Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Emmanuel Levinas

1. Levinas will call the face-to-face relationship “metaphysical.” He does this repeatedly in Totality and Infinity. Cf. Totality and Infinity, Loc. cit., p. 84. There, he writes, “we have called this relation metaphysical. It is premature and…insufficient to qualify it, by opposition to negativity, as positive. It would be false to qualify it as theological.” By metaphysics, Levinas means an event that repeats in the everyday, but is not reducible to the existence conceived phenomenologically as the object of intentional aiming or representation. This resistance to representation is due to the curious time structure of the encounter called the face-to-face. It comes to pass in an instant that ‘interrupts’ intentional consciousness, in its alone or solipsistic quality. Thus, “meta-physical” is approached in light of the phenomenology of consciousness and its ‘temporality’, but not in terms of a first or highest being or cause.

2. A recent work that has focused on the meaning of sensibility in Levinas, and the relationship between sensibility and Husserl's phenomenology  is John Drabinski's Sensibility and Singularity: The Problem of Phenomenology in Levinas (Albany, NY: State University of New York Press, 2001), see esp. Chapts. IV and V.

3. Jacques Derrida, “Violence and Metaphysics” in Writing and Difference, trans. Alan Bass (Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press, 1980; first published in 1967), pp. 79-153. This essay on Levinas remains unsurpassed in its analytic acuity. Derrida writes, “It is true that Ethics in Levinas's sense is an Ethics without law and without concept, which maintains its non-violent purity only before being determined as concepts and laws. This is not an objection: let us not forget that Levinas does not seek to propose…moral rules, does not seek to determine a morality, but rather the essence of the ethical relation in general…in question, then, is an Ethics of Ethics [which]…can occasion neither a determined ethics nor determined laws without negating and forgetting itself” (p. 111; French, p. 164). Levinas addresses Derrida's observation in Otherwise than Being or Beyond Essence, Op. cit. (1974).

4. “Intentionality” was a term first used by Franz Brentano to characterize consciousness as a sheer activity of aiming, directing itself toward objects or to its own unfolding. Husserl will make of intentionality the theater of consciousness in which all things appear. The metaphor of a theater is fitting, because the action of positing a determinate subject versus an object qua object, requires an additional act of conscious determination (i.e., of abstraction from immediate, lived experience, or again re-presentation). Following Aristotle's observation, ‘the soul is in some sense all things’, Husserl describes consciousness in its unfolding dynamism prior to determinations like subjective event, psychological mood, objective entity, etc. Examining the phenomenological description, it is possible to identify an ego pole and an object pole in all our intentional aimings. But the dualism subject-object is situated, as a result, within the activity of the intentional consciousness itself. The significant shift brought about by Brentano and Husserl is the descriptive dynamisation of consciousness, in certain points redolent of Hegel's phenomenology, but never governed by a dialectical logic.

5. “Transcendental phenomenology,” part of the subtitle of the Meditations (“Introduction to Transcendental Phenomenology”), was rendered necessary by the imperative of describing the unity of intentional objects for a consciousness that evinced the characteristics of “flow” and “mineness.” This unity, which Husserl called the “transcendental ego” was not the product of a schematism in Kant's sense, nor was it the particularization of some larger mind or Geist. Without specific contents other than a unified dynamism and the quality of being for-me, the transcendental ego answers the question: what is it that makes possible the accessibility, to me, of “the whole stream of my experiencing life.” (See Husserl, Cartesian Meditations: An Introduction to Transcendental Phenomenology, trans., Dorian Cairns, [Dordrecht and Boston: Martinus Nijhoff, 1960], section 8, p. 19.) To this, Husserl adds: “Reflecting, I can at anytime look at this original living and note particulars; I can grasp what is present as present, what is past as past, each as itself” (Ibid.). The transcendental ego contains all the experiences of the subject in the world, all its memories, and their modes of being given. However, that these present themselves as belonging to ‘me’ as ‘my’ psychic life, argues for the primacy of ego over its diverse worlds and, as Husserl insists, opens access to “the pure stream of my cogitationes,” which requires making a transcendental shift toward the form of psychic life as flow and unity.

6. “Martin Heidegger et l'ontologie” first appeared in the Revue philosophique, in 1932. It was reprinted in abridged form in Levinas, En découvrant l'existence avec Husserl et Heidegger (Paris: Vrin, 1949, 1967), pp. 53-76.

7. First published in the Revue Philosophique, January-February, 1940; reprinted in En découvrant l'existence, Op. cit., pp. 7-52. For the English translation see ed., Richard A. Cohen, Discovering Existence with Husserl (Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1998).

8. Note Levinas's makes the striking remark, at the end of his Theory of Intuition in Husserl's Phenomenology: “Only M. Heidegger dares to confront deliberately this problem, considered impossible by all of traditional philosophy, the problem that has for its object the meaning of the existence of Being…and we believe we are entitled to take our inspiration from him” (cf. French edition, p. 218). Some of the seminars of Heidegger from before Being and Time are now available in English. Levinas would have had a familiarity with them. Note Heidegger's Phenomenological Interpretations of Aristotle: Initiation into Phenomenological Research (from the seminar of 1921), trans. Richard Rojcewicz (Bloomington and Indianapolis, Ind.: Indiana University Press, 2001) and Heidegger, Ontology: The Hermeneutics of Facticity, trans. John Van Buren (Bloomington and Indianapolis, IN: Indiana University Press, 1999 [seminar of 1923]).

9. According to Husserl's phenomenology, intentionality means that all consciousness is consciousness-of something. In the beginning is the relationship between intending act, and object intended. This event is a unity. It can be analyzed into the act of intentional aiming and the object constituted in that aiming. Whether it is a question of a sensation, a perceived entity, a memory, or an abstract ideality (e.g., a mathematical equation), the object and the intention harmonize in the mode in which they are approached, and given, respectively.

10. Some of these remarks were inspired by Robert Bernasconi's lectures in the Seminar, Thinking Through the Difference between Immanence and Transcendence: Levinas, Bergson, and Deleuze, Collegium Phaenomenologicum, Città di Castello, Umbria, Italy, July 14th to August 1st, 2003. Reworked and published as “No Exit: Levinas' Aporetic Account of Transcendence” in John Sallis (ed.), Research In Phenomenology, Vol. XXXV, 2005 (Leiden, Netherlands: Brill Academic Publishers, 2005), pp. 101-17.

11. Levinas, On Escape/De l'évasion, trans., B. Bergo (Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2003), p. 55.

12. See Heidegger, Being and Time, Parag. 38 “Falling and Thrownness,” in trans., John Maquarrie and Edward Robinson, (New York, NY: Harper and Row Publishers, 1962; translation of the Seventh Edition of Sein und Zeit, [Tübingen: Neomarius Verlag]), pp. 219-224.

13. Martin Heidegger, The Basic Problems of Phenomenology, trans., Albert Hofstadter (Bloomington and Indianapolis, IN: Indiana University Press, 1982). This volume, worked out between 1926 and 1927, was conceived originally as part of the plan for Being and Time, specifically the intended Division 3 of Part 1 supposed to be entitled “Time and Being.” Along with Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics (1925-1926), the work sketches Heidegger's early departure from Husserl's phenomenology, though it retains for transcendence the priority of Dasein's being-in-the-world.

14. What Levinas calls the fait accompli of contemporary bourgeois culture.

15. Other affective ‘modes’ by which we posit ourselves include shame and nausea. Shame, for Levinas, expresses the inability to make others forget that we are naked in our flesh. It is an early version of being “too tight in our skin.” Like pleasure, shame is a prima facie relational mode of positing. I am ashamed before another. In nausea, the gap between the being that we are, and the being of the world, narrows to the point of volatilization. Unlike anxiety, which figured so prominently in the early Heidegger, nausea comes from within, closes in on us from all sides, and leaves us “scandalized” by our own condition.

16. Possibly with insights gained with his teacher Maurice Pradines, in Strasbourg, who was given to speak of the “spirituality of sensation.” Pradines also exercised an influence on Maurice Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology. See Maurice Pradines, Philosophie de la Sensation, Vol. I “Le Problème de la sensation” (Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 1928); Vol. II “La Sensibilité élémentaire” (Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 1932). Also see Marie-Anne Lescourret, Emmanuel Levinas (Paris: Flammarion, 1994), pp. 56-63.

17. See supra, notes 4 and 5.

18. Emmanuel Levinas, “The Name of a Dog, or Natural Rights,” in Difficult Freedom : Essays on Judaism, trans., Seán Hand (Baltimore, MD.: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1990, 1997), p. 153.

19. For him, work is effort. In effort, the body is “simultaneously, transcendence, organ, and obstacle.” Just as it was for Maine de Biran. See Levinas, “A priori et subjectivité” in En découvrant l'existence avec Husserl et Heidegger, (Paris, J. Vrin: 1949, 1982, 2nd edition), p.186. Translated into English by Richard A. Cohen, as Discovering Existence with Husserl.

20. Cf. Supra, note 4. As Husserl put it: “In perceiving proper, as an attentive perceiving, I am turned toward the object, for instance, the sheet of paper; I seize upon it as this existent here and now. The seizing-upon is a singling out and seizing; [moreover,] anything perceived has [also] an experiential background” E. Husserl, Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophical, I, trans., F. Kersten (Dordrecht and Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1982), Section 35, p. 70. This activity is the essence of intentionality. The object seized upon is characterized as the intuition. The experiential background, consisting of other objects, will be called “background-intuitions” and later, one type of intentional horizon.

21. “Phenomenological bracketing,” which Husserl also called the phenomenological épochè, thus adapting a technique from the Skeptics, means, simply, temporarily setting aside judgments learned through culture, including all the sciences. Such judgments would concern degrees of objectivity, causal inferences, even distinctions noted earlier, like that between subjects and objects, inside and outside, reality and possibility, etc. The result of a phenomenological bracketing is the display of experience as spectacle, like a vast “theater of consciousness” in which observer and spectacle are originally one.

22. The proposed jury included his friend and mentor, Jean Wahl, and Maurice Merleau-Ponty (who collapsed before the time of Levinas's defense). Wahl was well versed in Heidegger, Anglo-Saxon philosophy, and German Idealism. He had proposed an alternative reading of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit, in which the dynamic of the dialectic was as much impelled by the “unhappy consciousness” as by the “master-slave dialectic,” which  Alexandre Kojève had placed center-stage in his Nietzschean reading. Between the appearance of the middle works and Totality and Infinity, Levinas was also initiated into intensive study of the Talmud by an itinerant mathematician-talmudist, “Monsieur Shushani.” Shushani had been teaching Torah and Talmud since the 1930's in a synagogue on the rue Montevideo, an extraordinary dialectician versed in mathematics and physics, he is said to have “provided Levinas the grammar” underlying Jewish pride after Hitler. With him, Talmud-Torah prolonged humanist and rationalist tendencies already present in Levinas's approach to Judaism (Mittnagdism) and to the ethical core of the prophets' message. This approach, along with the ubiquitous influence of Franz Rosenzweig's Star of Redemption (1921) inflects the thinking of Levinas's 1961 work toward questions of ethics, justice, and the meaning of fraternity.

23. See Maurice Merleau-Ponty, “The Intertwining—The Chiasm” in The Visible and the Invisible: Followed by Working Notes, ed., Claude Lefort, trans., Alfonso Lingis (Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1968), esp. pp. 138-50.

24. Emmanuel Levinas, Otherwise than Being, or Beyond Essence, trans. Alphonso Lingis (Dordrecht and Boston, MA: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991; first published in French in 1974), pp. 99-129. Also see Robert Bernasconi, “What is the Question to which ‘Substitution’ is the Answer?” in eds., Simon Critchley and Robert Bernasconi, The Cambridge Companion to Levinas (London, UK and New York, NY: Cambridge University Press, 1998), pp. 234-51. See further Simon Critchley, “The Original Traumatism: Levinas and Psychoanalysis,” in Ethics Politics Subjectivity: Essays on Derrida, Levinas and Contemporary French Thought (London, UK: Verso, 1999), pp. 183-197.

25. This theme was already broached in On Escape and in essays on Husserl—“L'Œuvre d'Edmond Husserl” (1940); “Intentionalité et métaphysique” (1959); “Intentionalité et sensation” (1965). See En découvrant l'existence avec Husserl et Heidegger, Op. cit., p.186. In English, Discovering Existence with Husserl, Op. cit. See note 19 supra.

26. Despite the fact that this distinction invariably finds its way into his language, because all language is locative and temporalizing. For Levinas's remarks about faithfulness to Husserl's phenomenology, see, for example, OBBE, pp. 31, 183. “Our analyses claim to be in the spirit of Husserlian philosophy…it [our presentation] remains faithful to intentional analysis, insofar as it signifies the locating of notions in the horizon of their appearing.” However, Levinas insists that, against Husserlian eidetics (reduction of intentional objects to their essences), “truth is in several times, here again like breathing, a diachrony without synthesis.”  For that reason, “the present [work] ventures beyond phenomenology.” (OBBE, 183).

27. This “ego,” while its definition is modified over the course of Husserl's work, is characterized by the passive synthesis of time's unity and flow (as continuous slipping back of events, whose position in lived time remains determinable). See supra, notes 4 and 5.

28. Other influences abound in this work, from his Strasbourg professor of psychology and philosophy, M. Pradines, to Henri Bergson's descriptions of “duration,” to Maurice Merleau-Ponty's chiasm of layered sensibility (exemplified in the lived experience of two hands clasping each other).

29. See notably Husserl's lectures on the phenomenology of the consciousness of internal time in Husserliana X. Zur Phänomenologie des inneren Zeitbewusstseins (1893-1917), Rudolf Boehm, ed., (The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1969, Second Edition). In English, On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time, trans., John Barnett Brough (Dordrecht and Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991).

30. For extensive discussion of Jewish philosophy in light of Levinas's project, see Shmuel Trigano “Levinas et le projet de la philosophie-juive” in Rue Descartes (Collège International de Philosophie) Vol. 19, February 1998 (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France), pp. 141-164; present citations, p. 145-46.

31. See Trigano, Op. cit., p. 145.

32. See Derrida's remarks on a double reading of Levinas in eds., Robert Bernasconi and Simon Critchley, Re-Reading Levinas (Bloomington and Indianapolis, IN.: Indiana University Press, 1991).

33. See Levinas “Paix et Proximité” in Cahiers de la nuit surveillée, ed., Jacques Rolland (Paris: Editions Verdier, 1984), p. 346. In English, see Levinas, “Peace and Proximity,” trans., Peter Atterton and Simon Critchley, in Adrian Peperzak, Simon Critchley, and Robert Bernasconi (eds.), Emmanuel Levinas: Basic Philosophical Writings (Bloomington and Indianapolis, IN: University of Indiana Press, 1996), p. 169.

34. As Cohen put it in his 1913 lectures on religion within the system of philosophy [Der Begriff der Religion im System der Philosophie], the emergence of ideas, that is, humans' emancipation from the purely empirical, begins as ethical thought. “We find again the same orientation of the primary force of thought,” says Cohen, “the abandonment of perception and its object constituted by empirical man: for the prophet, this [abandonment] is the ascent toward humanity; for the Greek, this abandonment amounts to the passage toward the state.”

35. See Levinas, « Messianic Texts » in Difficult Freedom: Essays on Judaism, trans., Seán Hand, (Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1997, first published in 1963), pp. 59-96.