Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Aristotle's Rhetoric

The Brevity of the Enthymeme

In Rhet. II.22, 1395b24–26, a passage parallel to Rhet. I.2, 1357a7–18, Aristotle says that the orator should avoid two tendencies: in formulating enthymemes, one should neither (a) deduce from far away nor (b) take up everything. Traditionally, this description has been associated with the alleged logical incompleteness of the enthymeme. But again one cannot infer that the enthymeme has to leave out logically required premises: (a) Deducing from too far away means that the orator has chosen premises that are so remote that it is difficult to see the connection with the intended conclusion (for example, if the premise is a rather general principle and the conclusion pertains to a concrete decision). But this is a question that does not even affect the number or completeness of the premises used (it affects the length of the argument only if one tries to bridge the gap between the original premise and the conclusion by several intermediate steps). Whether or not one (b) takes up everything, can, but need not affect the logical completeness of an argument: Let us assume that someone has chosen a very remote premise, as in the argument that the Scythians have no flute players, since they have no grape plants. Obviously, the respective arguments can be construed in different ways. On the one hand one could put it in the straight form:

(P1): Since there is no wine (no grape plants) in the land of the Scythians and
(P2): since flute players can only be found where there is wine (or grape plants),
(C): the Scythians have no flute players.

But most probably this argument would not be persuasive, since the premise (P2) can hardly be taken as a generally accepted and evident opinion. On the other hand, one could take up everything to elucidate the connection to the intended conclusion; for example: “Since the art of flute playing only flourishes where there are glittering parties, and glittering parties can only be where the guests get drunk, and the guests only get drunk where there is a sufficient supply of wine, and a sufficient supply of wine is only where … etc.” This latter method takes up everything, even things that are already evident. This is exactly what the orator has to avoid. But either way, whether one takes up everything or not, the argument can be a complete deduction. Therefore, the advice that enthymemes should be short and should not have redundant premises can, but need not affect the logical completeness of an argument. The fallacious tendencies of deducing from far away and taking up everything can be avoided if one starts with apt premises.

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