body when they see another individual being touched (Blakemore et al., 2005). However, if visual information is incongruent one way or the other with tactile experiences, or if they are in competition for attentional resources, then it can be detrimental to tactile acuity and accuracy (Di Pellegrino et al., 1997; Spence et al., 2004).

What are the implications of these multisensory effects for bodily awareness? Philosophers have become only recently interested in multimodality (O'Callaghan, forthcoming). There is still little agreement on the way to define it. In particular, one must be careful to distinguish between perceptual, attentional and cognitive multimodality, though they can come together. Distinctions need also to be made between conversion effects (i.e. recoding into the format of another modality) and convergence effects (i.e. recoding in a common amodal format) and between short-term and long-term effects. With the help of this preliminary conceptual grid, one can determine to what extent and in what manners bodily experiences are constitutively multimodal. This requires not only analysing the experimental literature on visuo-somatosensory effects, but also comparing bodily experiences in sighted and blind individuals (for experimental results in blind people, see Kinsbourne and Lempert, 1980; Röder et al., 2004; Yoshimura et al., 2010; Goldreich and Kanics, 2003). One may then conclude that bodily awareness would not be the same if one were blind.

4. The spatiality of bodily awareness

In Armstrong's classification, bodily feelings such as thirst are not ascribed to a specific part of the body, though they can be associated to localized sensations (e.g., sensation of dryness in the throat). By contrast, bodily sensations are spatially ascribed at more or less determinate body locations, which can be reported and acted upon. For instance, when you feel your legs crossed, you are aware of (i) a specific bodily property (e.g., posture) and (ii) the part of the body where the property is instantiated (e.g., legs). More formally, one might distinguish the descriptive component and the spatial component of bodily sensations (Bermudez, 1998; Dokic, 2003). The spatial component, however, displays puzzling features, which do not seem to be captured by typical treatments of spatiality. What grounds the spatiality of bodily awareness? And in which spatial frames of reference is the body experienced?

4.1 The peculiarity of the spatiality of bodily sensations

As Merleau-Ponty (1945, 98) warns, “ordinary spatial relations do not cross” the experience of the space of the body. It seems indeed that the way we experience bodily space does not follow some basic spatial rules. For instance, the pain that I feel in my leg is not felt in the refrigerator when my leg is in the refrigerator (Coburn, 1966). Nor is the pain that I feel in my thumb felt in my mouth when my thumb is in my mouth (Block, 1983). Nor does it seem to make sense to claim that the pain in my thumb is far from the pain in my foot. The use of classic spatial notions such as Cartesian frames of reference and sensory field seems problematic. How can one envisage accounting for bodily space in terms of Cartesian reference frame when one cannot provide a center of this frame, nor suggest axes on which one could compute distances and directions (Bermudez, 1998, 2005)? The problem affects not only intransitive sensations like pain, but also transitive sensations like tactile sensations, which have their own peculiarities. For instance, according to Martin (1992), touch has no unified tactile field equivalent to the visual field.

One may conclude that the claim that one feels pain in the finger does not indicate the location of the sensation, but rather the state of the finger (Noordhof, 2001). It becomes then questionable whether bodily sensations themselves are intrinsically spatial. There is indeed a long tradition initiated in the 19th century by psychologists such as Wundt, Titchener and James, which denies “that there can be in a sensation any element of actual locality, any tone as it were which cries to us immediately and without further ado, ‘I am here’, or ‘I am there’” (James, 1890, p. 798). But if spatial ascription does not derive from the spatial content of bodily sensations themselves, then what is at its origin? According to the Local sign theory, each sensible nerve gives rise to its own characteristic sensation that is specific to the body part that is stimulated. Alternatively, according to behaviorist theories, the ‘place’ of the sensation is the part of the body towards which one has the disposition to act like scratching (see for instance Anscombe, 1962)

However, both views suffers from several serious flaws, including the absence of qualitative differences between sensations in distinct body parts (Holly, 1986; O'Shaughnessy, 1980; Margolis, 1966; Coburn, 1966) and the failure to account for sensations in phantom limbs (Baier, 1964). It is thus hard to explain spatial ascription of bodily sensations if bodily sensations are not intrinsically spatial.

Proponents of representational theories have argued that these theories account for some of the peculiarities of the spatiality of bodily sensations (Tye, 1995, 2002). Bodily sensations have a spatial intentional content that represents the sensations (or the cause of the sensations) as being located in a part of the body. In intentional contexts, co-referential terms cannot safely be substituted. This explains for instance why the pain in my thumb is not felt in my mouth though my thumb is in my mouth.

4.2 Dual spatial content

Look up at the ceiling while your right arm is moved to the right (…) Then you cannot in doing so help mentioning that they were in your arm, which was over to the right, poised like such and such, near to such and such a part of the body (O'Shaughnessy, 1980, I, p. 157)

As hard as we might introspect, we cannot experience raw sensations devoid of any spatiality. Furthermore, the spatiality of bodily sensations is dual. In O'Shaughnessy's terms, we experience sensations “at-a-part-of-body-at-a-point-in-body-relative-space”. For instance, when we feel touch on our hand, not only do we experience the pressure in a specific location within our long-term body image (e.g., our right hand), we also experience this part of our body in a specific location in the external world (e.g., on the left). There are thus two types of location, what Bermudez (2005) calls A-location (i.e. bodily frame of reference independent of the posture of the body) and B-location (i.e. external frame relative to the posture of the body). There are, however, a number of open questions concerning A and B-locations. One may ask about the way they are respectively represented. One may also ask whether there is any priority of one over the other.

When we feel touch, we feel touch on the hand. This seems to require mastering a kind of folk anatomy that segments the body into categorical parts such as hand, foot, leg, and so forth. But is folk anatomy really necessary for spatial ascription of bodily sensations (see debate between Vesey (1964) and Margolis (1966))? Furthermore, how do we individuate body parts (Vignemont et al., 2005)? Does folk anatomy come from the visual features of the body, such as shape, size, and spatial orientation, or “geons” delimited by visual discontinuities (Andersen, 1978; Biederman, 1987; Brown, 1976)? Or are body parts individuated by functional salience like joints (Cholewiak and Collins, 2003; Morrison & Tversky, 2005; Bermudez, 1998; Vignemont et al., 2008)? Interestingly, recent cross-cultural studies have shown that linguistic categorization of body parts can vary substantially. For instance, a single term can refer to the whole upper limb with no distinction between hand and arm (Majid et al., 2006). We still know very little of the origins of what seems like one of the most basic experiences, namely, that we feel touch on the hand.

If bodily sensations were ascribed only to an A-location, then our bodily posture would make no difference for our bodily experiences. No matter whether our hands are crossed or not, we are touched on the right hand. However, experimental studies have found that posture does make a difference. When our hands are crossed and one hand is touched after the other, we have difficulties in judging which hand was touched first, (Yamamoto and Kitazawa, 2001). The B-location is in conflict with the A-location (e.g., the touch on your left hand is represented on the right).

It has often been assumed that bodily sensations are localized within an egocentric frame. It is not clear, however, how one should interpret the notion of egocentric frame. Should it be defined functionally as the space of actions (Evans, 1985; Smith, 2009; Brewer, 1995)? But one might then argue that the space of action and the space of bodily sensations should be kept apart (distinction between knowing where and knowing how to get there, cf. Paillard, 1991). Alternatively, one may define the egocentric frame purely spatially, as the space that takes the body or part of the body as origin of its axes (Marcel, 2003).

A further question concerns the relation between the egocentric frame exploited by bodily sensations and the egocentric frame exploited by visual experiences of external objects. Are they one and the same? And if so, in what sense is the spatiality of our bodily sensations different from the spatiality of the experiences of other objects? Marcel (2003) argues that we can interact with external objects because we represent our body and the world within the same frame. However, it seems highly unlikely that we localize our sensations in the external space in the same way that we localize objects. In particular, it does not seem that we are aware of the touch on our hand because we are aware that it is at such location in the external space where our hand happens to be (Holly, 1986; O'Shaughnessy, 1980; Brewer, 1995). Rather, on Bermudez's view, B-location is derivative from A-location.

4.3 Peripersonal space

A last peculiarity of the spatiality of bodily awareness should be noted. There is a grey zone, which is represented as neither purely bodily nor purely external, namely, the peripersonal space. Peripersonal space is the space that immediately surrounds the body. An object is perceived in peripersonal space if it is near (≤30–50 cm), approaches, or touches a specific part.

For psychologists and neuroscientists, there is no simple dichotomy between representations of bodily space and of external space (Holmes and Spence, 2004). Notwithstanding distinctions between various representations of bodily space (e.g., body schema versus body image), they also distinguish representations of peripersonal space and of extrapersonal space.

The notion of a special area of space around the body has been first proposed based on the observation of animals by Hediger (1955), the director of the Zurich Zoo. When a threatening object enters a spatial margin of safety around the animal's body (the ‘flight zone’), animals engage in a range of protective behaviors (Dosey & Meisels, 1969; Cooke and Graziano, 2003). Similarly, humans are sensitive to the violation of their peripersonal space, whether it is by a snake or by a mere chair that should be avoided to navigate in the room. Interestingly, it was recently found that neutral visual stimuli close to a part of the body interfere with tactile experiences, if the location of the visual stimuli is incongruent with the location of the tactile stimuli (Spence et al., 2004). There is thus a multisensory attentional mechanism, which relates stimuli in the external space and stimuli on the body (Ladavas and Farne, 2004; Makin et al., 2008). One may suggest that the representation of peripersonal space underlies our awareness of our body “within a larger space which can contain other objects.” (Martin, 1993, 212).

5. The sense of body ownership

Not only am I aware that I am touched on the hand, but I am aware that I am touched on my hand, and on nobody else's hand. Here, it is important to distinguish the fact of body ownership (i.e. the hand is mine) and the sense of body ownership (i.e. I am aware that the hand is mine) (Dokic, 2003). In addition, within the sense of body ownership, one may distinguish between feelings of ownership (i.e. I feel a positive phenomenology of “myness”) and judgments of ownership (i.e. I judge that the hand is mine) (for a similar distinction within the sense of agency, see Bayne & Pacherie, 2007). Finally, one must distinguish between the sense of body ownership and the sense of body disownership.

Three questions then arise: (i) Is there a phenomenology of myness? That is, are there feelings of body ownership or is the sense of body ownership purely judgmental? (ii) What grounds the sense of body ownership? and (iii) How can we empirically study the sense of body ownership?

5.1 The phenomenology of myness

Is there a specific phenomenology of ‘myness’ experienced toward my body? Arguably, at the phenomenological level, there is no obvious reply. Whereas the feeling of disownership is vivid and intense, the phenomenology of body ownership, like the rest of bodily awareness, is recessive. One may thus be tempted to conclude that there is no such thing as ownership feelings. This eliminativist view has been defended by Bermudez (forthcoming). He argues that the sense of ownership is exclusively judgmental and has no counterpart at the experiential level. There is nothing it is like to experience parts of our body as our own that would go beyond bodily experiences.

On the deflationary conception of ownership the sense of ownership consists, first, in certain facts about the phenomenology of bodily sensations and, second, in certain fairly obvious judgments about the body (which we can term judgments of ownership). (Bermudez, forthcoming).

Bermudez bases his argument on Anscombe's theory of knowledge without observation. Anscombe (1962) claims that we know the position of our body, but not on the basis of bodily sensations because they are not independently describable. Similarly, Bermudez argues that there is nothing more in ownership feeling than what is articulated in ownership judgment. Thus, one is aware that this body is one's own, but this awareness is not based on ownership feelings.

However, Anscombe does not deny the existence of bodily sensations, merely their epistemic role. Similarly, one may argue that there is some kind of non-conceptual intuitive awareness of body ownership, which accounts for the phenomenological difference between the sense of ownership of internal organs and the sense of ownership of other parts of the body like hands: we know that this is our kidney, but we feel that these are our hands (James, 1890; O'Shaughnessy, 1980; Vignemont, 2011a). On this view, our hands strike us as our own in the same way that the color of the ocean strikes us as blue, though it is less phenomenologically intense. Our body is manifested to us in a more primitive form than judgments.

If one posits the existence of ownership feelings at least for some parts of the body, then there are two alternatives, either the inflationary conception of ownership (Gallagher, 2005) or the reductionist conception of ownership (Martin, 1995, Dokic, 2003; Brewer, 1995; Carruthers, 2009; Tsakiris, 2010; Vignemont, 2007). According to the inflationary conception, the feeling of body ownership is an irreducible subjective feature of bodily awareness. According to the reductionist conception, the feeling of body ownership has its source in some more fundamental facts about bodily awareness. This then raises the following question: which facts are relevant, and how can they ground body ownership?

5.2 The grounds of the sense of body ownership

One can distinguish at least three views of the sense of body ownership, which respectively focus on the spatiality of bodily sensations, on intermodal matching and on affective tone.

It has been repeatedly argued that the sense of ownership is grounded in bodily sensations, and more precisely in the spatiality of bodily sensations. There are several versions of the spatial hypothesis. Martin (1995) reduces the sense of ownership to the awareness of the boundaries of one's own body. He argues that the spatial structure of bodily experiences is such that sensations are necessarily experienced within the boundaries of one's own body. Indeed, in bodily sensations, there is nothing that does not fall within the limits of the bodily space. By contrast, the boundaries of the object that I see are not co-extensive with the visual field. Consequently, the body that I see does not bear the “indelible stamp of ownership” (Brewer, 1995, 305). Martin's spatial account is exclusively at the phenomenological level. Alternatively, one may defend a representationalist view of body ownership, which aims at singling out the specific type of representation of the bodily space that grounds the sense of ownership (Tsakiris, 2010; Vignemont, 2007; Carruthers, 2009). For instance, Vignemont (2007) favors the sensorimotor body schema. She argues that the body immediately present for action is the body we feel as our own (see also Gallese and Sinigaglia, 2010).

The spatial hypothesis may currently be the dominant account of ownership. One can, however, find the seed of two other theoretical approaches to ownership. First, some psychologists have promoted the hypothesis that the sense of body ownership is anchored in the correlation between information from various sensory channels (Morgan and Rochat, 1997; Rochat, 1998; Botvinick and Cohen, 1998; Makin et al., 2008). This view takes mirror recognition as a starting point. To recognize oneself, the movements that one sees must match with what one feels. The Rubber Hand illusion and other various full-body illusions seem also to indicate that the sense of ownership of the rubber hand results from visuo-somatosensory matching. Botvinick and Cohen (1998, 756) conclude:

It has been proposed that the body is distinguished from other objects as belonging to the self by its participation in specific forms of intermodal perceptual correlation (…) While the rubber hand illusion does not tell us precisely what ingredient might make only certain forms of intermodal correlation relevant to the self, it does show that intermodal matching can be sufficient for self-attribution.

Second, some philosophers and neuroscientists have argued in favor of an affective view of the sense of ownership. On their view, what they might call the “bodily self” (Damasio, 1999; Craig, 2003) or the phenomenology of myness (Mishara, 2004) is based on the interoceptive system. One way to interpret their claim is in terms of “feelings of warmth and intimacy”, as James put it. If our body no longer felt familiar, then it is likely that we would no longer feel ownership towards it. This seems to correspond to what some patients suffering from depersonalization disorder and somatoparaphrenia sometimes report (Feinberg, 2009).

5.3 Empirical studies of ownership and disownership

In order to settle the debate about the grounds of the sense of ownership, there are at least two promising empirical pathways: (i) the analysis of deficits in patients who experience a body part as alien and (ii) the study of the conditions for an object to be experienced as one's own (for review, see Vignemont, 2011a).

Although the sense of body ownership may appear as a given, various psychiatric or neurological conditions highlight the possibility of losing the sense of body ownership (depersonalization, somatoparaphrenia; deafferentation; Body Integrity Identity Disorder). The sense of body disownership may even lead to the overwhelming desire to have the ‘alien’ limb amputated (First, 2005; Brang et al., 2008). Very few attempts have been made to analyse the sense of ownership on the basis of the analysis of the sense of disownership, though one may consider that what is missing in patients experiencing disownership may constitute the grounds of ownership (Vignemont, 2007). Fortunately, the sense of disownership is quite rare.

By contrast, it seems relatively easy to induce ownership of external objects, like in the Rubber Hand illusion (Botvinick and Cohen, 1998; Tsakiris and Haggard, 2005). If one looks at a rubber hand, while one's own hand is hidden, and both the rubber and the real hands are synchronously stroked, one feels as if one were touched on the rubber hand and as if the rubber hand were one's own. Further recent bodily illusions that involve the whole body also indicate that one can feel a virtual avatar or another individual's body as one's own (Ehrsson, 2007; Lenggenhager et al., 2007). Interestingly, participants affectively react when the rubber hand or the virtual avatar is threatened as if it were their own hand or body (Ehrsson et al., 2007; Ehrsson, 2007).

Several empirical phenomena thus indicate that there is no simple equation that systematically associates the fact of ownership and the sense of ownership. Our biological body is not always experienced as our own, and we do not experience only our biological body as our own.

There are, however, some open questions concerning the relation between ownership and disownership and the interpretation of the Rubber Hand Illusion. One may have some doubts about the relevance of the sense of disownership for the study of the sense of ownership (Bermudez, forthcoming). It might be partly because there is almost no experimental way to induce disownership in healthy subjects, and thus to operationalize the notion of disownership. It might be also because the lack of ownership does not necessarily imply disownership. Arguably, one can experience neither ownership nor disownership. What is then the relation between ownership and disownership? Are they independent? Or do patients feel disownership only when they become aware of the abnormal absence of ownership feelings (Vignemont, 2011a)?

One may also have some doubts about the interpretation of the Rubber Hand Illusion. Though it has been used as the experimental paradigm to investigate the sense of ownership, it remains controversial whether it should be conceived as an illusion of ownership at all. In particular, participants show only mild agreement when explicitly asked whether they feel the rubber hand as their own (Longo et al., 2008) and there is no clear behavioural correlate that has been shown to be specific to ownership only. For instance, participants display strong affective reactions not only in the context of the Rubber Hand illusion, but also in the context of empathy (Singer et al., 2004). Even if one were to grant that the Rubber Hand Illusion does manipulate the sense of ownership, one could still question whether the same type of mechanisms are at stake for the ownership of the rubber hand, which is merely seen, and for the ownership of a biological hand, which can be moved and experienced from the inside independently of any visual feedback.

In addition, recent evidence of embodiment of external objects has added complexity to an already quite intricate picture. It is now largely accepted that the representation of one's body can stretch to include not only rubber hands, but also allograft, prostheses, and tools. What is incorporated can be in flesh and blood, in rubber, in metal, or even virtual. It may be anatomically shaped or not. It may be controlled, or internally felt, or both. Despite their differences, the allograft, the prosthesis, the rubber hand, the virtual avatar and the tool are said to be ‘embodied’. However, the notion of embodiment is often left undefined, and its relation to ownership is rarely explicitly spelled out.

The agenda for any naturalistic theory of ownership is thus twofold. First, one needs to analyse how the sense of disownership is relevant for the understanding of the sense of ownership. Second, one needs to analyze the notion of embodiment and to contrast cases of embodiment that lead to a sense of ownership and those that do not.

6. The epistemology of bodily awareness

“It is tempting to think that because our bodies are, as it were, so close to us, the scope for illusions here is minimal. In fact, however, recent research in this area has presented some of the most striking illusions in all the literature” (Smith, 2002, 24). The list of bodily illusions is indeed long. On the other hand, the satisfaction conditions of some bodily experiences are difficult to articulate. Can one have an illusory pain for example? Furthermore, there seems to be at least one type of error that all bodily experiences may be immune to, namely, error through misidentification relative to the first-person.

6.1 Bodily illusions

Through body senses we have a privileged, though not exclusive, access to our body. It may then be tempting to conclude that the privileged immediate access that we have to our body is a source of infallible knowledge. However, there are a wide variety of bodily illusions. We have already seen the Rubber Hand illusion, which indicates that one can feel a rubber hand as one's own after only a couple of minutes of synchronous stroking of one's hand and a rubber hand. Another famous bodily illusion is the Pinocchio illusion (Lackner, 1988). Vibrations of muscle tendons induce illusory kinaesthetic sensations (e.g. arm stretching during biceps tendon vibration and arm flexing during triceps tendon vibration, though the arm remains still). If at the same time one holds one's nose with the stimulated arm, then one feels one's nose elongating (during biceps tendon vibration) or shrinking (during triceps tendon vibration). One may also mention what might be called the Dentist illusion. After having been to the dentist, one often feels as if one's mouth or lips were inflated though they look normal. And indeed it was experimentally shown that complete lips anaesthesia could induce the sensation of the lips increasing in size by as much as 100% (Gandevia and Phegan, 1999).

Those illusions are only a few within a long list. They are actually not surprising if bodily experiences are perceptual. One may, however, wonder whether there are illusions that correspond to every single type of bodily experiences, including pain. In this latter case, the distinction between appearance and reality may be difficult, if not impossible. Some phenomena, however, might be interpreted as cases of illusory pain. For instance, in the thermal grill illusion, when one presses one's fingers on two warm objects surrounding one cool object, the cool object feels painfully hot. But is this illusion more a thermal illusion or a pain illusion? Another possible candidate is the phenomenon of referred pain. One can sometimes experience pain at a location distinct from the location of the cause of pain. It then seems that the spatial content of pain is illusory. However, this is true only if one defends the view that the location of pain is the location of its cause. If pain seems infallible, it is even more so for bodily feelings like thirst and hunger.

6.2 Immunity to error through misidentification of bodily self-ascriptions

Though there are various interpretations of the notion of immunity to error (hereafter IEM), it is typically accepted that if I feel in pain, I cannot be wrong about who is in pain. Most accounts of IEM have focused on self-ascriptions of mental states like bodily sensations, but one may raise similar questions for self-ascriptions of physical bodily properties (e.g. size, weight, posture). The debate is then articulated around three main questions: (i) Can bodily self-ascriptions be immune to error, and if so, what are the appropriate grounds that secure bodily IEM (e.g., Vignemont, forthcoming)? (ii) Is bodily IEM of a different type from mental IEM (e.g., Coliva, forthcoming)? (iii) Does bodily IEM reveal the bodily nature of the self (e.g., Cassam, 1997)?

According to the dominant view on bodily IEM, which has been defended by Evans (1982) and others (e.g., Bermudez, 1998; Dokic, 2003; Brewer, 1995; Cassam, 1995), perceiving one's body through body senses grounds bodily self-ascriptions that are immune to error through misidentification. There are indeed no other bodies than one's own that one can directly access to through body senses. One can thus dispense with identifying whose body one experiences when one experiences it from the inside. For instance, one cannot rationally doubt that the arms that are crossed are one's own when one knows the position of the arms through proprioception. Most theories then reject vision as an appropriate candidate for bodily IEM. For the most part, visual experiences of one's body do not guarantee bodily IEM: I can see my arms crossed and rationally doubt whether those are my arms or not. However, there may be exceptions (Bermudez, 1998; Vignemont, forthcoming). For instance, I can see my nose if I close one eye. I then cannot doubt that this is my own nose when I see it from this specific angle. Hence, one should not rule out all visual experiences as being inappropriate for bodily IEM. There are some visuo-spatial perspectives from which we can see our body such that we cannot rationally doubt that the body is our own. Indeed, the body that we see that way has always been our own. Our cognitive system has evolved with this invariant fact, making self-identification process superfluous and error through misidentification impossible.

Bodily experiences, and possibly some visual experiences, seem to guarantee bodily IEM. Some may deny, however, that bodily self-ascriptions display the same type of IEM as mental self-ascriptions (Shoemaker, 1968). The IEM of pain self-ascriptions, for instance, may seem absolute or logical. On this view, there is no possible world where I can feel pain and be mistaken about who is feeling pain. By contrast, one can easily conceive that my proprioceptive system is connected to another body. When I judge that my legs are crossed on the basis of proprioception (or what we may call quasi-proprioception), I may actually be feeling someone else's legs. Bodily IEM is only de facto (true only in the actual world) (Evans, 1982).

But if bodily IEM is only de facto, what can it tell us about the true nature of the self? Yet, Evans (1982) and Cassam (1997) use bodily IEM as an argument against the Cartesian view of the self. In a nutshell, bodily awareness is the awareness of oneself qua subject, as shown by bodily IEM. One can therefore self-ascribe bodily properties as well as mental properties to the self without self-identification. Hence the object of such judgments, the self, is not a Cartesian ego, but a bodily subject of both mental and physical properties. One may, however, wonder if one is entitled to draw such a metaphysical conclusion from the epistemological fact of bodily IEM.

7. The functional role of bodily awareness

Via body ownership, bodily awareness may thus play a role in grounding self-awareness (Bermudez, 1998; Neisser, 1992), and even a non-Cartesian view of the self (Evans, 1982; Cassam, 1997). Its significance may even extend further. Stressing the importance of the body for the mind actually constitutes one of the main claims of the recent approach of Embodied cognition (see the entry Embodied Cognition). The body is said to affect not only perception, emotion, and action, but also higher mental processes. Gallagher (2005, 247) concludes: “nothing about human experience remains untouched by human embodiment”. However, one should distinguish the role of the physical body, the role of bodily activities and the role of bodily awareness. This section will briefly discuss only the latter, and in particular in relation to emotion, perceptual awareness and social cognition.

7.1 Emotions

Theories of emotion have oscillated between cognitive theories and embodied theories. On the one hand, some theories have focused on the intentionality of emotions, accounting for emotions in purely cognitive terms (Solomon, 1993). It is not clear, however, how they differentiate propositional attitudes and emotions. On the other hand, other theories have focused on the phenomenology of emotions, explaining certain (if not all) emotions in terms of experiences of bodily changes (e.g., James, 1884, Damasio, 1999; Prinz, 2004; Niedenthal, 2007). There are some states, including pain, pleasure and disgust, that can be conceived either as emotions or as bodily sensations. A recent study even showed that conventional painkillers could decrease psychological distress (Dewall et al., 2010). For other types of emotions, however, the link with bodily sensations seems more remote.

Embodied theories of emotions have been criticized for their failure to account for the target of the emotion (I feel frightened of the dog, for instance). Furthermore, even for primary emotions, which seem the most embodied, there is some opacity concerning the specific nature of their bodily component. Does this component refer to physiological states, subpersonal recording of physiological states, bodily sensations and/or bodily expressions of emotions? For instance, it was shown that if you hold a pen horizontally between your lips, artificially forcing you to smile, the cartoon that you read looks funnier (Strack et al., 1988). But is it the feeling of smiling that makes you happy or the fact of smiling?

7.2 Perceptual awareness

Merleau-Ponty emphasizes how the lived body anchors the awareness of the world. Similarly, O'Shaughnessy (1980) argues that bodily awareness is a major determinant of perceptual awareness by spatially structuring it. When I see that the book is on my left on the table, my visual experience of the book is spatially organized by my body in two distinct ways. First, the book is directly located relative to the location of my body. This egocentric location is especially important for action. I need to locate the book relative to my hand for me to grasp it. Second, even the location of the book relative to the table is determined by my body. It is only from my perspective that the book is on the table. From the spider's perspective on the ceiling, the book is under the table. Bodily space thus orients external space by offering spatial axes such as up and down, left and right, front and back.

The influence of bodily awareness on perception has been said to go beyond anchoring reference frames. According to some, bodily awareness affects not only how we perceive the location of objects, but also their other properties, including affordances or what Campbell (1994) calls causally indexical properties. Causally indexical properties like the weight of an object have immediate implications for our actions. As such, they depend on the state of our body that will carry on the actions. For instance, some results indicate that the effortful experience of wearing a heavy backpack makes slopes look steeper and distances seem longer (Proffitt et al., 2003). The authors concluded that what we feel determines what we perceive. However, these results are controversial (Durgin et al., 2009).

7.3 Social cognition

Another example of the influence of bodily awareness concerns social perception, that is, the perception of cues in other people indicating their mental states like facial expressions. Since Lipps (1900), it has been recurrently suggested that when perceiving other people's actions, we mentally simulate or re-enact their bodily movements (Goldman, 2006; Gallese, 2001). This view seems to be confirmed by the discovery of mirror systems for action. It was found that perceiving another individual acting partially activates the same regions in the brain as when one is acting (Rizzolatti et al., 1995; Decety et al., 1997). Shared cortical networks have also been found for empathy. Brain imaging studies have shown overlapping brain activity when subjects feel pain and when they observe another in pain (Singer et al., 2004), when they feel being touched and when they see another being touched (Keysers et al., 2004), when they inhale disgusting odorants and when they observe disgust-expressive faces (Wicker et al. 2003).

What makes motor and affective resonance special is that it goes beyond mere conceptual sharing. One does not share abstract knowledge about the observed action or emotion; one shares what might be called embodied knowledge or knowledge in a bodily format (Goldman and Vignemont, 2009). Three related questions can then be raised. First, is motor resonance similar to affective resonance? Second, what mechanisms generate motor resonance and affective resonance? Do they directly derive from the perception of actions and facial expressions (Gallese, 2001; Gallagher, 2005)? Or are they mediated by processing of contextual information (Csibra, 2007; Vignemont and Singer, 2006)? Third, what role do motor resonance and affective resonance play for mindreading? Do they result in the understanding of other people's mental states (Goldman, 2006; Rizzolatti and Sinigaglia, 2008) or not (Jacob, 2008)?

8. Conclusion

Bodily awareness reveals a new rich territory for philosophical exploration in its own right, but it also provides a new approach to general issues on perception, action, self and space. Empirical research on body representations, bodily sensations, bodily illusions, and self-awareness has grown exponentially in the last fifteen years. A comprehensive understanding of bodily awareness will likely require taking on board its insight.


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action | cognition: embodied | consciousness: representational theories of | emotion | Merleau-Ponty, Maurice | pain | perception: the problem of | self-consciousness: phenomenological approaches to | self-knowledge