Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to States of Affairs

Bradley's Regress

The idea that there is a connection that links constituents, the LED and the property of emitting light in (1)

(1) this LED's emitting light

is subject to a criticism that is attributed to the British idealist F.H. Bradley.

There is an argument against the idea that (1) is a collection or sum of its constituents. The argument goes as follows:

(A) The constituents of (1), the LED and the property of emitting light, must be connected for (1) to obtain; (1) is an exempflifying by the LED of the property emitting light.

(B) Neither the set nor the mereological sum of the constituents of (1) is an exemplifying by the LED of the property emitting light; the mere existence of the collection or mereological sum implies no such connection.

(C) Hence, (1) is not reducible to the collection or mereological sum of its constituents.

But if (1) is not just a heap of its constituents, what accounts for its unity? Perhaps it will be suggested that exemplification is the connection which ties the constituents together in (1). This is suggested by the "consists in" language:

(2) (1) consists in the LED's exemplifying the property of emitting light.

The expression to the right of "consists in" in (2) is another gerundive nominal, "the LED's exemplifying the property of emitting light." Are we thus suggesting that exemplifying is a constituent in (1), the consituent responsible for tying the other constituents together? If so, then it can be asked, What links exemplfying to the other constituents? Clearly, if we take exemplifying to be a constituent of (1), we will be embarked on a vicious infinite regress.

It seems that the role of exemplifying in (1) cannot be like the role of loving in (3).

(3) Jack's loving Julia

On the compositionalist view, (3) consists in the holding of the loving relation from Jack to Julia. The relation loving is thus a constituent of (3). Some philosophers deny that exemplifying is a relation, or they hold it is a very special sort of relation; it is often called a "tie" or "nexus." Gustav Bergmann expressed this idea as follows:

'Relation’ and ‘nexus' I use technically, ‘connection’ non-technically and so broadly that a relation as well as a nexus is a connection. (Bergmann 1964, p. 243)

Since (3) "consists in" the holding of loving from Jack to Julia, this implies a triadic tie of holding in (3) that is supposed to be what accounts for the unity of that state of affairs. Against this, F.H. Bradley argues (Olson 1987) that this amounts to the claim that the unity of (3) is to be accounted for by appeal to a higher-order state of affairs:

(4) loving holding from Jack to Julia

And what accounts for the unity of (4)? Presumably the holding of a four-place tie or nexus of holding between triadic holding, loving, Jack and Julia. We are thus led into another infinite regress. Is this a harmless regress like the regress of the natural numbers (Broad 1976)?

Bradley contends that we never have an account of the unity of a state of affairs by appealing to a tie or connection of exemplifying or holding because this appeal is a recourse to a higher order state of affairs -- the holding of that tie amongst the constituents of the lower-order state of affairs. But the unity of that higher-order state of affairs still needs to be accounted for and so on ad infinitum.

Perhaps Bradley's conclusion was that a state of affairs just is the connecting of its elements -- no tie or ontological glue is required.

Against this, a philosopher might argue as follows. If we consider (1) and (5)

(5) Gato's weighing ten pounds
(1) this LED's emitting light

isn't there something they have in common? It seems that both are the having of a property by a particular. They both have the same structure. If (6) is true, then

(6) This LED is emitting light.

presumably this is because the LED is emitting light, it has that property. If so, it seems there is a connection between the particular and the property that is missing if (6) were false. If the connection were identical with (1), then what do (1) and (5) have in common? It seems that (1) and (5) have the same structure. Perhaps the point of phrases like "exemplifying", "exhibiting", "having", when used to describe the connection between a thing and a property, is to refer to this common structure.

Perhaps it is misleading to suggest that exemplification is what accounts for or explains the "unity" of the LED and the property emitting light in (1). When we assert (7)

(7) (1) consists in the LED's exemplifying the property of emitting light.

maybe the gerundive nominal "LED's exemplifying the property of emitting light" is just another name for the same state of affairs, (1), but one that makes the structure explicit. The structure is not itself a constituent in that state of affairs, on this view.

It might be said that the reference to exemplification makes explicit a condition that is necessary and sufficient for the existence of that state of affairs. (1) exists if and only if the relevant connection or tie holds; on this view, (1) exists if and only if the LED exhibits that feature. Bradley may object that the holding of that connection then implies a further tie called "holding" that links exemplification to the LED and the property of emitting light. In response, it might be suggested that the holding of such a connection just is the existence of such a connection, not something further. If so, the infinite regress fails to get off the ground.

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