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Johannes Sharpe

First published Mon Sep 24, 2001; substantive revision Thu Aug 4, 2011

Johannes Sharpe (ca. 1360 – after 1415) is the most important and original author among the so called “Oxford Realists”, a group of thinkers influenced by John Wyclif's logic and ontology. His semantic and metaphysical theories are the culmination of the main preceding traditions of thought, since he developed the new form of realism begun by Wyclif, on the one hand, but was open to many nominalist criticisms of the traditional realist strategies, on the other.

1. Life and Works

Johannes Sharpe (Scharp, Scharpe) was from the diocese of Münster in Westphalia, where he was born presumably around 1360. He received his Bachelor of Arts from the University of Prague in 1379, but spent the greatest part of his academic life in Oxford, where he was fellow at Queen's College from 1391 to 1403, and where he became a Master of Arts and a Doctor of Theology. In 1415 he was lector ordinarius in Lüneburg (Saxony) (see Conti 1990, p. xvii). The date of his death is unknown.

He established a reputation as a philosopher and a theologian. The number of extant manuscripts of his works and their widespread distribution attest to his importance and notoriety throughout the 15th century. The following writings are attributed to him:

2. The Theory of Meaning

The basic idea of the standard medieval realist theories of meaning was that semantic classifications derive from ontological differences among the signified objects. So, according to this approach, the simple expressions of our language (i.e., names) are distinct from the complex expressions (i.e., sentences) by virtue of their own significata, that is by virtue of the different kinds of objects they make known. In fact, the objects signified by complex expressions are compounds of (at least) two of the objects signified by simple expressions and a relation of identity (or non-identity, in the case of a true negative sentence), while a simple object is an item in a category (i.e., either a singular substance, or a substantial form, or an accidental form). Furthermore, every simple expression of our language is like a label naming just one object in the world, but whereas proper names and singular expressions label individuals (i.e., token-objects), general terms label common natures (i.e., type-objects), which are the main metaphysical constituents of the set of individuals instantiating them. For instance, the general expression ‘man’ labels and can stand for each and every man only because of its primarily signifying the universal form of humanity qua being present in each and every man as the main constitutive principle of his essence.

Sharpe rejects the standard realist criteria for the generality (or universality, according to his terminology) of terms, and substantially accepts the sense of nominalist criticisms. In his opinion, to be matched by a common nature really existing in the world is no longer the necessary and sufficient condition for being a general term. Rather, signifying universally (that is, signifying a unitary concept that in turn refers to a multiplicity of things displaying at least a similar mode of being [QsU, pp. 129-30]) is a condition for semantic universality of equal importance. He thinks that not only do terms signifying a common nature existing outside the intellect have to be viewed as common, but also those signifying universally (ibid., p. 69). Thus, according to Sharpe, there are six different kinds of general expressions, both spoken and written:

  1. those that universally signify a common nature really existing in the world (in re), like the term ‘humanity’;
  2. those that universally connote a common nature really existing in the world, without directly signifying it, like the term ‘white’ (‘album’), which refers to white things and connotes the form of whiteness;
  3. those that do not refer to anything really existing in the world, but are somehow correlated with a universal concept, like the terms ‘void’ and ‘chimaera’;
  4. those to which no common nature really existing in the world corresponds, but rather a common transcategorial negative concept, under which a multiplicity of things can be collected, like the term ‘individual’;
  5. equivocal terms as such, since they are connected with a multiplicity of different notions;
  6. demonstrative pronouns, like ‘this (one)’ (‘hoc’), when used to supposit for (refer to) a common nature, even though they can signify in a singular manner (discrete) only (ibid., pp. 69-71).

As is evident, Sharpe's analysis of the types of universality for linguistic terms is based on two distinct but compatible criteria: (i) the existence of a common nature directly or indirectly signified by them, and (ii) the universal mode of signifying – the latter being more important than the former. Thus, based on the satisfaction of these two criteria, Sharpe himself reduces the preceding division of the kinds of universality to a threefold partition: (i) terms that signify in a universal mode a common nature existing in re and which are thus properly common, such as ‘homo’; (ii) terms that signify in a universal mode but do not refer to any common nature in re and which are thus common in a less proper way, such as ‘chimaera’ and ‘persona’; finally, (iii) terms that do not signify in a universal mode and which are thus common in an improper way whenever they refer to a common nature existing in re , such as ‘hoc’ and other demonstrative pronouns (QsU, p. 71).

In turn, mental concepts are common in four ways only, corresponding to the first four ways of universality peculiar to spoken (and written) terms, since there are no universal concepts that correspond to demonstrative pronouns or equivocal terms as such (ibidem).

The fourth kind of general term deserves particular attention, since it is connected with Sharpe's solution to the question of the semantic and ontological status of terms of second intention like ‘individual’ or ‘singular. This was a highly controversial question in Oxford at the end of the 14th century. The most common explanation was that proposed by Robert Alyngton, a fellow of Queen's College in the 1380s. According to Alyngton, terms like ‘individual’ have to be considered singular expressions; more precisely they are "range-narrowed" expressions, like ‘this man’, because they identify a singular referent as a member of a given (manifested) set of individuals. In fact, a term like ‘individual’ presupposes a general concept (that of being), the range of which is narrowed to a unique object among beings by our act of intellect — to one object that is not common. Sharpe, however, argues that Alyngton's answer goes against linguistic usage as well as established fact: if Alyngton were right, then the following argument (which everybody will admit) would be formally incorrect:

man runs (homo currit)
and not the universal-man (et non homo communis)
therefore, an individual man runs (ergo homo singularis currit)

just like this one:

man runs (homo currit)
and not the universal-man (et non homo communis)
therefore, Socrates runs (ergo Sortes currit),

since the syntagm ‘an individual man’ (‘homo singularis’) would be a singular term standing precisely for one individual, e.g., ‘Socrates’ (‘Sortes’). Furthermore, it is a fact that anyone can understand the sentence ‘an individual man runs’ even without knowing the identity of the man who is running — which is required according to Alyngton's theory. Therefore, Sharpe regarded second intentions of this kind as common ones (ibid., pp. 132-33).

In this way, Sharpe admits that the nominalist explanation of the universality of signs holds in the particular context of second intentions, implicitly rejecting Alyngton's reduction of epistemology to ontology, since according to Sharpe's account the former has its own range and rules partially independent of the latter. Furthermore, he restores the semantic rank that intuitively would be assigned to the ‘individual’-like terms (something Alyngton was unable to do). On the other hand, his defence of realism on the problem of universals is partially invalidated by his qualified acceptance of the nominalist principle of the autonomy of thought in relation to the world. In fact, it is evident that from a semantic and/or epistemological point of view, he can no longer justify the extra-mental reality of universals.

Like Burley, Sharpe's semantics lists a third kind of expression between simple and complex expressions: concrete accidental terms (like ‘white’ or ‘father’), whose significata are neither simple nor complex objects but something in between. He affirms that concrete accidental terms do not signify simple objects but aggregates composed of a substance and an accidental form. Such aggregates are lacking in numerical unity, and hence do not fall into any of the ten categories, because they are not properly beings (entia). For that reason concrete accidental terms, although simple expressions from a merely grammatical point of view, are not names. The two metaphysical components of such aggregates (i.e., substance and accidental form) are related to the concrete accidental term as follows: although the concrete accidental term connotes the accidental form, this is not its direct significatum, so that the concrete accidental term can supposit for the substance only. In other words, the concrete accidental terms label substances by means of the accidental forms from which they draw their names, so that they name substances only qua bearers (subiecta) of a form. This fact accounts for the difference between general names in the category of substance (like ‘man’) and concrete accidental terms. General names in the category of substance are concrete terms as well, but the form they primarily signify is really identical with the substances they label. Therefore, in this case, the name itself of the form can be used as a name of the substance. This obviously implies a slight difference in meaning between abstract and concrete substantial terms, such as ‘humanity’ (‘humanitas’) and ‘man’ (‘homo’). While ‘humanity’ is not the name of the form considered in its totality, but rather the name only of the essential principle of the form, that is, of the intensional content carried by the term ‘man’, this latter term signifies the substantial form considered as a constitutive element of the reality (esse) of a certain set of individual substances that instantiate it. As a consequence, according to Sharpe, ‘man is humanity’ (‘homo est humanitas’) is a well formed and true sentence, since both subject and predicate signify the same entity, but ‘white is whiteness' (‘album est albedo’) is not, since ‘white’ does not directly signify the accidental form, but only the substrate in which it inheres, as bearer of that form, and therefore ‘white’ cannot stand for such a form in any sentence (ibid., pp. 71-73).

3. Universals and Predication

The core of Sharpe's metaphysics lies in his theory of universals. He is a realist, since he defends the extra-mental existence of universals (ibid., p. 68), but he is open to nominalism, as he thinks that there is not a close correspondence between the elements and structures of language and elements and structures of the world. His approach to the whole matter can be defined as "analytical," since he seems to believe that (i) any ontology has to be built up in relation to the resolution of semantic problems, (ii) any philosophical explanation of reality has to be preceded by a semantic explanation of the function of our language.

Sharpe wrote the most interesting treatise on universals of the late Middle Ages other than those of Wyclif and Paul of Venice, arguing about logic and metaphysics, explaining his positions on being and essence, universals, singulars, predication, identity and distinction, and truth and falsity. His tract is very similar to that of Paul of Venice with regard to many metaphysical theses supported, the structure of the work, the textual material utilized, and the opinions discussed. In his Quaestio super universalia Sharpe lists eight opinions on universals (Buridan, Ockham, Auriol, Albert the Great and Giles of Rome, Plato, Duns Scotus, Burley, and Wyclif) and so does Paul of Venice in his Quaestio de universalibus (Ockham, Thomas Aquinas and Giles of Rome, Auriol, Burley, Wyclif, Plato, and two other unidentified realist authors). Yet, there are some noteworthy doctrinal differences between them and the other Oxford realists, which testify to Sharpe's (and Paul of Venice's) independence of thought.

The starting point of Sharpe's theory of universals and predication (as well as identity and distinction) is the theory worked out by Wyclif and some of his Oxford successors, such as Alyngton and Penbygull. Like Duns Scotus and Walter Burley, Wyclif held that universals in re (or formal universals) exist outside our minds in actu and not in potentia, as moderate realists thought. On the other hand, unlike Burley, he maintained that they are really identical with their own individuals, thus accepting the very core of the traditional realist account of the relationship between universals and individuals. According to Wyclif, since (1) universals and individuals share the same empirical reality, which is that of individuals, but (2) have opposite constituent principles, when properly considered as universals and individuals, they are really the same but formally distinct. On his view, because of this formal distinction, not everything predicable of individuals can be directly predicated of universals and vice versa, although an indirect predication is always possible. As a consequence, Wyclif distinguished three main non-mutually exclusive types of predication (which he conceives as a real relation holding between metaphysical entities), each more general than the preceding one (or ones). In the Tractatus de universalibus they are the following: formal predication, predication by essence, and habitudinal predication (see the entry on Wyclif, §2.3). Since habitudinal predication does not require any kind of identity between the entity signified by the subject-term and the entity signified by the predicate-term, but formal predication and essential predication do, the ontological presuppositions of the most general type of predication, implied by the other types, are completely different from those of the other two.

The final result of this way of approaching the problem of universals was a system of intensional logic where (1) the copula of (almost) any standard (philosophical) proposition, such as ‘Socrates is white’ or ‘man is an animal’, has to be interpreted in terms of degrees of identity between the things signified by the subject-term and the predicate-term; and (2) individuals and universals, considered qua beings, appear to be a sort of hypostatization of intensions, since they are what is signified by proper and common nouns respectively.

Sharpe shares the metaphysical view and principles of Wyclif's philosophical system. His position on the problem of universals can be summed up as follows.

  1. We can count the following entities as universal: (1.1) those causes that have a multiplicity of effects; (1.2) ideas in God; (1.3) the universal quantifier (syncategorema universaliter distributivum); (1.4) universal propositions, both affirmative and negative; (1.5) universal forms, or real universals ; and (1.6) universal signs, both mental and spoken (or written)(QsU., pp. 49-50).
  2. Real universals are naturally apt to be present in many things as their main metaphysical components.
  3. Real universals exist in actu outside the mind, since their being is the same as the being of individuals, which is actual.
  4. Mental universals are partially caused in our mind by the common natures existing outside.

As the being of real universals coincides with the being of their corresponding individuals, real universals can be said to be everlasting because of the continuous succession of their individuals, and also really identical with them. But universals and individuals are also formally different from each other, as they have distinct constitutive formal principles, and therefore different properties (ibid., pp. 91-92). The most important among universal signs are mental universals, which are both the acts of intellection through which our mind grasps the nature of universal forms and the concepts through which it connects general names with the things to which they refer (ibid., pp. 68-69).

The description of the relationship between universals and individuals in terms of real identity and formal distinction entails (i) that not all that is predicated of individuals can be directly (formaliter) attributed to their universals and vice versa, but (ii) that all that is predicated of individuals has to be in some way or another attributed to universals and vice versa. Therefore, a redefinition of the standard kinds of predication was required.

Like Alyngton, Penbygull, Tarteys, and Whelpdale, Sharpe modifies Wyclif's theory. Agreeing with Alyngton, but against the others, he divides real predication into formal predication (praedicatio formalis) and predication by essence (praedicatio essentialis vel secundum essentiam), removing habitudinal predication, as it is not homogeneous with the first two. According to him, predication by essence (1) shows a partial identity between the subject-thing and the predicate-thing, which share some metaphysical component parts, and (2.1) does not require (or even (2.2) excludes) that the form connoted by the predicate-term is directly present in the essence signified by the subject-term. ‘(What is) singular is (what is) universal’ (‘singulare est universale’) is an instance of predication by essence. Formal predication, on the contrary, requires such a direct presence. ‘Man is an animal’ and ‘man is white’ are instances of formal predication (ibid., pp. 89-91).

As is evident from his formulations, Sharpe does not explicitly divide formal predication into formal essential and formal accidental predication, and offers two different readings of the distinction between formal predication and predication by essence. According to the common view, predication by essence is more general than formal predication. As a consequence, in the standard theory of the Oxford realists, formal predication is a sub-type of predication by essence. Sharpe introduces another interpretation, according to which the two kinds of predication at issue are complementary and mutually exclusive. This happens when predication by essence excludes the the form connoted by the predicate-term being directly present in the essence signified by the subject-term (ibid., p. 91). Although, according to the latter reading, formal predication is not a kind of predication by essence, this reading nevertheless implies an interpretation of the ‘is’ of predication in terms of identity and, therefore, a new definition of the pair of antonymous notions of identity and difference (or distinction).

4. Identity, Distinction, and Individuation

Sharpe's theory of identity and distinction combines in an original way those of Duns Scotus, Wyclif, and Penbygull.

Penbygull (De universalibus, pp. 189-90) had (1) distinguished between the notion of non-identity and that of difference (or distinction); (2) denied that the notion of difference implies that of non-identity; (3) affirmed that the two notions of difference and real identity are logically compatible, thus admitting that (3.1) there are degrees in distinction, and (3.2) that the degrees of distinction between two things can be read as the inverse measure of their (partial) identity; and (4) suggested the following definitions for these three notions, that is non-identity, difference (or distinction), and (absolute) identity: (4.1) an entity a is non-identical with an entity b if and only if there is not any form F such that F is present in the same way in a and b; (4.2) an entity a differs from an entity b if and only if there is at least a form F such that F is directly present in a but not in b, or vice versa; (4.3) an entity a is absolutely identical with an entity b if and only if for any form F, it is the case that F is present in a if and only if it is present in the same way in b (see the entry on William Penbygull, §3).

Like Penbygull, Sharpe considers identity and distinction (or difference) as the two possible inverse measures of the coincidence of the metaphysical components of two given entities (QsU., p. 92). Moreover, he speaks of formal and real (or essential) identity, and formal and real (or essential) distinction (or difference), and states that formal identity is stronger than real (or essential) identity, since the former entails the latter, while, on the contrary, real difference is stronger than formal distinction, since the latter is entailed by the former (ibid., pp. 91-92).

Finally, he admits degrees in formal distinction, as he recognizes two different types, the first of which comes very close to that proposed by Scotus in his Ordinatio, while the second is drawn from Wyclif's Tractatus de universalibus (ch. 4, pp. 90-92). The first type of formal distinction holds among things such as the intellective faculties of the soul, whereas the second holds between such things as the essence of the soul and its intellective faculties and a species and its individuals (Quaestio super libros De anima, q. 2, fol. 236r-v).

The two different sets of conditions for the formal distinction can be formalized as follows:

  1. two entities x and y are formally distinct if and only if (i) both of them are constitutive elements of the same reality, but (ii) neither of them can exist by itself, or (iii) is part of the definite description of the other.
  2. two entities x and y are formally distinct if and only if (i) there is at least one z such that z is predicated of x and not of y, or vice versa, but (ii) x and y are really identical, as one is directly predicated of the other qua its main intrinsic metaphysical component.

Accordingly, real identity, which is presupposed by the formal distinction, has to be defined in these terms (QsU, p. 98):

a is really identical with b if and only if both are constitutive elements, or material parts, of the same reality, or one of them is directly predicated of the other qua its superior in the categorial line (that is, qua its main intrinsic metaphysical component).

As a result, Sharpe's world consists of finite beings (that is, “things” like men, horses, stones etc.), really existing outside the mind, made up of an individual substance and a host of formal entities (common substantial natures and accidental forms, both universal and singular) existing in it and through it, since none of these formal entities can exist by themselves. They are real only insofar as they constitute individual substances or are present in individual substances qua their properties. Specific substantial natures (or essences) can be conceived from two points of view: intensionally (in abstracto) and extensionally (in concreto). Viewed intensionally, specific substantial natures are nothing but the set of essential properties that individual substances are to instantiate, but considered without any reference to such instantiations. Viewed extensionally, specific substantial natures are those same forms conceived of as instantiated by at least one singular substance. For instance, human nature considered intensionally is humanity (humanitas), extensionally the universal-man (homo in communi). Humanity is properly a form, or more accurately, the essential principle of a substantial form, that is, something existentially incomplete and dependent; the universal-man is this same form considered according to its own mode of being, and therefore as a sort of existentially autonomous and independent entity (ibid., p 102). Consequently, like Wyclif, Sharpe holds that a formal universal actually exists outside the mind if at least one individual instantiates it, so that without individuals, common natures (or essences) are not really universals (ibid., pp. 105-06). This means that the relationship between common natures and singulars is ultimately based on individuation, since no actual universality and no instantiation is possible without individuation. On this subject Sharpe seems to accept the essentials of Aquinas’ doctrine, since he affirms that (i) the universal-man is compounded of both common matter and form and that (ii) matter as affected by dimensive quantity and other accidental properties (materia quanta et accidentibus substrata) is the very principle of individuation, since it causes the passage from the level of universals to that of singulars (ibid., pp. 137-39). Thus, according to Sharpe, explaining individuation means explaining how a multiplicity of individuals can be obtained from a single specific nature, the problem at issue being the dialectical development from one to many and not the passage from abstract to concrete.

Sharpe's world counts many types of entities: universal and individual substances and accidents (like homo in communi and Socrates, and like the general form of whiteness and this particular form of whiteness), universal abstract substantial essences (like humanity), universal and individual substantial forms (like the human soul in general and the soul of Socrates), general and individual differences (like the universal-rationality and the rationality proper to Socrates) - each one characterized by its own mode of being. This world is certainly very complex, but its complexity is exceeded by complexity in language. Sharpe denies that there is a close correspondence between language and the world, as he believes that our thought is caused by the world, and our language by our thought, and the relation between causes and effects is a relation of one to many.

Psychology and Theory of Knowledge

The sources of Sharpe's psychological and epistemological theories are St. Thomas, Duns Scotus, and Ockham, although the latter is chiefly a polemical source, as Kennedy 1969 pointed out (pp. 253 and 270). Like Aquinas, Sharpe

Like Duns Scotus, Sharpe thinks there is not a real distinction between the soul and its intellective faculties (i.e., the active intellect, the passive intellect, and the will) or among the intellective faculties themselves, but only a formal distinction. On the other hand, the soul's corporeal powers (potentiae incorporatae), which depend on bodily organs for their operations, are really distinct from the soul and from each other (ibid., fol. 236v).

Like Aquinas and Duns Scotus, and against Ockham, Sharpe affirms that intelligible species are required for intellection (ibid., fol. 244r). The main arguments he uses in favor of this thesis are the following:

  1. Our mind's objects of intellection are the universal essences or common natures. But they cannot be present themselves to the mind. Therefore, some sign of them, that is, the intelligible species, has to be directly present in the intellect.
  2. A universal principle of intellection is necessary in order to understand a universal object, like a common nature. The phantasm is particular, since it is the mental representation of a singular object. Therefore a universal species, abstracted from the phantasm, is required.
  3. If there were no species, nothing would be retained by the intellect after an act of intellection. Therefore we could not understand each other, or understand more easily the second time, since there would be no objects for our memory (ibid., fols. 239v-240v).

Finally, like Duns Scotus and Ockham, and against St. Thomas, Sharpe states that our intellect can know perfectly even individual material things (ibid., fol. 253r). What is more, it can know immaterial beings as well, since the most general and proper object of our intellect is being in all its amplitude (ibid., fol. 253v). Sharpe here distinguishes perfect knowledge from complete knowledge. For a perfect knowledge of something it is sufficient that our intellect is able to single out the object in question against others by means of a proper concept. For a complete knowledge of something it is necessary that our intellect is able to list all the properties, both substantial and accidental, of the object at issue. It is therefore evident that we can have a perfect knowledge of something without completely knowing it, as is the case with individual material things and immaterial beings (ibid., fol. 254r-v).


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Alyngton, Robert | Burley [Burleigh], Walter | Duns Scotus, John | medieval philosophy | Paul of Venice | Penbygull, William | universals: the medieval problem of | Wyclif, John