Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

Proof of the Lemma for Hume's Principle

[Note: We use εF to denote the extension of the concept F.]

Let P,Q be arbitrarily chosen concepts. We want to show:

εQ ∈ #PQP

So, by definition of #F, we have to show:

εQ ∈  εPQP

We prove this by appealing to the Law of Extensions, which yields the following Fact:

Fact: εQ ∈  εP ≡ PQ)

(→) Assume εQ ∈  εP (to show: QP). Then, by the above Fact, we know PQ), i.e.,

xH(x = εH & HP)](εQ)

By λ-conversion, this implies:

HQ = εH & HP)

Let R be such a concept:

εQ = εR & RP (1)

But, by Basic Law V, the first conjunct implies ∀x(QxRx). Since the material equivalence of two concepts implies their equinumerosity (this was noted as Fact 1 in the subsection on Equinumerosity in the main part of the entry), it follows that QR. So from this result and the second conjunct of (1), it follows that QP, by the transitivity of equinumerosity (Fact 4 in the subsection on Equinumerosity).

(←) Assume QP (to show: εQ ∈  εP). Then, by identity introduction, we know: εQ = εQ & QP. So, by existential generalization:

HQ = εH & HP)

And by λ-Conversion:

xH(x = εH & HP)](εQ)

So, by the Law of Extensions, εQ ∈  εP.