Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Teleological Arguments for God's Existence

1. See MacLeay (1819–21). Taxonomic structures were also an evidence for Paley. Whewell also suggested that aesthetic/pattern considerations might be the proper explanation for some phenomena. See Whewell 1854 [2001], 341.

2. F.R. Tennent is a prime example here, but there are other earlier examples as well. For instance, Peter Mark Roget, in his Bridgewater Treatise says:

For the argument, as it has been justly remarked, is cumulative; that obtained from one source being strengthened by that derived from another; and all ending to the same conclusion, lake rays converging to the same point, on which they concentrate their united powers of illumination. (Roget 1834, 33)

Such arguments bear some resemblance to Darwin's own conception of the case presented in the Origin as being “one long argument.” (Paley also used the term ‘cumulative’, but in a quite different sense. See e.g., Paley 1802 [1963], 33.)

3. What I am about to give here is a somewhat controversial construal of Paley. At some later points in Natural Theology, Paley's language sounds very comparative (see, e.g., Paley 1802 [1963], 37ff).

4. In this connection, see also Glass and Wolfe 1986 (17–19). See also McPherson 1965 (79), and Sober 1993 (34–5).

5. Along that same line, Paley says:

How is it possible, under circumstances of such close affinity, and under the operation of equal evidence, to exclude contrivance from the one, yet to acknowledge the proof of contrivance having been employed, as the plainest and clearest of all propositions, in the other? [p. 15]

6. My emphasis. Contrast Paley's comparison of inferences with Cleanthes's comparisons of properties of entities.

7. As Elliott Sober notes, if the argument is not analogical, then “Hume's criticisms entirely lose their bite.” (Sober 1993, 33).

8. See Gillispie 1990 (214–229). See especially pp. 218–219 and note 15 on p. 219. See also Nuovo 1992 (30, 33). Nuovo does, however, take Paley's argument still to be analogical.

9. In fact, apparent design is sometimes so exquisite that it has generated what has become known among biologists as Orgel's Second Law: “Evolution is cleverer than you are.”

10. “[In early 19th century Germany] a very coherent body of theory based on a teleological approach was worked out, and it did provide a constant fertile source for the advance of biological science on a number of different research fronts” (Lenoir 1982, 2). John Hedley Brooke and others advance similar contentions.

11. One key subtype involves establishing the co-presence of two (groups of) variables within a significant set of known phenomena, then again under certain constraints, taking that co-presence as indicative of a more general connection between the two variables which can then be used in previously unchecked cases to infer the likely presence of the second variable from the established presence of the first.

12. Many early moderns took themselves in science to be investigating a created artifact—nature—holding, as Kepler allegedly said, that in science we are attempting to think God's thoughts after Him. But, of course, boosting the evidential force of relevant Rs by appealing to the artifactual character of nature in the present context would simply beg the question.

13. In fact, John Foster claims that: “The only primitive rational form of empirical inference is inference to the best explanation.” [my emphasis] (Foster 1982–3, 89). In a later piece, the same line appears but with the addition of “(non-deductive)” after “empirical” (Foster 1985, 227).

14. “Likelihood” can be taken here in the formal sense of the term—i.e., P(e/h). In fact, Sober argues that design arguments should be construed exclusively in terms of likelihoods, specifically that (in present terms): e strongly favors h1 over h2 if and only if P(e/h1) >> P(e/h2). See (Sober 2003, 27–54).

15. In fact, Sober seems to take more or less all design arguments to be intended as IBEs (2003, 30 and 1993, 31).

16. For a formal treatment see e.g., Howson and Urbach, 1989.

17. That is not to say that probabilistic arguments might not nonetheless be of relevance. Richard Swinburne, for instance, argues that various traditional design evidences at least raise the probability of design, whether or not they make it actually probable. See Ch. 8 of Swinburne 1991.

18. For further discussion see Ratzsch 2003 (124–144).

19. It might appear that I have given insufficient attention to probabilistic arguments, but in many such cases the probabilities in question are just the probabilities of there actually being a gap, and are connected with the difficulties of actually establishing the existence of gaps with certainty. Such arguments thus merely constitute a special case of Schema 2.

20. An exception would be views associated with process theology, which locates God in a sense within nature, but I shall not pursue such views here.

21. See Ratzsch 2001, e.g., Chapter 8.

22. One nice description of this move as resulting from science itself comes from Whewell:

We have shown, we trust, that the notion of design and end is transferred by the researches of science, not from the domain of our knowledge to that of our ignorance, but merely from the region of facts to that of laws. (Whewell 1834, 349)

23. Here is Boyle:

[I]t much more tends to the illustration of God's wisdom, to have framed things first, that there can seldom or never need any extraordinary interposition of his power. … [I]t more sets off the wisdom of God in the fabric of the universe, that he can make so vast a machine perform all those many things, which he designed it should, by the mere contrivance of brute matter managed by certain laws of local motion and upheld by his ordering and general concourse, that if he employed from time to time an intelligent overseer … to regulate, and control the motions of the parts. (Boyle 1685–6, 150–1)

Whewell says:

But with regard to the material world, we can at least go so far as this—we can perceive that events are brought about not by insulated interpositions of Divine power, exerted in each particular case, but by the establishment of general laws. (Whewell 1834, 356)

Gaps began coming more to prominence in around the 1840s.

24. The quote in question is that from Whewell 1834 (356) cited above in note 25.

25. Darwin in his B notebook, written in the late 1830s, says:

Astronomers might formerly have said that God ordered each planet to move in its particular destiny. In same manner God orders each animal created with certain form in certain country, but how much more simple and sublime power let attraction act according to certain laws such as inevitable consequen [sic] let animal be created, then by the fixed laws of generation, such will be their successors. (Darwin 1987, 195, para 101].

And in an 1860 (post Origin) letter to Asa Gray, Darwin says:

… I cannot anyhow be contented to view this wonderful universe, and especially the nature of man, and to conclude that everything is the result of brute force. I am inclined to look at everything as resulting from designed laws, with the details, whether good or bad, left to the working out of what we may call chance. (Darwin 1902 [1995], 236)

26. This is similar to what some Intelligent Design (ID) advocates refer to as “frontloading.” The basic idea can even be found in Augustine, and is given explicit statement by theologians such as Jonathan Edwards who saw provision even for subsequent miracles as incorporated into the initial conditions:

[It requires] great wisdom [to] dispose every atom at first, as that they should go for the best throughout eternity; and in the adjusting by an exact computation, and a nice allowance to be made for the miracles that should be needful” (Edwards 1980, 49).

27. As C.D. Broad notes in this connection (Broad 1925, 86):

[S]o long as we take a material system as a going concern and do not raise questions about its origin, there is no reason whatever why its characteristic behavior should not be at once teleological and capable of complete mechanistic explanation.

28. The embedded Davis remark is in Davis 1987 (140).

29. Numbers of factors cited depend upon what parameters are taken to be causally independent of what others—and, of course, upon who is doing the counting.

30. The ‘weak’ anthropic principle and the ‘observer selection effect’ are widely held to have little or no explanatory content, but see (Leslie 1989, Ch. 6) for nuanced discussion.

31. See (Ratzsch, 2005). (Ellis and Brundrit 1979) covers some similar points. It is sometimes argued that the existence of our vastly improbable but life-permitting universe itself constitutes evidence for the existence of multiple other universe-tries. That would not only beg some substantive questions, but may also involve what Ian Hacking calls the ‘inverse gambler's fallacy’ (Hacking 1987).

32. For instance, Robin Collins (among others) holds that “the fine-tuning argument is probably the most powerful current argument for the existence of God” (Collins 1999, 50).

33. The ‘explanatory filter’ basically says that when chance and law are explanatorily inadequate, design is the only remaining alternative. For ID definition and discussion of irreducible complexity, see (Behe 1996). For ID definition and discussion of specified complexity, information, and the explanatory filter, see (Dembski 1998) and (Dembski 2002). The person most responsible for the design movement and its popular success is Philip Johnson, author of (Johnson 1991) and numerous subsequent titles.

34. See Ratzsch 2001 and 2005. For instance, even were it true that ID efforts were religiously motivated (and that is not true in all cases) that would imply little about the propriety of ID theories themselves.

35. In 1885, the Duke of Argyll recounted a conversation he had had with Charles Darwin the year before Darwin's death:

[I]n the course of that conversation I said to Mr. Darwin, with reference to some of his own remarkable works on the Fertilisation of Orchids, and upon The Earthworms, and various other observations he made of the wonderful contrivances for certain purposes in nature—I said it was impossible to look at these without seeing that they were the effect and the expression of Mind. I shall never forget Mr. Darwin's answer. He looked at me very hard and said, “Well, that often comes over me with overwhelming force; but at other times,” and he shook his head vaguely, adding, “it seems to go away”(Argyll 1885, 244).

This conversation is also referenced in Darwin 1887 (p. 68 footnote).

36. See Ratzsch 2003, for more detailed discussion of Reid.

37. Cleanthes:

“Consider, anatomize the eye; survey its structure and contrivance, and tell me, from your own feeling, if the idea of a contriver does not immediately flow in upon you with a force like that of sensation.” (Hume 1779 [1998], 25).