Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

Proof of Hume's Principle from Basic Law V — Grundgesetze-Style

[Note: We use εF to denote the extension of the concept F.]

Let P,Q be arbitrarily chosen concepts. We want to show:

#P = #QPQ

(→) Assume #P = #Q (to show: PQ). Note that since PP (this is Fact 2 in the subsection on Equinumerosity), we know by the previous Lemma that εP ∈ #P. But then, by identity substitution, εP ∈ #Q. So, by our previous Lemma, PQ.

(←) Assume PQ (to show: #P = #Q). By definition of #, we have to show εP = εQ. So, by Basic Law V, we have to show ∀x(PxQx). We pick an arbitrary object b (to show: PbQb).

(→) Assume Pb. Then, by definition of P and λ-Conversion, ∃H(b = εH & HP). Let R be an arbitrary such concept; so b = εR & RP. From the second conjunct and our initial hypothesis, it follows (by the transitivity of equinumerosity) that RQ. So, reassembling what we know, it follows that b = εR & RQ. By existential generalization, it follows that ∃H(b = εH & HQ). So by λ-Conversion,
xH(x = εH & HQ)]b

It follows from this, by definition, that Qb.

(←) (Exercise)