Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Indexicals

1. Kaplan 1989a attributes to Michael Bennett the observation that some uses of ‘here’ are demonstrative, and seemingly do not refer to locations that surround the location of the speaker, as when a person points at a map and says ‘Next week, I'll be here’.

2. Smith 1989 says that some uses of ‘now’ do not refer to a time interval that includes the moment of utterance. For instance, when narrating the life of George Washington, one might say ‘Washington now needed to get across the Delaware River’. For further discussion of ‘here’ and ‘now’, including discussion of cases like Smith's and cases involving recorded messages, such as ‘I am not here now’, see Vision 1985; Salmon 1991; Predelli 1998a, 1998b; Corazza et al. 2002; Romdenh-Romluc 2002; and Atkin 2006.

3. Kaplan's wrote "Demonstratives" (Kaplan 1989a) in the 1970's and circulated it informally for many years before publishing it together with his "Afterthoughts" (Kaplan 1989b), which was written considerably later.

4. We are here following Kaplan's (1989a, 1989b) informal presentations of his theory, in which he identifies contents with individuals, properties, relations, and structured propositions. When Kaplan (1989a) turns to more technical matters, he represents these contents with intensions, which are functions from pairs of worlds and times to extensions. For details, see below, and see Kaplan 1989a and Forbes 1989, 2003.

5. Sometimes Kaplan (1989a) describes an expression's character as being a rule for associating contents of the expression with contexts. In his more technical presentations, Kaplan (1989a) seems to identify the character of an expression with a function different from that described in the main text. See Braun 1995.

6. Two points: (i) Kaplan tends to restrict application of the term ‘directly referential’ to singular terms. (ii) Kaplan (1989a) holds that the notion of direct reference can be defined without appeal to the notion of a singular proposition, but he does not explicitly provide any such definition.

7. In fact, it is somewhat difficult to determine exactly how Kripke (1980) wishes to define ‘rigid designator’. For discussion, see Kaplan 1989a, 1989b and Salmon 1981.

8. We can define what it is for an indexical to be a rigid designator, but we must first modify Kripke's original definition of ‘rigid designator’ so that it can be extended to context-sensitive expressions. We first need to assume (or define) the notion singular term D refers to object o with respect to context c and world w. Then the following definition of ‘rigid designator’ is adequate, if we restrict our attention to singular terms. D is a rigid designator iff: for all contexts c and all worlds w and w*, if D refers to object o with respect to c and w, then D refers to object o with respect to c and w*. Kaplan could then be construed as saying that all (simple, singular term) indexicals are rigid designators.

9. The individual constants of Kaplan's system are 0-place individual functors. As I mentioned above, Kaplan uses intensions to represent contents when he is ignoring the fine-grained details of contents, as he does when he presents his logic for indexicals. It is possible to construct a Kaplan-style logic in which LD-like structures assign attributes to predicates and individuals to constants. But such structures would have to include additional functions that assign extensions to attributes and individuals with respect to possible worlds. See Salmon 1986 for a logic of this sort.

10. Not all criticisms of Kaplan's theory concern belief and cognitive significance. As mentioned in section 2, various philosophers disagree with Kaplan's account of reference-fixing for demonstratives. Salmon (1989) criticizes the theory's assumption that propositions can vary in truth value from time to time. Braun (1995) criticizes the theory's (apparent) identification of character with an extensional function. Braun (1996) criticizes the theory's handling of multiple occurrences of demonstratives (see section 5.2 below). Perry (1997, 2001) objects to Kaplan's focus on expressions rather than utterances. Salmon (2002) criticizes Kaplan's theory of true demonstratives. Bach (2005) claims, contrary to Kaplan, that true demonstratives do not refer with respect to contexts: rather, speakers use demonstratives to refer to objects.

11. Stalnaker's theory of indexical belief (Stalnaker 1981) relies heavily on a technical apparatus that is too elaborate to present here. But it is similar to Schiffer's, Chisholm's and Lewis's theories in one respect: it tries to "reduce" indexical belief to a more restricted class of "singular belief". In particular, Stalnaker tries to reduce indexical belief to belief in propositions about particular utterances or thinking-events. If u is Fred's utterance of (13), then Stalnaker would say that Fred's utterance expresses his belief in (very roughly) the proposition that the person who utters u is addressing exactly one person, who is wearing a business suit, and viewing exactly one person through a mirror, who is not. See Stalnaker 1981 for details, and Austin 1990 for critical discussion.

12. We are ignoring here any difficulties raised by contexts in which ‘that’ fails to refer.