Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Autonomy in Moral and Political Philosophy

1. Frankfurt's view is not explicitly an account of autonomy, but rather of freedom of the will. Nevertheless, the account has been absorbed into the literature on autonomy as a model of that notion (Frankfurt, 1987). See also Susan Wolf (1990), whose account of freedom has been taken by writers on autonomy to be relevant to accounts of that idea; this is despite her explicit claim that what she is modeling is not the concept of autonomy.

2. Partially in response to objections of this sort, Dworkin revised his view to exclude an explicit requirement of identification. For Dworkin, autonomy involves (among other things) the capacity to raise the question of whether one identifies with the desires in question (Dworkin 1988, 15).

3. This reply needs greater development of course, and it is not immune to problems that Arneson and others have raised. For example, it can be claimed that there is no non-arbitrary threshold in the possession of capacities for rational reflection that adequately explains why we put great weight on differences among people just below and just above such a threshold (concerning the capacities of rational reflection) but count as irrelevant vast differences among people above the line.

4. Although he does not couch his conception of liberalism in terms of autonomy, Dworkin's view can be understood as in this category: see R. Dworkin 2000, 237-84.

Also, it should be noted that autonomy or related ideas have figured importantly in other approaches to justice and social critique, either explicitly or by implication, which are not explicitly liberal (or indeed reject that framework). See, for example, Gould 1988, ch. 1. Also, however, conceptions of “oppression” and “domination” which are developed as an explicit alternative to a liberal political outlook nevertheless are defined in ways that come quite close to valorizing what amounts to autonomy: see, e.g., Young, 1990, 38. Cf. also Hirschman 2002, 1-29

5. The characterization here reflects the Kantian strain in liberal thought. An arguably separable tradition of liberalism, which can be traced through the British Utilitarians, Isaiah Berlin and others, stresses the pluralism of moral viewpoints but looks skeptically upon the claim that “justice” can be determined independent of social realities and historical contingencies. This tradition, therefore, puts tolerance and the protection of individual liberty at the center of the liberal social order. (For discussion, see, in addition to Gaus (Liberalism ), Geuss 2002 and Ryan 1986.)

6. In discussions of this claim, it is often ambiguous whether the defender of such a social conception of the self intends the thesis as a metaphysical claim or merely a psychological one. For discussion, see Christman 2002, 133-34.

7. A passing comment about this argument: While it may well be clear that the value claims underlying lifestyles of pure obedience or secondary social status are deeply problematic even if freely embraced, it must be acknowledged that there are deep and ongoing disagreements about such value claims in heterogeneous and multicultural populations. And recall that the kind of “happy slave” we are imagining meets all other requirements of competent choice but that she has “chosen” this sort of subservient position for reasons of religious faith, moral commitment, or political identification. To understand autonomy in a way that denies her that trait is to imply that she has no authentic voice in the consideration of whether such religious positions, moral commitments, and the like have validity. That, however, is to prejudge the outcome of just the sort of social deliberation that a free society must operate with in the collective determination of just institutions. Moreover, it must be recalled that the proceduralist accounts of autonomy attempt to set forth rather stringent conditions for authentic endorsement of values, in particular that such reflective endorsement (or non-alienation) not take place under conditions that effectively prevent reflection altogether (see Christman, 1991b, Mele, 1995, 186-93). It is unclear that victims of oppression of the sort typically imagined in these contexts meet those conditions (see, e.g., Mahmoud 2003).

8. The disjunction here — “some of us or all of us in some ways” — is used because of the variety of critical views being covered. Some claim that all of us (as a matter of metaphysics or psychological fact) are socially constituted in ways that go unnoticed in liberal theories (communitarians make such claims for example, as discussed earlier). While others argue that there are persons and groups whose social positioning relative to past and ongoing oppression makes their place in a social nexus, and the identifying markers of such a place, salient in their self-conceptions (their race or gender in racist and patriarchal societies for example) (see Harstock 1997, Mills 1997).