Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Anaphora

1. For example, the beginning of the entry for ‘anaphora’ in the MacMillan Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Supplement) reads “The study of anaphora (from Greek, "carry back") is the study of the ways in which occurrences of certain expressions, particularly pronouns, depend for their interpretations upon the interpretations of occurrences of other expressions.” And in The Concise Oxford Dictionary of Linguistics, by Peter Matthews, 1997, Oxford University Press, New York, the entry for ‘anaphora’ begins “The relation between a pronoun and another element, in the same or in an earlier sentence, that supplies its referent.”

2. That is, ‘It is possible that’ tells us to choose a possible world, and ‘some human’ then ranges over the humans in that world.

3. One difference though is that the quantifiers of standard first order logic are unrestricted, whereas natural language quantifiers like ‘every man’ are restricted (here by the nominal ‘man’). Still, it is easy enough to introduce a first order language with restricted quantifiers that bind variables. The pronouns in sentences like (3) and (6) function just like the bound variables of such a language.

4. See Chapter IV Section 28.

5. Sometimes philosophers and linguists consider conjunctions of sentences like those in (7) and (8) rather than considering the two sentence discourses. For example, Evans [1977] considers conjunctions such as ‘Few MPs came to the party but they had a marvelous time.’ The reasons for thinking the pronouns in the second conjuncts of such conjunctions are not bound variables or referring expressions are the same as the reasons for thinking this about the pronouns in the second sentences of (7) and (8). Hence I shall talk only of discourses like (7) and (8). Also, henceforth I shall take the intended anaphoric relations in my examples to be obvious (as they are); and unless otherwise indicated I am only considering the readings of my examples on which the intended anaphoric relations obtain.

6. Evans argued that a bound variable treatment also gets the truth conditions wrong for cases such as ‘John owns some sheep and Harry vaccinates them’ (as well as for the two sentence discourse corresponding to this conjunction). Wilson [1984] argues, correctly in my view, that Evans is mistaken about this. But that the account of pronouns with quantifier antecedents in other sentences (or conjunctions) as bound variables gets the truth conditions wrong for some cases (e.g., (8)) is enough to reject it.

7. Of course, one could argue that different quantifiers have different capacities for how far their scopes extend, and that this explains the discrepancy between (7) and (8), and (9) and (10). So far as I know, no one has defended this view, and I think they are right not to.

8. I believe that considerations of this general sort were first raised in Davies [1981] (p. 172-173). They are also discussed in Wilson [1984] and Soames [1989].

9. So far as I know, such sentences were introduced into the contemporary literature in Geach [1962]. The term ‘donkey anaphora’ arose from the fact that Geach used the indefinite ‘a donkey’ in his examples, as I do above.

10. The name is due to Kamp. Heim [1982] calls one formulation of her view file change semantics and that term is sometimes used in the literature for Heim's version of DRT.

11. Kamp [1981] p. 278.

12. The various hedges above (scare quotes around ‘logical form’), here (‘in effect can be represented as’) and below are due to the fact that Heim and Kamp implement the feature of DRT being described in different ways. For example, in the present case Heim (on one formulation) assigns logical forms to sentences and in these logical forms indefinites always have novel indices. Pronouns anaphoric on an indefinite share its index. Indices on indefinites and indexed pronouns function as variables. By contrast, Kamp constructs discourse representation structures for discourses, and truth is defined over these. An indefinite introduces a new discourse referent into the discourse representation structure for the discourse it is in. And a pronoun anaphoric on the indefinite gets linked with the discourse referent the indefinite introduced. But Heim’s and Kamp’s methods are both ways of insuring that the truth of a discourse like (15) requires that some one thing satisfy both the predicative material in the indefinite and the sentence containing it, and the predicative material the anaphoric pronoun is combined with.

13. Actually, the claim that the truth of (14) requires every donkey owning woman to beat every donkey she owns is somewhat controversial. This is discussed below.

14. I assume that ‘every x,y (Φ(x,y)) (Ψ(x,y))’, where ‘Φ(x,y)’ and ’Ψ(x,y)’ are (possibly) complex predicates that may contain free occurrences of ‘x’ and ‘y’, is true just in case every assignment to ‘x’ and ‘y’ that makes ‘Φ(x,y)’ true also makes ’Ψ(x,y)’ true.

15. Heim [1990] claims that Nirit Kadmon so dubbed it.

16. This application is in King [1991].

17. See King [2003] for details and discussion.

18. Interested readers should consult King [2003].

19. The idea that definites involve some sort of familiarity is common in the literature. See for example Heim [1982].

20. Jason Stanley (p.c.) raised this difficulty.

21. In particular, Davies [1981] holds that pronouns anaphoric on singular indefinite noun phrases (‘Mary owns a dog. It…’) “go proxy” for definite descriptions (pps. 166-176). He holds a broadly Russellian theory of definite descriptions, and views them as quantificational (p. 151-152). He suggests that in relative clause donkey sentences, anaphoric pronouns “go proxy” for number neutral descriptions (which Neale calls numberless), and so explains why ‘Every man who owns a donkey beats it.’ (allegedly) requires every man who owns donkeys to beat all the donkeys he owns in the same way Neale does (see p. 175). And finally, the options Davies considers regarding how to understand the notion that anaphoric pronouns “go proxy for” or “are interpreted as” definite descriptions (p. 174) appear to be precisely those considered by Neale (p. 184).

22. Actually, Neale mentions another factor as well. Concerning the sentence ‘Every man who has a daughter thinks she is the most beautiful girl in the world’ Neale writes: “…it is arguable that a singular [Russellian] interpretation of the pronoun is preferred. A reasonable explanation is that immediate linguistic context, and lexical and background knowledge, conspire to defeat the numberless interpretation. (In the normal run of things, there cannot be two most beautiful girls in the world.)” (p. 238) I suppress this factor affecting which reading an anaphoric pronoun has. For in the examples I consider in which an anaphoric pronoun lacks a numberless reading there are no factors such as the impossibility of there being two most beautiful girls in the world that would “defeat” the numberless reading.

23. Note that nothing like the impossibility of there being two most beautiful girls in the world is present in this case to defeat the numberless reading. Sarah could beat more than one donkey and the Camaro driver could use more than one eight track player. See previous note.

24. Of course, DRT and CDQ give different accounts of what these factors are and how they interact.

25. For example, Montague (more or less) assigned each syntactic constituent a model theoretic interpretation and the interpretation of a syntactically complex expression was a function of the interpretations of its parts. DRT, by contrast, doesn't even assign interpretations to parts of sentences.

26. Groenendijk and Stokhof write the clause as follows: ||∃xφ||= {<g,h>| ∃k: k[x]g & ,<k,h> ε ||φ||}, (where k[x]g is a sequence that differs from g at most on x.

27. As Groenendijk and Stokhof write it: ||φ&ψ||= {<g,h>| ∃k: <g,k> φ & <k,h> ε ||ψ||}

28. That we only look at pairs <h,h> means that conditionals are “externally static”, and so cannot affect the interpretation of expressions outside of them, unlike conjunctions. This explains the following contrast: ‘A man came in and he was happy. He was rich.’; *‘If a man came in, he was happy. He was rich.’

29. But not outside: it is externally static, which explains the infelicity of the following: *“Every woman who ones a donkey beats it. It is in pain.”

30. See, for example, Chierchia [1995] and Kanazawa [1994a, 1994b].

31. Chierchia [1995] favors a dynamic approach, but allows that anaphoric pronouns can function as definite descriptions as well (see pps. 110-122, and Section 3.3 above). He also suggests that Geach Discourses (see above) can be handled assuming the anaphoric pronouns in them are functioning as definite descriptions. So perhaps he would invoke this mechanism to get the reading discussed above for the second sentence of 11. But this is to invoke another mechanism in addition to the one invoked by dynamic approaches to explain the anaphora in 11 on the reading in question. And that is the point I am making in the text.

32. I shall also talk of the (alleged) universal and existential readings of sentences like 14. These are just the readings corresponding to the (alleged) universal and existential truth conditions, respectively.

33. Kanazawa [1994] discusses how the monotonicity properties of the determiner on the wide scope quantifier in a relative clause donkey sentence (‘Every’, ‘Most’ and ‘No’ in 30 a-c respectively) affect whether a universal or existential reading for the sentence is favored. Though Kanazawa admits that other factors also contribute to making one or the other reading favored in particular cases (see p. 124), he claims that certain monotonicity properties of the determiners on the wide scope quantifier result in only one reading being possible. Thus he claims that when the wide scope quantifier has a determiner that is upward monotone on both arguments (e.g., ‘some’), only the existential reading (which Kanazawa calls the “weak reading”) is possible (p. 120, 124). I agree with this. However, Kanazawa also claims that when the wide scope quantifier has a determiner that is monotone down on both arguments (e.g., ‘no’) only the existential (weak) reading is possible (p. 120, 124). Though such sentences favor existential readings, sentences like 31 c cast doubt on the claim that they only allow existential readings. In any case, the important point is that though Kanazawa is concerned with how monotonicity properties of the determiners on the wide scope quantifiers in relative clause donkey sentences affect which readings are favored or available, he agrees that in the general case factors other than such monotonicity properties affect which readings are favored. See also Guerts [2002] for interesting data on factors affecting which readings are favored for donkey sentences.

34. For example, Kanazawa [1994b] captures the universal and existential readings by defining a strong and a weak dynamic generalized quantifier for each determiner (see p. 138). This appears to amount to claiming that determiners are ambiguous. However, Kanazawa appears to take himself to be simply “modeling” the readings of donkey sentences and not actually proposing a semantics. Thus, in introducing his dynamic predicate logic with generalized quantifiers, he consistently talks of using the framework to “model” or “represent readings of” donkey sentences (see p. 132, 137, 138, 139); and after discussing the framework, he writes: “So far, we have not proposed any concrete model of the mechanism that assigns interpretations to donkey sentences. Although it would not be difficult to extract a compositional semantics from my treatment of donkey sentences in dynamic predicate logic with generalized quantifiers, our interest in this paper is not in finding the right set of compositional semantic rules that give donkey sentences the interpretation that they actually have (in the default case).” (p. 150). But the point is that if one were to turn Kanazawa's approach into a semantics, it seems that it would posit an ambiguity in determiners. Kanazawa himself seems to recognize this when, in discussing Chierchia’s approach and contrasting it with his own, he writes “So he [Chierchia] shifts the locus of ambiguity from the determiner to the pronoun” (p. 155). On the other hand, as Kanazawa’s remarks just suggested, Chierchia [1995] attempts to capture the universal and existential readings by positing an ambiguity in the pronouns in donkey sentences. Chierchia holds that such pronouns are interpreted either as dynamically bound variables or E type (descriptive) pronouns (see p. 110-122). Chierchia denies that the (alleged) fact that donkey pronouns can be interpreted in these two ways amounts to postulating an ambiguity in these pronouns (see p. 117). However, I don't find what he says on this matter persuasive.

35. As does the question of whether conditional donkey sentences seem to manifest both universal and existential readings.