Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to States of Affairs

The Problem of Aliens

An issue for any actualist is the problem of aliens. For a full discussion of this problem, see the entry on actualism. But here is a slightly different take on the problem. The number of electrons that exist during the history of the universe is very large. But presumably there could have existed a few more electrons than the number of them that will in fact exist. Putting this into possible worlds talk, we may suppose there is a possible world, We, such that if We had been the actual course of history, there would have existed all the electrons that will actually exist but a few more. In other words, we may imagine a possible course of history starting from our understanding of the actual world but modifying it only to the minimum necessary to accommodate our hypothesis that there are a few more electrons. That possible course of history is We.

This implies that, if We obtained, there would have existed particulars that are distinct from everything that actually does exist. A particular that would have been distinct from every entity that actually does exist is an alien particular -- it is alien to our actual world.

If We had actually obtained, there would have existed some electrons distinct from all entities that do in fact exist; and these electrons would have various properties, such as being at spacetime position P. If We had obtained, then, there would have been some electron, x, such that an actual state of affairs would have been x's-being-at-P. But is there such a state of affairs? On the compositionalist view, x would have to exist if there were such a state of affairs. And that contradicts the hypothesis that x would be alien to the actual world.

On the compositionalist view, if We had been the case,W@ would have not been a possible world at all, if we assume something like Plantinga's conception of a possible world as a maximally consistent state of affairs. For, if We were actual, there would have been basic states of affairs consisting in the additional electrons having properties and those basic states of affairs would be neither included in nor precluded by W@. Those basic states of affairs could not be included in or precluded fromW@ because, on the compositionalist view, they do not exist in W@. Hence, if We had been actual, there would have been additional states of affairs and W@ would be too incomplete in We to satisfy Plantinga's definition of a possible world.

It also seems possible that there should have been fewer particulars than actually do exist. Suppose that Wf is a contracted possible world, with a smaller population of existent particulars than W@. Perhaps Wf lacks one electron, b. Suppose that b in the actual world was in spacetime position Y. If Wf had been actual, b's-being-at-Y would not have existed on the compositionalist view; one of its constituents would be missing. Hence,W@ would also not exist if Wf had been the case since b's-being-at-Y is contained in W@. The population of possible worlds thus changes from world to world.

If there are no alien particulars, how do we account for the apparent possibility of their having existed? What is the truth-maker for (1)?

(1) It is possible that there should have existed electrons that would be entities distinct from any entity that actually exists.

For a philosopher who thinks of properties as contingent entities that exist only if they are exemplified, there is an analogous problem about alien properties. Presumably there could have been exemplified in the course of history features that are in fact never exhibited in the actual world. Such properties would be alien to the actual world.

For Plantinga, the possibility of alien particulars is accounted for by the existence of individual essences. For each of the additional electrons that would have been added if We had been the case, Plantinga has an individual essence. These individual essences exist necessarily. The electron that would have existed had individual essence E1 been instantiated does not exist, but the existence of such individual essences grounds the possibility of there existing such additional electrons.

Plantinga's individual essences would be problematic for a compositionalist. If the essence of Socrates contains world-indexed properties of the form having-F-in-W@ , Socrates would be a constituent of such an individual essence. That's because Socrates would be a constituent of the actual world and thus a constituent of having-F-in-W@. Hence, the individual essence could not exist in a possible world where Socrates does not exist.

For Armstrong, properties also are truth-makers for a statement like (1), although Armstrong rejects uninstantiated individual essences or uninstantiated simple universals. Armstrong posits difference as an internal relation that holds between all existing entities; that is, each entity is distinct from each entity other than it. Suppose there is also a property of being an electron. If so, Armstrong might suggest (Armstrong 1997, pp. 166-167) that the possibility of being an electron being co-exemplified with difference in relation to all the things that do exist is what makes (1) true. Since Armstrong rejects possible but non-obtaining states of affairs, it is presumably the universals themselves (or their mereological sum) that are the ontological ground for (26).

[Return to States of Affairs.]