Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Arabic and Islamic Psychology and Philosophy of Mind

1. F.E. Peters, Aristoteles Arabus (Leiden, E.J. Brill, 1968), pp. 40–47. The views expressed by John Philoponus circulated as well, though we have no Arabic translation of his commentary on De anima.

2. Peter Adamson, “Vision, Light and Color in Al-Kindî, Ptolemy and the Ancient Commentators,” Arabic Sciences and Philosophy 16 (2006), 207–36.

3. Gerhard Endress, “Al-Kindî Über die Wiedererinnerung der Seele,” Oriens (34, 1994), 179, 188; Cristina D’Ancona Costa, “Aristotelian and Neoplatonic elements in Kindî's Doctrine of Knowledge,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly (LXXIII.1), 14, 20, 34, highlighting the influence of John Philoponus as well as Plotinus.

4. Al-Qawl fi’l-Nafs, ed. M.‘A.H. Abû Rîdah, in Rasâ’il al-Kindî al-Falsafiyyah (Cairo, 1950–53), I:272–80.

5. Abû Rîdah, pp. 274, 278.

6. Cf. al-Kindî's “On the Definition and Description of things,” Abû Rîdah, I:172; discussed in al-Kindî's Metaphysics, trans. Alfred L. Ivry (Albany, State University of New York Press, 1974), p. 117.

7. Abû Rîdah I:106–08, trans. Ivry, pp. 61, 62.

8. Abû Rîdah I:353–58; French translation by Jean Jolivet, L’Intellect selon Kindî (Leiden, Brill, 1971), pp. 157–60.

9. The views of Alexander, and that which was taken to be his writings, are summarized by Herbert A. Davidson, Alfarabi, Avicenna, & Averroes, on Intellect (New York, Oxford University Press, 1992), pp. 20–24.

10. Cf. Razi's Al-Tibb al-Ruhânî, ed. Paul Kraus, Razi: Opera Philosophica (Cairo, n.p., 1939), p. 27; editorial revisions by Dimitri Gutas in Arabica 24 (1977), 91–93; Arthur J. Arberry, trans., The Spiritual Physick of Rhazes (London, 1950), p. 29.

11. Cf. Kraus, pp. 295–313; M. Fakhry, A History of Islamic Philosophy (New York, Columbia University Press, 1970), p. 123.

12. Alfarabi's Philosophy of Plato and Aristotle, trans. Mushin Mahdi, (Ithaca, Cornell University Press, 1962), p. 116.

13. Mabâdî’ Ârâ’ ahl al-Madîna Al-Fâdila. This is called simply “The Perfect State” by its editor and translator; see Richard Walzer, Farabi on the Perfect State, Oxford,Clarendon Press, 1985.

14. Walzer renders nizâ‘ as “appetition”, p. 165.

15. Walzer, pp. 167–169. As is evident in the Parva Naturalia, Aristotle considered the heart the ruling faculty of both nutrition and sense perception; cf. Walzer, p. 387.

16. Walzer, p. 195. At p. 400, Walzer notes Aristotle's similar remark in History of Animals IX 1 608a25 and elsewhere.

17. Al-quwwah al-mutakhayyilah, which Walzer calls “the faculty of representation.”

18. On Memory, 450a1: “without an image thinking is impossible.”

19. Edited by M. Bouyges, Beyrouth: Imprimerie Catholique, 1938; translated (partially) by Arthur Hyman as “The Letter concerning the Intellect,” in Philosophy in the Middle Ages, ed. Arthur Hyman and James J. Walsh (Indianapolis/Cambridge, Hackett Publishing Company, 1973, 2nd edition), pp. 215–221. Cf. too the summary of Farabi's view of the stages of the intellect in Davidson, p. 49.

20. Bouyges, p. 12, Hyman, p. 215. Hyman translates mâhiyyât, essences, as “quiddities”.

21. Cf. the Arabic edition of F. Rahman, Avicenna's De Anima: Being the Psychological Part of Kitâb Al-Shifâ’ (London, Oxford University Press, 1959), 1:1, p. 16 (Henceforth Shifâ’). See too the French translation published, with an accompanying Arabic edition, by Jân Bakos, Psychologie D’Ibn Sînâ (Avicenne) d’après son oeuvre ash-Shifâ’ (Prague, Editions de l’Académie Tchécoslovaque des Sciences, 1956), p. 12.

22. Kitâb al-Najât, ed. Majid Fakhry, Beirut, 1985 (henceforth Najât); English translation of Book 2, Chapter 6 by F. Rahman, Avicenna's Psychology, London, Oxford University Press, 1952. Henceforth, “Psychology.”

23. Shifâ’, pp. 222–29, Bakos translation, pp. 158–66; Najât, pp. 222–25, Rahman, Psychology, pp. 57–59. As Rahman notes, p. 108, there is a strong Plotinian background to this theory.

24. Cf. Avicenna's Metaphysics: Al-Shifâ’, Al-Ilâhiyyât, ed. Mohammad Youssef Moussa, Solayman Dunya, Sa’id Zayed (Cairo, Organisme Général des Imprimeries Gouvernementales, 1960), II: 431–2; translated by A.J. Arberry, Aspects of Islamic Civilization (London, George Allen & Unwin, 1964), p. 153. See too Jean R, Michot, La destinée de l’homme selon Avicenne (Louvain, Peeters, 1986), pp. 22–56, and particularly pp. 26–27, and 43; J. Janssens, “Ibn Sînâ's Ideas of ultimate Realities, Neoplatonism and the Qur’ân as Problem-Solving paradigms in the Avicennian System,” Ultimate Reality and Meaning 10 (1987), 259–261. Cf. too Michael Marmura's complete translation, Avicenna: The Metaphysics of the Healing, Provo, Utah, Brigham Young University Press, 2005.

25. Davidson, pp. 106–115.

26. Rahman points to John Philoponus as a possible influence upon Avicenna's idea of ego. Cf. Psychology, p. 111.

27. Shifâ’, pp. 16, 255. Cf. Michael Marmura, “Avicenna's ‘Flying Man’ in Context,” Monist 69 (1986), 383–95; Thérêse-Anne Druart, “The Soul and Body Problem: Avicenna and Descartes,” in Arabic Philosophy and the West, ed. Thérêse-Anne Druart, (Washington, D.C., Georgetown University, 1988), pp. 29–34.

28. Deborah L. Black, “Imagination and Estimation: Arabic Paradigms and Western Transformations,” Topoi 19 (2000), 59–60.

29. De an. II 6 418a9. Aristotle's example is the perception that the white object seen is Diares' son.

30. The terms “retentive imagination” and “compositive imagination,” were coined by Harry Wolfson, as Davidson mentions, p. 89, n.66. Cf. Wolfson's pioneering study, “The Internal Senses in Latin, Arabic and Hebrew Philosophic Texts,” Harvard Theological Review 28 (1935), 70–133; reprinted in Wolfson, Studies in the History of Philosophy and Religion (Cambridge, MA, Harvard U.P. 1973), I:250–314.

31. Shifâ’, p. 166; Bakos translation, p. 117; Najât, p. 202; Psychology, p. 301.

32. Averroes: Epitome of Parva Naturalia, trans. Harry Blumberg, (Cambridge, MA, The Mediaevel Academy of America, 1961), p. 24; Arabic edition (Cambridge, MA, The Mediaevel Academy of America, 1972), p. 39.

33. Shifâ’, 249; Pychology, 36; Posterior Analytics I 34 89b7–20.

34. Najât p. 221; Psychology, p. 55.

35. Deborah L. Black, “Estimation (Wahm) in Avicenna: The Logical and Psychological Dimensions,” Dialogue XXXII (1993), 226. Davidson, On Intellect, pp. 96–99, describes the cogitative faculty's function in laying the groundwork for the rational faculty to obtain intelligibles and achieve conjunction.

36. The expanded role of estimation in Avicenna is fully demonstrated in Black 2000, 219–58.

37. Dimitri Gutas, “Intuition and Thinking: The Evolving Structure of Avicenna's Epistemology,” Aspects of Avicenna, ed. Robert Wisnovsky (Princeton, Markus Wiener Publishers, 2001, pp. 1–39. See too Gutas, Avicenna and the Aristotelian Tradition (Leiden, Brill, 1988, pp. 161–66.The former position, which for Gutas stems from Avicenna's middle period, is represented in his Shifâ’, Najât, and other major works, while the revised position is found in his Al-Isharât wa l-Tanbihât and in the posthumous compilations of discussions he held with students (al-Mubâhathât).

38. Najât, p. 231; Psychology, pp. 68, 69; Davidson, p. 93. Dag Nikolaus Hasse, “Avicenna on Abstraction,” Aspects of Avicenna, op. cit., pp. 39–72, taking the developmental explanation of Avicenna's views propounded by Gutas (see the preceding note), considers Avicenna as affirming, in his later compositions, a more substantial role for the individual intellect in abstraction, the active intellect's emanative activity being much diminished, if not absent entirely.

39. Shifâ’, p. 48, Bakos translation, p. 33; Najât, p. 204; Psychology, p. 34. Davidson, p. 84, sees Avicenna as limiting the intellect in habitu to knowledge of first intelligible thoughts, the fully actualized potentiality being attributed to an “actual intellect.”

40. Healing, ed. Rahman, p. 247, Bakos translation, p. 175, and see Rahman, Psychology, p. 118.

41. For the entrance of the Agent Intellect after the person's intellect prepares the way, as well as its appearance in dreams, cf. Psychology, pp. 34–36, 68; and see F. Rahman, Prophecy in Islam (London, George Allen & Unwin, 1958), pp.14–20.

42. Shifâ’ p. 248, Bakos translation, p. 176; Najât, p. 205, Psychology, p. 35.

43. Avicenna's views on various levels of prophecy are discussed in Davidson, pp. 118–123.

44. Cf. the comparisons of the commentaries in Alfred L. Ivry, “Averroes' Short Commentary on Aristotle's De anima,” Documenti e Studi Sulla Tradizione Filosofica Medievale VIII (1997), 511–19.

45. Also called “soul heat,” and see Davidson, On Intellect, pp. 243, 244.

46. S. Gómez Nogales, Epitome De Anima (Madrid, 1985), p. 86 (henceforth Gómez Nogales); translation by Gómez Nogales, La Psicologia de Averroes: Commentariio al libro sobre el alma de Aristoteles (Madrid, 1987), p. 176 (henceforth, Psicologia.) The following remarks on Averroes' treatment of the internal senses are based mostly on his epitome to De anima and the sections of his epitome to Parva Naturalia that deal with memory. Parallel citations for the internal senses can be adduced from his Middle and Long Commentaries.

47. Cf. Lenn Goodman, “Ibn Bâjjah,” The History of Islamic Philosophy, ed. S.H. Nasr and O. Leaman (London, Routledge, 1996), 294–312. Mostly concerned metaphysically with the Neoplatonically weighted theme of conjunction, Ibn Bâjjah largely followed Aristotle in describing the faculties of perception and cognition. The Arabic corpus of his writing, some in fragmentary form, is found in Opera Metaphysica, ed. Majid Fakhry, (Beirut, Dâr al Nahâr, 1968, reprint, 1992), and in Rasâ’il Falsafîyah li Ibn Bakr ben Bâjjah, ed. Jamâl al-Dîn al-‘Alawî (Beirut, Dâr al-Thaqâfah, 1983). See Miguel Asin Palacios, ed. and trans., “Tratado de Avempace sobre la union del intellecto con el hombre,” Al Andalus 7 (1942), 1–47; M.S. Hasan Ma‘sumî, trans. ‘Ilm al-Nafs (Science of the Soul), (Karachi, 1961). See too Alexander Altmann, “Ibn Bâjjah on Man's Ultimate Felicity,” H.A. Wolfson Jubilee Volume (n.e., Jerusalem, The American Academy of Jewish Research, 1965), I:47–87.

48. On Memory 450a 10.

49. On Memory, 450a 30.

50. Averroes has but the one imaginative faculty, calling it both musawwir and mutakhîl. Blumberg, Arabic epitome of Parva Naturalia, pp. 42, 43.

51. Blumberg, translation, p. 26, Arabic p. 42. Averroes calls the cogitative faculty both mufakkir and mumayyiz, “thinking” and “discerning.” Blumberg mistakenly calls it the “estimative” faculty throughout. For a full appreciation of the cogitative faculty, cf. Richard Taylor, “Remarks on Cogitatio in Averroes' Commentarium Magnum in Aristotelis De anima Libros,” in G. Endress and J.A. Aertsen, eds., Averroes and the Aristotelian Tradition (Leiden, Brill, 1999), pp. 217–55.

52. Deborah Black, discerning that memory has a perceptive as well as retentive role, describes memory as “the faculty by which we grasp the individual as such.” See her “Memory, Individuals and the Past in Averroes's Psychology,” Medieval Philosophy and Theology 5 (1996), 162.

53. Blumberg translation, p. 27, Arabic, 43.11. Blumberg translates intention, ma‘nâ, as “object,” saying at p. 88, note 15, that it stands for the “object of the activity. Thus the object of memory is the thing remembered and the object of the imagination is the thing imagined.” It would be more helpful to say that the object of memory is the thing as remembered, the object of imagination the thing as imagined. These “things” differ phenomenologically, the remembered intention indicative of something peculiar to the object, the imagined intention recreating the whole form of the object.

54. On Memory, 450a 1.

55. Blumberg translation, pp. 25, 27.

56. Averroes quotes Al-Ghazzâlî's summary of Avicenna's teachings on the internal senses in Averroes' Incoherence of the Incoherence, and explicitly rejects the estimative faculty as superfluous. Cf. Averroes: Tahafot at-Tahafot, ed. Maurice Bouyges (Beyrouth, Imprimerie Catholique, 1930, pp. 546–547; Simon Van Den Bergh, trans., Averroes' Tahafut al-Tahafut (Luzac, London, 1954), I:336.

57. Blumberg translation, p. 26; Arabic, 42.1.

58. Blumberg translation, p. 30; Arabic, 49.9.

59. Gómez Nogales, pp. 94–96, 115; Psicologia, pp. 184–86, 202.

60. Ilâhiyyun jiddan, Gómez Nogales, p. 100; Psicologia, p. 189.

61. Gómez Nogales, p. 93, Psicologia, p. 184.

62. Gómez Nogales, p. 112; Psicologia, p. 199.

63. This is the view of the Long Commentary particularly, and see Davidson, pp. 237, 248, 255.

64. Gómez Nogales, p. 127; Psicologia, p. 213, and see the evolution of Averroes' thought on conjunction in Davidson, Intellect, pp. 323–335.

65. Cf. Davidson, Intellect, pp. 265–72.

66. Gómez Nogales, p. 128; Psicologia, p. 213.

67. There is controversy over the dating of the Middle and Long commentaries, which Richard Taylor has summarized in the introduction to his translation of Averroes' Long Commentary on the De Anima of Aristotle (New Haven, Yale University Press, 2009), xxviii–xxxiii.

68. Averroës: Middle Commentary on Aristotle's De anima, ed. Alfred L. Ivry, (Provo, Utah, Brigham Young University Press, 2002), 125.8, 130.9. See too Richard C. Taylor, “The Agent Intellect as ”form for us“ and Averroes's Critique of al-Fârâbî,” Proceedings of the society for Medieval Logic and Metaphysics 5 (2005), pp. 18–32.

69. This disposition is now said simply to be “in man,” that is, in the soul in general, unlike the Short Commentary's location of it in the imaginative faculty. Cf. Middle Commentary, ed. Ivry, 124.4, 125.8, and see Alfred L. Ivry, “Averroes' Three Commentaries on De anima,” Averroes and the Aristotelian Tradition, p. 211.

70. F. Stuart Crawford, ed., Averrois Cordubensis: Commentarium Magnum in Aristoteles De Anima Libros (Cambridge, MA., The Mediaeval Academy of America, 1953) p.409, line 657. Taylor translation, p. 326.

71. Crawford, 442.63. Taylor translation, p. 354.

72. Crawford, 415.67, 419.35. Taylor translation, pp. 331, 334.

73. Crawford, 476.70, 76. Taylor translation, p. 379.

74. Worded as reverting to the state of pure potentiality, in The Epistle on the Possibility of Conjunction with the Active intellect by Ibn Rushd with the Commentary of Moses Narboni, ed. and trans. Kalman P. Bland (New York, The Jewish Theological Seminary of America, 1982), p. 50.