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Principle of Sufficient Reason

First published Tue Sep 14, 2010

The Principle of Sufficient Reason is a powerful and controversial philosophical principle stipulating that everything must have a reason or cause. This simple demand for thoroughgoing intelligibility yields some of the boldest and most challenging theses in the history of metaphysics and epistemology. In this entry we begin with explaining the Principle, and then turn to the history of the debates around it. A section on recent discussions of the Principle will be added in the near future.

1. Introduction

Suppose you enter a farmers' market, pick out a few cucumbers and ask the merchant for the price. “Five dollars a pound.” A bit expensive, you may think, but you pay. Before you leave the stand two other people approach the seller with the very same question (“How much are the cucumbers?”). “A dollar a pound,” he says to the one; “Ten dollars a pound,” he tells the other. At least two of you are likely to attack the merchant with a simple question: Why the price discrepancy? Of course, you may simply leave the place if you have a simple explanation for the discrepancy (for example, that both you and the person who was asked to pay ten dollars a pound belong to commonly discriminated minorities). You may also conclude that the seller is just out of his mind (or that he or she is just conducting a psychological experiment). In all of these cases you will be entertaining an explanation for a fact that appears odd. But what kinds of facts demand an explanation? Do all facts—including the most ordinary ones—demand an explanation? If you accept the Principle of Sufficient Reason (= PSR), you will require an explanation for any fact, or in other words, you will reject the possibility of brute, or unexplainable, facts.

Formally, the Principle states (PSR): For every fact F, there must be an explanation why F is the case.

The term ‘Principle of Sufficient Reason [principe de raison suffisante/principium reddendae rationis]’ was coined by Leibniz, though Spinoza clearly preceded Leibniz in appreciating the importance of the Principle and placing it at the center of his philosophical system. The Principle seems at first sight to have a strong intuitive appeal—we always ask for explanations—yet it is taken by many to be too bold and expensive due to the radical implications it seems to yield. Among the alleged consequences of the Principle are: the Identity of Indiscernibles, necessitarianism, the existence of a self-necessitated Being (i.e., God), the Principle of Plentitude, and strict naturalism. One can distinguish among various versions of the PSR according to the modal strength of the Principle and the extension of entities that fall under it. Arguably, the more interesting versions of the Principle are those which take it to be a necessary truth with unlimited extension (including both actual things and possibilia).

The PSR is closely related, if not fully identical, to the principle “ex nihilo, nihil fit” (“From nothing, nothing comes”). One of the most interesting questions regarding the PSR is why to accept it at all. Insofar as the PSR stipulates that all facts must be explainable, it seems that the PSR itself demands an explanation just as much. Several modern philosophers attempted to provide a proof for the PSR, though so far these attempts have been mostly unsuccessful. Another important problem related to the PSR is the possibility of self-explanatory facts and self-caused entities; particularly, one may wonder how these are distinguished from unexplainable, brute facts and uncaused entities. One may also wonder whether the PSR allows for primitive concepts that cannot be further explained. Though there are several important precursors who, as we will see, seem to advocate the PSR before the modern period, we will begin our discussion with two main expositors of the Principle: Spinoza and Leibniz.

2. Spinoza

Spinoza's earliest statement of the PSR appears in his first published work, the 1663 geometrical exposition of Descartes' Principles of Philosophy. The eighth axiom of Part I of the book states:

Nothing exists of which it cannot be asked, what is the cause (or reason) [causa (sive ratio)], why it exists.

In a brief explanatory note to this axiom, Spinoza adds:

Since existing is something positive, we cannot say that it has nothing as its cause (by Axiom 7). Therefore we must assign some positive cause, or reason, why [a thing] exists—either an external one, i.e., one outside the thing itself, or an internal one, one comprehended in the nature and definition of the existing thing itself (Geb. I/158/4–9).

Axiom 7, to which Spinoza appeals in the explanation, is a variant of the “ex nihilo, nihil fit” principle, and stipulates that an existing thing and its perfections (or qualities) cannot have nothing or a non-existing thing as their cause. Interestingly, however, in another work from this early period of his philosophical writing, the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, Spinoza allows for one item to be without a cause. In §70 of this treatise, Spinoza argues:

[T]hat Thought is also called true which involves objectively the essence of some principle that does not have a cause, and is known through itself and in itself (II/26/33–4. Our emphasis).

It is not completely clear what “the principle [principium]” at stake is, but given its qualification as “known through itself and in itself,” it may refer to God and indicate Spinoza's understanding of Descartes' rather nuanced view according to which God does not need a cause in order to exist, but there is a reason why God does not need a cause (AT VII: 164–65. Cf. Carraud (2002), Ch. 2).

Spinoza does not mention the PSR in his 1670 Theological Political Treatise, though the spirit of the Principle can be easily discerned throughout the book. For example, in the conclusion of the Fifteenth Chapter of the TTP Spinoza makes the following extraordinary announcement:

[W]hat altar of refuge can a man find for himself when he commits treason against the majesty of reason (III/188).

There is much to be said about this image of reason, which ascribes to reason the same exhaustiveness, dominance, and omnipresence that traditional theologies ascribe to God. This passage leaves no room for anything that is beyond, or against, reason.

The closest that Spinoza comes in the TTP to endorsing the PSR is, unsurprisingly, in his discussion of miracles. Let us have a close look at the following passage:

But since miracles were produced according to the capacity of the common people who were completely ignorant of the principles of natural things, plainly the ancients took for a miracle whatever they were unable to explain in the manner the common people normally explained natural things, namely by seeking to recall something similar which can be imagined without amazement. For the common people suppose they have satisfactorily explained something as soon as it no longer astounds them (III/84. Our emphasis).

What precisely went wrong in the vulgus' attempt (and failure) to explain miracles? Obviously they erred, according to Spinoza, by “being ignorant of the principles of natural things”; but why did they stay ignorant in spite of their genuine attempt to trace the causes of miracles? Why did they not look for the natural explanations of miracles? The vulgus were definitely not wrong in trying to find a causal explanation for miracles; Spinoza openly argues that we ought to try to explain things through their proximate causes. What went wrong in the method of the “common people” was that they did not go far enough in their attempt to explain the nature of things. Instead of stubbornly seeking the complete causal chain for each fact, they felt content once an extraordinary fact was shown to be the result of a familiar phenomenon, while paying no attention to the need to explain the familiar. In a way, they were rudimentary common-sense philosophers who asked for an explanation for what appears to be against common sense, and were completely reassured once the unfamiliar turned out to be a result of the common. For Spinoza, our familiarity with a phenomenon does not render it intelligible, and the familiar, just like the extraordinary, demands a clear causal explanation. Indeed, it is precisely at this point that the thoroughness of one's commitment to the Principle of Sufficient Reason is tested. Few people would deny the need to explain unusual phenomena (e.g., flying hippos), but fewer would demand an explanation for what is common and ordinary (e.g., time), and it is precisely here where the task of the philosopher begins, first in making us de-familiarize ourselves with, and question the nature of, the ordinary, and then in attempting to explain it.

In Spinoza's major work, the Ethics, the PSR is stated implicitly already by the second axiom of Part I:

E1a2: What cannot be conceived [concipi] through itself, must be conceived through another.

The immediate implication of E1a2 is that everything is conceived. Since, for Spinoza, to conceive something is to explain it (see E1p10s, E1p14d and Della Rocca (2008), 5) it seems that E1a2 amounts to the claim that everything is explainable. Indeed, in E1p11d2, Spinoza states explicitly:

For each thing there must be assigned a cause, or reason, both for its existence and for its nonexistence.

Similarly, Spinoza argues, “if a certain number of individuals exists, there must be a cause why those individuals, and why neither more nor fewer, exist” (E1p8s2). Spinoza's insistence that even the non-existence of things must be explainable is crucial. It allows him, for example, to argue that were God not to exist, his non-existence must be explainable. Since God is a substance, Spinoza argues, his existence or non-existence cannot be caused or explained externally (Spinoza takes substances to be causally independent of each other); hence, were God not to exist, he would have to be the cause of his non-existence, just as a square-circle is the cause of its non-existence. But since God is not a contradictory entity, He cannot internally rule out His own existence, and hence He must exist (E11pd).

Spinoza accepts a very strong version of the PSR. He grants it unlimited extension, and takes it to be strictly necessary. In fact, the PSR seems to be the primary motivation behind Spinoza's strict necessitarianism. For Spinoza, if there are two (or more) possible worlds, it would seem that neither one would have a sufficient reason or cause (for if there were such a sufficient reason, this world would be necessitated, and all other worlds would be impossible). In other words, for Spinoza, the PSR dictates that there is only one possible world.

Spinoza holds not only that the existence of things must be explained, but also that the coherence, or incoherence, of their essences (what others would call their possibility) must be explained. Similarly, the essences of things must also have a cause. In general, Spinoza relies on the PSR to motivate many of his most important and innovative doctrines, such as the Identity of Indiscernibles (E1p4), substance monism, and the rejection of free will. Recently, Michael Della Rocca argued not only that the PSR “provide[s] the key to unlocking many of the mysteries of Spinoza's philosophical system” (2008, 9), but that Spinoza requires the reduction of the most basic philosophical concepts to reason or intelligibility. This alleged “double use of the PSR” stipulates (1) that everything must be explainable, and (2) that it should be (ultimately) explained in terms of intelligibility. Hence, according to Della Rocca, Spinoza reduces his major philosophical concepts—existence, causation, rightness, and power—to intelligibility (2008, 8–9).

Spinoza is highly suspicious of primitive notions that cannot be explained or conceptualized, such as prime matter and pure will. Yet, self-explanation and self-causation are not only legitimate in his system, but in fact define some of his most basic concepts, such as eternity (E1d8).

3. Leibniz

Leibniz coined the term ‘The Principle of Sufficient Reason’ and is arguably its best known exponent. His treatment of the PSR is noteworthy for its systematicity and the centrality that he accords it. According to him, all truths rest upon two great principles: the Principle of Contradiction (which says that a truth is necessary just in case its negation is a contradiction) and the PSR. The second great principle is often identified by Leibniz as the Principle of the Best instead of the PSR. The two principles are intimately connected. The sufficient reason for any contingent truth is that it is for the best. According to Leibniz, God's reason for creating the actual world is that it is the best of all possible worlds. The reason for this world is that it is the best. The reason for any contingent truth is that, since the existence of the actual world entails it, it is for the best.

As before, our first interpretive questions when seeking to understand a philosopher's commitment to the PSR are what is in the domain of ‘everything’ and what counts as a ‘sufficient reason’? There is some textual evidence that suggests that only contingent truths are in the domain of ‘everything’ so that the PSR should be understood as saying that there is a sufficient reason for every contingent truth. (AG 150; LC L 4.10) If this interpretation is correct, then necessary truths, such as mathematical and metaphysical truths, need not have a sufficient reason. More frequently, however, Leibniz says that the sufficient reason for necessary truths is that their negation is a contradiction. (Monadology 36) Although necessary truths have sufficient reasons, they arguably don't rest on the PSR since they are true even in nonactual possible worlds where the PSR is false (which is presumably every nonactual possible world since no nonactual possible world is the best and thus God could have no sufficient reason to create it). Other texts suggest that events, not truths, are in the domain of the quantifier. For example, Leibniz writes:

[T]he principle of sufficient reason, namely, that nothing happens without a reason. (Leibniz-Clark Correspondence, L 2, AG 321)

Truths are not the sort of things that “happen.” Events are such things. So it appears that, in these texts, Leibniz is thinking of the PSR as a principle that applies to events and not truths. Perhaps Leibniz did not notice that some of his formulations of the PSR entail that it applies only to truths and that others entail that it applies only to events. Or perhaps he thought that the two formulations are equivalent because he thought the for every event there is a truth that describes it and that for every truth there is an event described by it. (It must be noted, however, that the later assumption is quiet questionable. Many truths, e.g., mathematical truths, do not appear to describe events.)

Leibniz uses the PSR to argue for a number of claims, including the identity of indiscernibles, relationalism with respect to space and time, and the existence of God. Let us briefly look at how Leibniz uses the PSR to argue for each of these theses. Leibniz presents arguments for the existence of God from the PSR in a number of different places and there are subtle differences them. (For example, The Ultimate Origination of Things, G VII 302–3; L 486–8. Monadology §37) The basic idea, however, is that since everything has an explanation (the PSR), the entire series of contingent things requires an explanation. The explanation of the entire series cannot be a member of the series since then it would explain itself and no contingent thing is self-explanatory. Thus the explanation of the entire series of contingent things must not be itself a contingent thing. Rather it must be something necessary. Leibniz believes that any necessary being is God. So, God exists.

Leibniz thinks that the PSR rules out the possibility that there could be two or more indistinguishable, that is, indiscernible, things (A VI, iv, 1541/AG 42). If there were two such things, God would have treated them differently insofar as he has related them differently to the rest of the world. For example, if there were two blades of grass that were indiscernible from each other, then one blade would stand in spatial and temporal relation R to the rest of the world, whereas the other blade would stand in some other spatial and temporal relation R′ to the rest of the world. Why did God choose to but the first blade relation R to the rest of the world instead of R′? Leibniz claims that since they are indiscernible from each other, there could be no reason for God to treat them differently. Thus if there were two indiscernible individuals, then God would have acted for no reason. But there is a reason for everything. So, there are no indiscernible yet numerically distinct things.

For similar reasons, Leibniz thinks that space and time cannot be substances or anything else absolute and must ultimately be a system of relations that obtain between bodies. (e.g., LC, L, 3.5) This is because if space, for example, were absolute, then there would be space points and such points would be indiscernible from one another. God would treat these space points differently from each other insofar as he orients his creation in space one way rather than another. This would have to be an arbitrary decision for the reasons outlined above. So, space and time are not absolute.

4. The PSR before Spinoza and Leibniz

The PSR is nearly as old as philosophy itself. Anaximander, one of the earliest of the pre-Socratics, is usually credited—on the basis of Aristotle's de Caelo, (b12 295b10–16)—with being the first to make use of it. Anaximander argues, we are told, that the Earth remains stationary in space because it is indifferent between motions in any direction. This indifference means that there is no reason why it should move in one direction rather than another. Since he concludes from this that it does not move, we can assume that Anaximander believes that motion in the absence of a reason is impossible.

Parmenides, another pre-Socratic, implicitly appeals to the PSR when he claims that the world cannot have come into existence because then it would have come from nothing. (Fragment B8 9–10) Nothing comes from nothing. If it did, Parmenides asks, why did it not come into existence at an earlier or a later time? Parmenides appears to reason as follows. If the world came into existence, the actual moment that it came into existence would be arbitrary. It would be a brute fact. There are no brute facts (the PSR). So, the world did not come into existence.

Another ancient source for the PSR is Archimedes who writes: “Equal weights at equal distances are in equilibrium, and equal weights at unequal distances are not in equilibrium but incline towards the weight which is at the greater distance.” This is a special case of the PSR and is cited by Leibniz in his correspondence with Clarke as a precedent for the PSR.

In the medieval period, Peter Abelard argued that God must create the best of all possible worlds. If he didn't, Abelard argues, there would have to be some reason for it. But what reason could that be except God's injustice or jealousy? But God cannot be unjust or jealous. So there is no possible reason for God making anything less than the best. Everything has a reason. Thus God makes the best possible world. Abelard's opinion was rejected as heresy and mainstream opinion of philosophers during the Middle Ages appears to reject the PSR. God, on the mainstream medieval view, enjoys freedom of indifference with respect to his creation. Thus there is no sufficient reason for why God created what he did and the PSR slips from prominence until its early modern revival at the hands of Spinoza and Leibniz.

Some great epistemological rationalists, such as Plato and Descartes, appear to endorse the PSR but in fact do not. For example, in the Timaeus Plato writes, “[E]verything that comes to be must of necessity come to be by the agency of some cause, for it is impossible for anything to come to be without a cause.” (28a4–5) This passage appears to assert the PSR. But Plato believes that there are things that are not among the things that “come to be,” and some of these things have no cause or reason. For example, the Demiurge creates the world by imposing order on disorderly motion. The disorderly motion preexists the work of the Demiurge. It is uncaused and there is no reason for it.

At times, Descartes appears to endorse the PSR. For example, he argues for the existence of God in the third Mediation on the basis of the principle that there must be at least as much reality in the cause as in the effect. And he justifies this causal principle by claiming that “Nothing comes from nothing.” This appears to make him as much an adherent of the PSR as Parmenides who, as we have seen, argues for his conclusions on the same basis. But elsewhere Descartes claims that God creates the eternal truths, such as mathematical and metaphysical truths. (Letters to Mersenne, April 15, May 6, and 27, 1630; Fifth Replies, AT 7:380, CSM 2:261) Moreover, he claims that God creates these truths by an act of will which is free and indifferent. Thus there can be no reason for God's will to create of these truths. If the act of will by means of which God creates the mathematical and metaphysical truths is contingent and yet has no sufficient reason according to Descartes, then his philosophy is deeply antithetical to the PSR. Of course, Descartes, like many of the others we have discussed may have endorsed a restricted version of the PSR. But the most natural and rationalistically acceptable restriction would be to contingent truths. Descartes' doctrine of the creation of the eternal truths holds that there is at least one contingent truth (the act of will by means of which God creates the eternal truths) which lacks a sufficient reason.

5. The PSR in Eighteenth Century Philosophy and German Idealism

Hume's critique of causation presents an important challenge to the PSR. In his Treatise of Human Nature (I, 3,3) Hume considers several arguments which attempt to prove the “general maxim in philosophy, that whatever begins to exist, must have a cause” and finds all of them wanting. Hume argues that since the ideas of cause and its effect are evidently distinct, we can clearly conceive or imagine an object without its cause. He takes the separability of the two ideas to show that there is no necessary conceptual relation between the ideas of cause and effect insofar as conceiving the one without the other does not imply any contradiction or absurdity.

Christian Wolff (1679–1754), the most influential German philosopher of the first half of the eighteenth century, was a follower of Leibniz and developed the latter's system. Like Leibniz, Wolff assigned to the PSR a central role in his system while attempting to avoid necessitarianism (or ‘fatalism’). Like Spinoza and Leibniz, Wolff demanded a reason for both the possibility of things [ratio essendi] (i.e., coherence of essence) and for the actualization, or coming to be, of essences [ratio fiendi]. Wolff mildly criticized Leibniz's grounding of the PSR merely in experience and attempted to marshal several proofs for the principle (Rational Thoughts, §§ 30–31, 143; Ontologia, §§ 56–78). One of these proofs attempts to prove the PSR relying on the principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles (Metaphysical Thoughts §31), while the most famous proof attempts to derive the PSR from the Law of Non-Contradiction. According to the latter, if a thing A is assumed to exist without reason, than “nothing is posited that explains why A exists.” This, according to Wolff, would mean that A exists because of nothing (Ontologia, §70), which Wolff claims to be absurd. Kant criticized the proof claiming that it is based on an equivocal use of the term ‘nothing’ (AK 1:398).

Leonhard Euler, the great Swiss mathematician and a contemporary of Wolff, warned against the “wretched abuse” of the PSR by those who “employ it so dexterously that by means of it they are in a condition to demonstrate whatever suits their purpose, and to demolish whatever is raised again them” (Letters to German Princess, Letter XIII). According to Euler, many of the proofs which rely on the PSR amount to nothing over and above a petitio principii, while others derive carelessly the impossibility of things from our ignorance of the causes of these things.

In the Critique of Pure Reason (1781, 1787), Kant claims to provide a proof for the PSR by showing that “the PSR is the ground of possible experience, namely the objective cognition of appearances with regards to their relation in the successive series of time” (B/246/A201). Relying on his transcendental method Kant argues in the “Second Analogy of Experience” that a certain version of the PSR is a condition for the possibility of experience, and as a result also a condition for the possibility of objects of experience. Yet, this argument also restricts the validity of the PSR to human experience, i.e., to things which appear in space and time. Any use of the PSR that transgresses the boundaries of human experience is bound to generate antinomies.

Kant's view of space and time as exhibiting brute difference (i.e., the non-identity of locations in space and time cannot be reduced to conceptual explanation) stands in sharp in contrast to the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, and thereby also to the PSR. Salomon Maimon, Kant's rationalist critic, attempted to enforce rationalist strictures on Kant's philosophy by arguing that Kant is unable to explain the necessary agreement of intuitions and concepts. According to Kant, intuitions and concepts come from entirely different sources: sensibility and understanding. But if this were the case, claims Maimon, we could not explain the constant agreement between intuitions and concepts, which is necessary for the possibility of experience. This agreement can be explained if we reject the radical heterogeneity of intuitions and concepts, and view intuitions as disguised concepts. Thus, any difference exhibited in space and time must have its ground in the universal forms of our thought in general (Maimon, Essay on Transcendental Philosophy, Ch. 1). Maimon also argued that we must seek an explanation for the fact that we have two forms of intuition rather than one, and suggested that it is only the interplay between the two forms of intuition which allows us to exhibit difference, by using a unity in one form to exhibit difference in the other form, i.e., conceive different times by concentrating on the change occurring at the same location in space, or conceive different locations in space at the same point in time (Essay, Ch. 1).

Ground [Grund] and the Principle of Sufficient Ground [der Satz vom zureichenden Grund] play a significant role in Hegel's Logic. For Hegel, the demand for ground provides a major source of transition from one thing to another. It is, Hegel says, “the expulsion of itself from itself” (Encyclopedia Logic, §121A). Ground, for Hegel, is the unity of identity and difference: the ground of x has to explain all features of x, and in sense duplicates it, yet it must also be different from x in order to have explanatory value and not be a mere petitio principii.

The PSR is the subject of Schopenahuer's 1813 doctoral dissertation: The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason. In this work, Schopenhauer provides a brief history of the PSR, and then raises the questions of the justification for the PSR and the proper scope of the principle. Schopenhauer follows Wolff in distinguishing among four kinds of reasons, corresponding to four kinds of objects, and charges that much philosophical confusion arises from attempts to explain objects of one kind by reasoning that belongs to the other kind. These four kinds of explanation, or four variants of the PSR, share the very same ground. Along Kantian lines Schopenhauer suggests that it is the subject's activity in regularly connecting representations that is ground of the PSR (The Fourfold Root, §16).


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identity: of indiscernibles | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Maimon, Salomon | Schopenhauer, Arthur | Spinoza, Baruch: modal metaphysics | Wolff, Christian