Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to States of Affairs

Biosemantics and States of Affairs

Ruth Garrett Millikan's biosemantics program has implications for the metaphysics of states of affairs. Millikan's theory leaves no role for possible but non-actual states of affairs. In addition, the function of the logical words "is" (in the sense of identity), "exists", "some", "all", "if", "not", and "or" is taken to be non-representational, that is, they do not stand for elements in reality.

Human beings are creatures of biological and social evolution. Various aspects of human language ability appear to be innate. Language is an adaptation that has contributed greatly to the success and proliferation of our species. Such things as the division of labor would not be possible without the ability to coordinate behavior based on language. This suggests that human language has functions important to the survival and success of our species.

To explore this idea, Millikan asks us to compare the functions of human language with the signing behavior of other species, such as the dances of honey bees. When a bee finds nectar, it returns to the hive and performs a dance. These dances are able to convey to the other bees in the hive the direction of the nectar. How do we tell what direction a bee dance corresponds to? We can not simply average the reactions of the bees. Sometimes the bee dance may be defective, or the bees may not be able to find their way to the nectar due to high wind or other unfavorable conditions.

To figure out the mapping between dances and direction we would have to come up with a hypothesis about a mapping between dances and directions that explains those cases where the bees have successfully found nectar. This will be the mapping that actually contributed to the survival of the bees and the proliferation of that bee dance behavior. That bee dance behavior proliferates because of its contribution to the success of the bees. The dances can perform their function in the life of the hive only when they do successfully map to a real direction to actual nectar. For any given dance, there is a direction that it is "supposed to" map to, even if, for some reason, the bees are not able to successfully find nectar on that occasion. That a given bee dance has a "function" — that there is a direction it is "supposed to" map to — depends upon the past benefit to the bees from those past cases where the bee dance did successfully map to nectar.

This suggests an analogy with human language use. Suppose a scout from a human hunter/gatherer band thousands of years ago returned to report a distant pack of deer or a dangerous predator such as a large cat. The scout's sentences, Millikan might say, have the function of "adapting" the listeners to certain states of affairs that actually obtain. If the scout's sentence tokens did not map to any actual states of affairs in which predators or food are involved, the band would be less likely to find food or avoid predators (see Post 1991, p. 49).

1. The Role of States of Affairs

Sentences perform their function by mapping onto states of affairs in conformity with mapping rules. The mapping rules are those in accord with which "a critical mass of sentences in the past have mapped" onto actual states of affairs. In virtue of these past successful mappings, there are certain kinds of "correlation patterns between certain kinds of configurations of sentence elements" (Millikan 1984, p. 99) and certain kinds of configurations of constituents in actual states of affairs.

If we do not suppose that there was success in mappings of sentence tokens to actual states of affairs in the past, we could not adequately explain why sentence tokenings would continue to proliferate. If there were not true sentence tokens — ones that map to actual states of affairs, of what use would this practice be in human life? And if the sentence tokens did not make a contribution to the success of the sentence consumers and producers, how could the production of such sentence tokens lead to appropriate responses between cooperating partners in communication?

In order for being true, and generating true beliefs in listeners, to be functions of sentence tokens, it is not necessary that all or even most sentence tokenings have performed this function. It is a function of human sperm to unite with a human ovum, but very few sperm ever succeed in performing this function. For it to be a function of sentences that they should map to to an actual state of affairs it is sufficient that enough sentence tokens in the past have succeeded in being true, or approximating to the truth, and this past success accounts for the proliferation of sentence tokening, and the stabilizing of mapping functions for language elements, in virtue of the contribution to successful coordination of behavior and human success therefrom in doing so.

But only actual states of affairs are relevant in such explanations. That is because possible but non-actual states of affairs are causally inert; they cannot enter into explanatory relations. Millikan's theory thus responds to naturalist concerns (Section 3.1 in the main text) in that no "nonnatural" entities such as possible but non-actual states of affairs or necessarily existing abstracta outside spacetime are posited by the theory. Such entities are not required in her theory, since such entities do not enter into causal explanations of how mapping rules are sustained through their contribution to human success.

For Millikan, reference of subject terms (such as names) and predicate terms in sentences is derivative from the past mappings of sentences. Because the terms do not have a function other than that performed in the context of the sentence, the mapping rules for the terms is derivative from the history of successful mappings of sentence tokens onto actual states of affairs in the past. The mapping rules for the terms represent uniformities or "invariants" across actual states of affairs. (1) and (2) represent different states of affairs,

(1) Gato's eyes are yellow.
(2) Raja's eyes are yellow.

but there is a certain uniformity across the two states of affairs — the presence of a feature mapped by the predicate "yellow." Because only actual states of affairs that can enter into explanatory relations are relevant in determining the mapping rules, it seems that Millikan, like Armstrong, is committed to the thesis that universals (or at least the simple ones) exist only as instantiated "in" spatiotemporal reality.

Because each basic state of affairs that consists in a thing having a property or standing in a relation will have a property that is constitutive of it, what states of affairs there are will depend on what properties there are. Millikan considers but rejects the view that a property F is the same property as a property G if it is naturally necessary that they have the same instances. If we consider the properties of chunks of gold, they will all have the same conductivity, the same specific gravity, the same color and so on. Millikan argues that the electrical conductivity of a piece of gold would be identical with the spectrum of that chunk of gold only if the entire range of electrical conductivities were to map onto the entire range of spectra. In other words, it is naturally necessary to any given property that it have the range of contraries that it have and this is part of what it is to be that property.

The subject/predicate compositionality of sentences reflects compositionality in states of affairs. Nonetheless, Millikan cautions, there is not necessarily a single "right" way that a state of affairs might be articulated in language. She suggests that "Theatetus swims" and "Theatetus exemplifies swimming" may be taken to designate the same state of affairs, for example.

The mapping rule for any given term is a function that accords with "a critical mass" of actual use, forming a "center of gravity" to which speakers tend to adhere, and to which "wayward speakers tend to return" (for example, after misuses of words). These mapping functions of the terms contribute to determining how a given sentence token is supposed to map. The mapping functions of a sentence constitute the "sense" of that sentence. The "sense" of a public language element is determined by its function in communication; it is not determined by thoughts, images, intentions, dispositions or anything else in the head of a user on a given occasion of use.

In addition to the public language "sense" of sentences and terms, there is also an inner, psychological aspect to meaning. When a person takes over the use of a term, she must develop an inner program or know-how that matches the public language term. This inner device or program must be governed by an ability to match inner thought to the outward public language term. Such abilities Millikan calls "intension."

Because it is only the successful mappings of past sentence tokens onto actual states of affairs that can explain the persistence of mapping rules, Millikan holds that simple subject and predicate terms must have referents to have a sense. Terms like "Pegasus" or "phlogiston" are vacuous expressions for Millikan; that is, they literally have no sense. Fictional uses of language are what Millikan calls a "disengaged" use; that is, there is lack of commitment to the language being used to represent. She suggests that reporting the thoughts of others is another form of "disengaged" use, as when we do not commit to agreeing with what the other person believes or how they see things.

On Millikan's view, a proper function of an indicative mood sentence such as "Jack is sitting under the tree" is to represent an actual state of affairs, to generate true beliefs in listeners. That is what that the sentence is "supposed to" do. A function of an imperative mood sentence is to bring about the state of affairs it represents. If Jack says to Enrique "Close the door," a function of this sentence token is to bring about the door's being closed.

2. The Rejection of Non-obtaining States of Affairs

A function of the eye is to provide sight; but it can fail to perform that function. Just as a blind eye is defective, false indicative mood sentence tokens are defective. False sentence tokens are defective in that there is nothing they represent; they fail to perform their proper function. They do not do what indicative sentence tokens are "supposed to" do. The predicate "true" thus expresses a kind of biological normativity. Millikan's program thus provides an account of the meaningfulness of false sentences without positing "funny" entities such as possible but non-actual states of affairs or abstract propositions existing outside spacetime. The "sense" of the sentence lies in its mapping funcions; no entity is required as a semantic value or referent for the sentence token if it is false.

Millikan holds that there are no general states of affairs. For example, consider an instantial sentence such as

(3) A dog bit Johnny.

For this to be true, there must be some actual dog, such as Rex, who bit Johnny. If it is Rex, then it is Rex's biting Johnny that is the truth-maker for (3), Millikan would suggest. Consider a universal sentence such as (4).

(4) All raccoons have intestines.

Millikan agrees with Aristotle that this sentence presupposes that its subject term, "raccoons," is not vacuous; that is, that there are raccoons. The truth-makers for (4) would be a1's having's having intestines, where are all the raccoons.

To deduce (4) from the conjunctive sentence having the form of (5)

(5) a1 has intestines and ... and an has intestines.

one would have to add the following assumptions:

(6) a1 is a raccoon and ... and an is a raccoon.
(7) are all the raccoons.

Thus (5) is not necessarily equivalent to (4). Perhaps this is why Russell and Armstrong held that a universal sentence like (4) also requires a totality fact as a truth-maker; in the case of (4) this would be being all the raccoons. Millikan would argue that such totality facts are not required because the truth-making relationship between a1's having's having intestines and (4) is contingent. There is not a relation of necessary equivalence between the obtaining of just those states of affairs and the truth of (4) because (4) might be made true by other basic states of affairs. There might be additional raccoons, all with intact intestines. a1's having's having intestines just happen to be the truth-makers for (4).

If we consider a negative predicative sentence such as (8)

(8) John does not have blue eyes.

Millikan would note that blue is a color that has contraries. Whatever color John's eyes are, their being that color is the truth-maker for (8). If they are brown, then it is John's being brown-eyed that is the truth-maker for (8). There is a kind of indefinite reference in (8) as there is in (3).

For Millikan, a condition for a property being a real constituent in states of affairs is that it have contraries. Millikan thus rejects the logical atomist Principle of Independence (PI) (see Section 4.1 in the main text). For the same reason, Millikan holds that there are no such properties as existence or self-identity. Self-identity has no contraries. There is no property a thing could have that would be incompatible with its being itself. Thus there is also no such property as being identical with Socrates, on Millikan's view. The sentence (9)

(9) Mark Twain is Samuel Clemens.

is not a representational sentence for Millikan. It serves a different function. The function of (9) is to indicate to the listener that these two concepts, the one correlated with "Mark Twain" and the one correlated with "Samuel Clemens", should be merged or treated as the same concept.

3. Questions for Biosemantics

Millikan's semantic program is an impressive defense of the correspondence theory of truth. But how would this program work out for larger fragments of natural language? Millikan's semantic theory is schematic or programmatic, some philosophers may say. For example, what would be its semantics for conditionals or counterfactuals?

Millikan consigns the language of fiction and belief reports to "disengaged" use. But what is the function of this use? How does it serve its purpose if it is not representational? If we consider a sentence such as (10)

(10) Sherlock Holmes is a detective.

would we agree it is true? If so, how does this fit in with Millikan's realist theory of truth?

Millikan holds that the notion of logical possibility is chimerical, if it is supposed that it is something distinct from natural (or physical) possibility. However, Millikan does appeal to natural modality. For example, Millikan advances a hypothesis that it is a matter of natural necessity that properties come in ranges of contraries. But how can natural necessity be accounted for without appeal to possible but non-actual states of affairs or possible worlds? Millikan's program is not complete without an account of natural modality.

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