Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Ibn Bajja

Sources for Ibn Bajja's Bibliography

The sources for his biography are few and short; the longest notice was written by a foe, Abû Nasr al-Fath Ibn Muhammad Ibn Khaqân (d. 1134?) in a poetry anthology (1966, pp. 346-353).

According to Ibn Khaqân, Avempace “investigated the celestial bodies, the boundaries of the earth climates and rejected the Book of Allâh”. He did not believe in the resurrection, affirmed the eternity of time, and that man is a plant; he had fun playing music. Al-Fath reproduces various poems of Avempace[1], one is a long panegyric to the Almoravid Prince Abû Bakr ibn Ibrâhîm as-Sahrawî better known as Ibn Tîfilwît “governor of the frontier and of the West [of al-Andalus]”. M. Asín Palacios (1900) and Nemesio Morata (1924) already doubted the truth of Ibn Khaqân's accusations against Ibn Bajja whom he had praised in former times.

Another source of information are three letters of Ibn Sîd al-Batalyawsî (d. 1127) mentioned by N. Morata (1924) in the Escorial manuscript 488, ff. 35vº-37rº in which he complains about the arrogant behavior of Ibn Bajja. They have been published by H. Mu’nis (2000, 34-37). Further D.M. Dunlop (1957, pp. 188-196) described the notice on Ibn Bajja written by a contemporary of Avempace called Ibn Bashrûn in his work al-Mukhtâr min an-nazr wa-n-nathr and transmitted by Sibt, Ibn al-Jawzî (d. 1257) in Mir’at az-zamân (1952, pp. 172-173).

The notice is full of praise for Avempace who authored books on mathematics, logic and geometry. The text observes that Avempace was, for 20 years, a vizier in the service of Yahyà ibn Yûsuf Ibn Tashfîn and that he was a victim of envious physicians who poisoned him. Ibn Bashrûn says that Avempace died in 533/1139, but he does not say how old he was.

Later biographies are based on these two authors. ‛Imâd ad-Dîn Kâtib al-Isfahânî (1125-1201) mentions Ibn Bashrûn as his source (1971, nº 94, pp. 332-334). The notice in Ibn al-Qiftî (d. 1248) is very short: it praises Avempace; says that he was vizier of Yahyà ibn Tâshfîn and that he was poisoned by envious physicians. Ibn al-Qiftî claims that al-Fath ibn Khaqân had asked Avempace for his poetry to include it in the anthology, and that he fooled Avempace, because he used it to make a negative entry of him (1903), p. 406).

Ibn Abû ‛Usaybi‛a (d. 1269/70) remarks that Avempace died “young” and includes a list of his works; his biography is in very positive tones (1886, p. 62-64; 2001, pp. 271-277). Ibn Khallikân (1211-1282) gives the month of his death as Ramadan 533/ May 1139 and adds that “it is said that he died in 535 poisoned with an eggplant in Fez” (1998, nº 670, pp. 222-225). Ibn Khallikân mentions also that “Bajja in the language of the Francs of the West means silver”, and the meaning can be related to Sâ’igh, “silversmith” as his Arabic surname was “son of the silversmith”. There is however the Latin term pacta “bride”, in Arabic ‛arûs, with a similar sound because ct becomes ch in Romance, and Ibn ‛Arûs was a frequent surname, or nisba.

Lisân ad-Dîn Ibn al-Khatîb (d. 1374) referenced Avempace in his entry on the Almoravid amir Abû Bakr as-Sahrâwî, Ibn Tîfilwît (1958, pp. 412-417), the protector of Avempace; and Ahmad al-Maqqarî (d. 1631)[2] drew on Ibn Khaqân as well as on Lisân ad-Dîn Ibn al-Khatîb. There also a few references in the manuscripts about Avempace's works.