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Doctrine of Double Effect

First published Wed Jul 28, 2004; substantive revision Wed Sep 7, 2011

The doctrine (or principle) of double effect is often invoked to explain the permissibility of an action that causes a serious harm, such as the death of a human being, as a side effect of promoting some good end. It is claimed that sometimes it is permissible to cause such a harm as a side effect (or “double effect”) of bringing about a good result even though it would not be permissible to cause such a harm as a means to bringing about the same good end. This reasoning is summarized with the claim that sometimes it is permissible to bring about as a merely foreseen side effect a harmful event that it would be impermissible to bring about intentionally.

1. Formulations of the principle of double effect

Thomas Aquinas is credited with introducing the principle of double effect in his discussion of the permissibility of self-defense in the Summa Theologica (II-II, Qu. 64, Art.7). Killing one's assailant is justified, he argues, provided one does not intend to kill him. Aquinas observes that “Nothing hinders one act from having two effects, only one of which is intended, while the other is beside the intention. … Accordingly, the act of self-defense may have two effects: one, the saving of one's life; the other, the slaying of the aggressor.” As Aquinas's discussion continues, a justification is provided that rests on characterizing the defensive action as a means to a goal that is justified: “Therefore, this act, since one's intention is to save one's own life, is not unlawful, seeing that it is natural to everything to keep itself in being as far as possible.” However, Aquinas observes, the permissibility of self-defense is not unconditional: “And yet, though proceeding from a good intention, an act may be rendered unlawful if it be out of proportion to the end. Wherefore, if a man in self-defense uses more than necessary violence, it will be unlawful, whereas, if he repel force with moderation, his defense will be lawful.”

Aquinas does not actually say that intending to kill the assailant as a means to self-defense would be prohibited. The passage can be interpreted as formulating a prohibition on apportioning one's efforts with killing as the only goal guiding one's actions, which would lead one to act with greater viciousness than the goal of self-defense would allow. In contrast, Augustine had earlier maintained that killing in self-defense was not permissible, maintaining that “private self-defense can only proceed from some degree of inordinate self-love.”

Later versions of the double effect principle all emphasize the distinction between causing a morally grave harm as a side effect of pursuing a good end and causing a harm as a means of pursuing a good end. We can summarize this by noting that for certain categories of morally grave actions, for example, causing the death of a human being, the principle of double effect combines a special permission for incidentally causing death for the sake of a good end (when it occurs as a side effect of one's pursuit of that end) with a general prohibition on instrumentally causing death for the sake of a good end (when it occurs as part of one's means to pursue that end). The prohibition is absolute in traditional Catholic applications of the principle. Two traditional formulations appear below.

The New Catholic Encyclopedia provides four conditions for the application of the principle of double effect:

  1. The act itself must be morally good or at least indifferent.
  2. The agent may not positively will the bad effect but may permit it. If he could attain the good effect without the bad effect he should do so. The bad effect is sometimes said to be indirectly voluntary.
  3. The good effect must flow from the action at least as immediately (in the order of causality, though not necessarily in the order of time) as the bad effect. In other words the good effect must be produced directly by the action, not by the bad effect. Otherwise the agent would be using a bad means to a good end, which is never allowed.
  4. The good effect must be sufficiently desirable to compensate for the allowing of the bad effect“ (p. 1021).

The conditions provided by Joseph Mangan include the explicit requirement that the bad effect not be intended:

A person may licitly perform an action that he foresees will produce a good effect and a bad effect provided that four conditions are verified at one and the same time:

  1. that the action in itself from its very object be good or at least indifferent;
  2. that the good effect and not the evil effect be intended;
  3. that the good effect be not produced by means of the evil effect;
  4. that there be a proportionately grave reason for permitting the evil effect” (1949, p. 43).

Double effect might also be part of a secular non-absolutist view according to which a justification adequate for causing a certain harm as a side effect might not be adequate for causing that harm as a means to the same good end under the same circumstances. Warren Quinn provides such a non-absolutist account that also recasts double effect as a distinction between direct and indirect agency. On his view, double effect “distinguishes between agency in which harm comes to some victims, at least in part, from the agent's deliberately involving them in something in order to further his purpose precisely by way of their being so involved (agency in which they figure as intentional objects), and harmful agency in which either nothing is in that way intended for the victims or what is so intended does not contribute to their harm” (1989, p. 343). Quinn explains that “direct agency requires neither that harm itself be useful nor that what is useful be causally connected in some especially close way with the harm it helps bring about” (1989, p. 344). He remarks that “some cases of harming that the doctrine intuitively speaks against are arguably not cases of intentional harming, precisely because neither the harm itself (nor anything itself causally very close to it) is intended” (1991, p. 511). On this view, the distinction between direct and indirect harmful agency is what underlies the moral significance of the distinction between intended and merely foreseen harms, but it need not align perfectly with it.

2. Applications

Many morally reflective people have been persuaded that something along the lines of double effect must be correct. No doubt this is because at least some of the examples cited as illustrations of DE have considerable intuitive appeal:

  1. The terror bomber aims to bring about civilian deaths in order to weaken the resolve of the enemy: when his bombs kill civilians this is a consequence that he intends. The tactical bomber aims at military targets while foreseeing that bombing such targets will cause civilian deaths. When his bombs kill civilians this is a foreseen but unintended consequence of his actions. Even if it is equally certain that the two bombers will cause the same number of civilian deaths, terror bombing is impermissible while tactical bombing is permissible.
  2. A doctor who intends to hasten the death of a terminally ill patient by injecting a large dose of morphine would act impermissibly because he intends to bring about the patient's death. However, a doctor who intended to relieve the patient's pain with that same dose and merely foresaw the hastening of the patient's death would act permissibly. (The mistaken assumption that the use of opioid drugs for pain relief tends to hasten death is discussed below in section 5.)
  3. A doctor who believed that abortion was wrong, even in order to save the mother's life, might nevertheless consistently believe that it would be permissible to perform a hysterectomy on a pregnant woman with cancer. In carrying out the hysterectomy, the doctor would aim to save the woman's life while merely foreseeing the death of the fetus. Performing an abortion, by contrast, would involve intending to kill the fetus as a means to saving the mother.
  4. To kill a person whom you know to be plotting to kill you would be impermissible because it would be a case of intentional killing; however, to strike in self-defense against an aggressor is permissible, even if one foresees that the blow by which one defends oneself will be fatal.
  5. It would be wrong to throw someone into the path of a runaway trolley in order to stop it and keep it from hitting five people on the track ahead; that would involve intending harm to the one as a means of saving the five. But it would be permissible to divert a runaway trolley onto a track holding one and away from a track holding five: in that case one foresees the death of the one as a side effect of saving the five but one does not intend it.
  6. Sacrificing one's own life in order to save the lives of others can be distinguished from suicide by characterizing the agent's intention: a soldier who throws himself on a live grenade intends to shield others from its blast and merely foresees his own death; by contrast, a person who commits suicide intends to bring his or her own life to an end.

3. Criticisms

Does the principle of double effect play the important explanatory role that has been claimed for it? To consider this question, one must be careful to clarify just what the principle is supposed to explain. Three misinterpretations of the principle's force or range of application are common.

First, it is a misinterpretation to claim that the principle of double effect shows that agents may permissibly bring about harmful effects provided that they are merely foreseen side effects of promoting a good end. Applications of double effect always presuppose that some kind of proportionality condition has been satisfied. Traditional formulations of double effect require that the value of promoting the good end outweigh the disvalue of the harmful side effect.

For example, a physician's justification for administering drugs to relieve a patient's pain while foreseeing the hastening of death as a side effect does not depend only on the fact that the physician does not intend to hasten death. After all, physicians are not permitted to relieve the pain of kidney stones or childbirth with potentially lethal doses of opiates simply because they foresee but do not intend the hastening of death! A variety of substantive medical and ethical judgments provide the justificatory context: the patient is terminally ill, there is an urgent need to relieve pain and suffering, death is imminent, and the patient or the patient's proxy consents.

Michael Walzer has argued that an additional condition is required: that agents minimize the foreseen harm even if this will involve accepting additional risk or foregoing some benefit. Whether this kind of condition is satisfied may depend on the agent's current circumstances and the options that exist. Thus, for example,as techniques for managing pain, titrating carefully the doses of pain-relieving medication and delivering analgesic medication have been refined, what might in the past have been an adequate justification for hastening death in the course of pain relief would now fail because current techniques for titrating doses provide the better alternative of managing pain without hastening death. See section 5 for a full discussion of this application of double effect.

A second misinterpretation is fostered by applications of double effect that contrast the permissibility of causing a harm as a merely foreseen side effect of pursuing a good end with the impermissibility of causing the same kind of harm as one's end. Since it is widely accepted that it is wrong to aim to produce harm to someone as an end, to rule this out is not part of double effect's distinctive content. The principle presupposes that agents do not aim to cause morally grave harms as an end and seeks to guide decisions about causing harm in pursuing a morally good end. For example, double effect contrasts those who would (permissibly) provide medication to terminally ill patients in order to alleviate suffering with the side effect of hastening death with those who would (impermissibly) provide medication to terminally ill patients in order to hasten death in order to alleviate suffering. In the allegedly impermissible case, the physician's ultimate end is a good one — to alleviate suffering — not to cause death.

The principle of double effect is directed at well-intentioned agents who ask whether they may cause a serious harm in order to bring about a good end of overriding moral importance when it is impossible to bring about the good end without the harm. A third common misinterpretation of double effect is to assume that the principle assures agents that they may do this provided that their ultimate aim is a good one that is ordinarily worth pursuing, the proportionality condition is satisfied and the harm is minimized. That is not sufficient: it must also be true that causing the harm is not so implicated as part of their means to this good end that it must count as something that is instrumentally intended to bring about the good end. Some discussions of double effect wrongly assume that it permits acts that cause certain kinds of harm because those harms were not the agent's ultimate aim or were regretted rather than welcomed. The principle of double effect is much more specific than that. Harms that were produced regretfully and only for the sake of producing a good end may be prohibited by double effect because they were brought about as part of the agent's means to realizing the good end. When minor harms are permissibly brought about as part of the means to a good end — for example, dentists are allowed to probe causing pain saying “tell me when it hurts” as a means to their diagnostic end — double effect does not explain their permissibility. Double effect is silent about cases in which a small harm might permissibly be brought about as a means to a good end. To invoke double effect, as it has traditionally be understood, is to make a comparative judgment: it is to assert that a harm that might permissibly be brought about as a side effect in promoting a good end could not permissibly be brought about as a means to the same good end.

Those who defend double effect often assume that their opponents deny that an agent's intentions, motives, and attitudes are important factors in determining the permissibility of a course of action. If the permissibility of an action depended only on the consequences of the action, or only on the foreseen or foreseeable consequences of the action, then the distinction that grounds double effect would not have the moral significance claimed for it (see the related entry on consequentialism). Some opponents of double effect do indeed deny that the distinction between intended and merely foreseen consequences has moral significance.

Yet many criticisms of double effect do not proceed from consequentialist assumptions or skepticism about the distinction between intended and merely foreseen consequences but instead ask whether the principle adequately codifies the moral intuitions at play in the cases that are taken to be illustrations of double effect. Doubts about the explanatory value of double effect have often focused on the difficulty of distinguishing between harmful effects that are regretfully intended as part of the agent's means and harmful effects that are regretfully foreseen as side effects of the agent's means. Since double effect deems the former to be impermissibly brought about, while the latter may be permissible, those who wish to apply double effect must provide principled grounds for drawing this distinction.

For example, if the soldier who throws himself on the grenade in order to shield his fellow soldiers from the force of an explosion acts permissibly, and if the permissibility of his action is explained by double effect, then he must not intend to sacrifice his own life in order to save the others, he must merely foresee that his life will end as a side effect of his action. But many have argued that this is an implausible description of the soldier's action and that his action is permissible even if he does intend to cause his own death as a means to save the others. Shelly Kagan points out that if someone else were to shove the soldier on the grenade we would certainly say that that the harm to the soldier was intended by the person who did the shoving. Equally, Kagan argues, we should say that it is intended in this case (p. 145). The same kind of argument can be made for cases of killing in self-defense.

Those who take this view can claim that what is often called the proportionality condition associated with double effect is really doing all of the explanatory work: it is because the end is judged to be worthy that the harmful means is considered to be permissibly brought about. Those who reject double effect for this reason may still maintain that there is a morally significant difference between self-sacrifice of this sort and suicide, but that the difference depends on a difference in the agent's motives and ends, not a difference in the means adopted.

This kind of criticism about the explanatory reach of the principle of double effect might also be associated with the worry that we will be inclined to describe a harm as a merely foreseen side effect if we believe that it is permissibly brought about in the course of pursuing a good end, and, similarly, we will tend to describe a harm as one that is intended as part of the agent's means if we believe that it is not permissibly brought about in the course of pursuing a good end. Disputes about the permissibility of killing a fetus in order to save the life of a pregnant woman have often been thought to take this form. Those who say that it would be impermissible to perform an abortion to save the life of a pregnant woman say that this is because this would involve intending the death of the fetus. However, if it is also maintained that a hysterectomy may be performed on a pregnant woman with uterine cancer because the death of the fetus would be a merely foreseen side effect of surgery, it is hard to find a principled ground for drawing this distinction that could serve as a guide to moral judgment.

Warren Quinn has argued that double effect does not rest on the distinction between intended and merely foreseen harm, but instead is best formulated using a distinction between direct and indirect agency (see the Formulations section). Quinn's view would imply that typical cases of self-defense and self-sacrifice would count as cases of direct agency. One clearly intends to involve the aggressor or oneself in something that furthers one's purpose precisely by way of his being so involved. Therefore, Quinn's account of the moral significance of the distinction between direct and indirect agency could not be invoked to explain why it might be permissible to kill in self-defense or to sacrifice one's own life to save the lives of others. But perhaps this is as it should be: double effect might be easier to explain and justify if the range of cases to which it applies is limited in this way. If Quinn's view is correct, and if the distinction between direct and indirect agency is easier to draw clearly, and is not subject to redescription under the influence of our moral judgments about permissibility, then perhaps the objections outlined above can be answered.

A second striking feature of Quinn's interpretation (or revision) of double effect is that it analyzes the disfavored kind of agency as conduct that subordinates the victim to purposes that he or she either rightfully rejects or cannot rightfully accept, thereby violating the victim's right not to be surbordinated in this way (1991, p. 511). Equally harmful indirect agency would not violate this right, but it is violated, according to Quinn, only when other rights are violated. Therefore, its force is not entirely independent from the kind of wrong that is present in cases of indirect agency, since it amplifies this, but it is additional to it, and distinguishable (Quinn 1989, p. 349). Thus, the harms brought about by fair competition, or in justifiable punishment do not violate any right of the persons affected, and so, on Quinn's view, do not violate this additional right even if they are brought about intentionally.

4. One principle or many?

It is not at all clear that all of the examples that double effect has been invoked to justify can be explained by a single principle.

Proponents of double effect have always acknowledged that a proportionality condition must be satisfied when double effect is applied, but this condition typically requires only that the good effect outweigh the foreseen bad effect or that there be sufficient reason for causing the bad effect. Some critics of double effect have maintained that when double effect has been invoked, substantive independent justifications for causing the kind of harm in question are implicitly relied upon, and are in fact, doing all of the justificatory work. These independent justifications are not derived from the distinction between intended and merely foreseen consequences, and more significantly, might presuppose different ways of drawing the distinction (Davis, McIntyre). Thus, self-sacrifice and killing in self-defense might involve permissibly causing death as a means to a good end, while dispensing medication to relieve pain in terminally ill patients and the strategic bombing of military targets might involve causing death as a side effect. If this is true, then perhaps the cases that have been cited as applications of double effect are united only by the fact that each is an exception to the general rule that it is wrong to cause the death of a human being.

The historical origins of double effect as a tenet of Catholic casuistry might provide a similar explanation for the unity of its applications. If one were to assume that it is absolutely prohibited to cause the death of a human being, then it would not be permissible to kill an aggressor in self-defense, to sacrifice one's life to protect others, to hasten death as a side effect of administering pain-relieving medications, or to endanger non-combatants in warfare. If one were to assume instead that what is absolutely prohibited is to cause the death of a human being intentionally, then these exceptional cases can all be classified as cases of non-intentional killing.

Critics of double effect might then claim that a better way of explaining what these cases have in common is to point out that they are exceptions to the prohibition on causing the death of a human being, and that the pattern of justification that they share requires that the agent acts in order to promote a good end and shows adequate respect for the value of human life in so acting. What the critics of double effect emphasize is that the distinction between what is intentional and what is foreseen does not explain the permissibility of these exceptions.

T.M. Scanlon (2008) has recently developed this kind of criticism by arguing that the appeal of double effect is, fundamentally, illusory: an agent's intentions are not relevant to the permissibility of an action in the way that the proponents of the principle of double effect would claim, though an agent's intentions are relevant to moral assessments of the way in which the agent deliberated. That an agent intended to bring about a certain harm does not explain why the action was impermissible, but it can explain what is morally faulty about the agent's reasoning in pursuing that line of action.

5. End of Life Decision-Making

The principle of double effect is often mentioned in discussions of what is known as palliative care, medical care for patients with terminal illness in need of pain relief. Three assumptions often operate in the background of these discussions:

  1. It is assumed that the side effect of hastening death is an inevitable or at least likely result of the administration of opioid drugs in order to relieve pain.
  2. It is assumed that the hastening of death is a not unwelcome side effect of providing pain relief in the context of palliative care.
  3. It is assumed that it would be impermissible to hasten death intentionally in order to cut short the suffering of a terminally ill patient.

When these assumptions are made, double effect seems to provide at least part of a justification for administering drugs to relieve pain.

Yet the first assumption is false. Physicians and researchers have insisted repeatedly that it is a myth that opioids administered for pain relief can be expected to hasten death (Sykes and Thorns, 2003 provide a review of a large number of studies supporting this claim). There is no research that substantiates the claim that opioid drugs administered appropriately and carefully titrated are likely to depress respiration. In a survey of research bearing on this issue, Susan Anderson Fohr (1998) concludes: “It is important to emphasize that there is no debate among specialists in palliative care and pain control on this issue. There is a broad consensus that when used appropriately, respiratory depression from opioid analgesics is a rarely occurring side effect. The belief that palliative care hastens death is counter to the experience of physicians with the most experience in this area.” The mistaken belief that pain relief will have the side effect of hastening death may have the unfortunate effect of leading physicians, patients, and the patients' families to undertreat pain because they are apprehensive about causing this alleged side effect.

The appropriate conclusion, then, is that double effect plays no role whatsoever in justifying the use of opioid drugs for pain relief in the context of palliative care. Why is double effect so frequently mentioned in discussions of pain relief in the context of palliative care if its application rests on (and thereby perpetuates) a medical myth? The popularity and intuitive appeal of this alleged illustration of double effect may have two sources. First, the point of mentioning the permissible hastening of death as a merely foreseen side effect may be to contrast it with what is deemed morally impermissible: administering drugs that are not pain relievers to a patient with a terminal illness in order to hasten death and thereby cut short the patient's suffering. Second, the myth that pain relief hastens death might have persisted and perpetuated itself because it expresses the compassionate thought behind the second assumption: that the hastening of death may be a welcome side effect of administering pain relief to patients at the end of life.

Yet even this apparently compassionate assumption may be unduly paternalistic. Patients receiving palliative care whose pain can be adequately treated with opioid drugs may well value additional days, hours or minutes of life. It is unjustified to assume that the hastening of death is itself a form of merciful relief for patients with terminal illnesses and not a regrettable side effect to be minimized. Recall that the traditional applications of double effect require agents to seek to minimize or avoid the merely foreseen harms that they cause as side effects. On this point, popular understandings of double effect, with the second assumption in place, may diverge from traditional interpretations of the principle.

Some members of the U.S. Supreme Court invoked double effect as a justification for the administration of pain-relieving drugs to patients receiving palliative care and also as a justification for the practice known as terminal sedation in which sedative drugs are administered to patients with intractable and untreatable pain in order to induce unconsciousness (Vacco et al. v. Quill et al., 117 S.Ct. 2293 (1997)). If artificial hydration and nutrition are not provided, this may well hasten death. (If death is immediately imminent, then the absence of hydration and nutrition may not affect the time of death.) The traditional doctrine of double effect requires that the harmful side effect be minimized, so the traditional doctrine of double effect does not provide the justification for withholding hydration and nutrition in cases in which death is not immediately imminent.

Terminal or full sedation is a response to intractable pain in patients suffering from terminal illness. It involves bringing about a set of conditions (sedation, unconsciousness, the absence of hydration and nutrition) that together might have the effect of hastening death if death is not already imminent. In any case, these conditions make death inevitable. Two important moral issues arise concerning this practice. First, is terminal sedation appropriate if it is necessary to relieve intractable pain in patients diagnosed with a terminal illness, even if death is not imminent? This is what Cellarius (2008) calls early terminal sedation because it does not satisfy the requirement that death is imminent that is typically cited as a condition of the permissibility of terminal sedation. Early terminal sedation could be expected to hasten death as a side effect of providing palliative care for unusually recalcitrant pain. A second issue concerns the moral significance of the fact that once sedation has occurred, death is inevitable either because it was imminent already or because the withholding of nutrition and hydration has made it inevitable. Would it be permissible to increase the level of sedation foreseeing that this would hasten the death that is now inevitable? Traditional applications of the principle of double effect rest on the assumption that the death of an innocent human being may never be brought about intentionally and would rule against such an action. Yet the assumptions that inform the popular understanding of double effect — that the physician's guiding intention is to relieve pain, that the hastening of death would not be unwelcome in these very specific circumstances, and that this course of action should be distinguished from a case of active euthanasia that is not prompted by the duty to relieve pain — might seem to count in favor of it. Since either position could be characterized as an application of the principle of double effect, it may obscure rather than clarify discussion of such ethical opinions to view the principle of double effect as a clear guideline. In this discussion, as in many others, the principle of double effect, with its contrast between prohibited harms brought about intentionally and permitted harms brought about as side effects, may serve more as a framework for announcing constraints on moral decisions that permit grave harms to be caused as a side effect than as a way of determining the precise content of those decisions and the judgments that justify them.


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