Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to States of Affairs

States of Affairs and Abstract Object Theory

1. Encoding

A key notion in accounting for situations and possible worlds in abstract object theory is the notion of encoding. We can approach this by looking at how abstract object theory uses encoding to provide a semantics for fictional discourse.

If we reflect on a statement like (1)

(1) Sherlock Holmes is a detective.

would we say that (1) is true? Sherlock Holmes is merely a fictional character, not a real person. If we agree there is a sense in which (1) is true, what makes it true? Edward Zalta (Zalta 1993) follows Ernst Mally in making the hypothesis that there are two ways of predicating a property of something. The idea is that predication functions differently in (1) than in (2):

(2) Norman Mailer is an author.

(2) predicates a property of a concrete entity, a person. (2) is true because the property predicated by "is an author" actually characterizes the subject. This is abbreviated in predicate logic in the familiar way, where "A" stands for the property of being an author and "m" stands for Mailer:


If we consider how (1) might be true, we might think of the subject of (1), the referent of "Sherlock Holmes" in that context, not as a concrete object but as a character or role. We might think of this entity as encapsulating all the properties that are seemingly attributed to Sherlock Holmes in the Conan Doyle novels. This sort of entity is what Zalta calls an abstract object. What (1) asserts, on this view, is that a certain property, being a detective, is encoded in the abstract object Sherlock Holmes. Interpreted as an encoding predication, (1) might be abbreviated thus:


where "s" denotes the abstract object Sherlock Holmes and "D" stands for the property of being a detective. Sherlock Holmes does exemplify some properties; for example, the property of being an abstract object. But this property is not encoded in Sherlock Holmes; that is, it is no part of what is described of Sherlock Holmes in the Conan Doyle novels. On the contrary, the detective is described as a concrete object, a person. If we consider the sentence (3)

(3) Sherlock Holmes is alive.

this sentence is false if taken as an exemplification statement — Sherlock Holmes was merely a fictional character, an abstract object, and not a living entity — but true if taken as an encoding predication.

Zalta's treatment of states of affairs and possible worlds is developed in the context of the theory of abstract objects.

[Return to discussion of encoding in States of Affairs.]

2. Situations and Worlds

Consider the complex situation that is within the view of Enrique as he surveys the room — the dog is curled up on the chair, the overhead light is on, a stack of ungraded papers sits on the coffee table, and so on. Let us call this complex situation T. Some philosophers (for example, Barwise 1989) would say that T supports or contains a variety of states of affairs — the dog's being curled up on the chair, the stack of papers' sitting on the coffee table, and so on. A situation supports those states of affairs that would be made factual — that would obtain — if that situation is actual.

Zalta proposes that we treat complex situations as abstract objects. But abstract objects encode properties. In order to treat situations and possible worlds as abstract objects, Zalta introduces the notion of a state of affairs (SOA) property; for example, being such that the desk lamp is on. This is a property such that everything whatever exemplifies it just in case the desk lamp's being on obtains. Situations are thus differentiated by the SOA-properties that they "encode."

When the abstract object T is realized or actualized, then the various SOA-properties encoded in it are exemplified, and thus the dog's being curled up on the chair and various other states of affairs obtain. The idea of a situation "supporting" — or "making factual" — a state of affairs is thus unpacked in terms of encoding. In addition to encoding the states of affairs that it supports or makes factual, situations also can exemplify properties, such as being seen by Jack, being distressing to Mary and so on.

Because Zalta takes a state of affairs, S1, to be identical with a state of affairs, S2, just in case the SOA-property of S1 is identical with the SOA-property that corresponds to S2, Zalta allows that necessarily equivalent states of affairs can fail to be identical, thus supporting a fine-grained conception of states of affairs.

Situations, in this sense, may embrace partial segments of the total reality but we might also want to regard a world as a limiting case — an all-encompassing situation.

A possible world is a situation that satisfies an appropriate maximality condition:

(W) A situation W is a world just in case it is possible that W makes factual all and only the obtaining states of affairs.

Given this conception, Zalta is able to show that the uniqueness of the actual world falls out of the axioms of his theory. Zalta argues this is an advantage of the abstract object conception of worlds over a view that treats possible worlds as maximal states of affairs. If a given state of affairs, S1, satisfies the maximality condition specified by Plantinga and Pollock, there will be a distinct but necessarily equivalent state of affairs, S1-and-either-Q-or-not-Q. Hence there will be multiple actual worlds. In reply, Pollock might note that he holds that necessarily equivalent states of affairs are identical; S1-and-either-Q-or-not-Q would thus be identical with S1. Zalta might respond that the principle of the identity of equivalent states of affairs gives us too coarse-grained a conception of states of affairs.

Zalta develops situation theory within an formalized, axiomatic theory of abstract objects. The theory thus derives a series of answers to main issues about situations as consequences of the basic principles of the theory. The abstract object account of situations and worlds has the advantage that it occurs in the context of a theory that provides a uniform treatment of a variety of subjects from fictional discourse to mathematical entities. Abstract object theory includes comprehension principles that provide a rich realm of properties that can be appealed to in a variety of applications.

3. Aliens As Non-Concrete Individuals

We would ordinarily take (4) to be true:

(4) It is possible that Gato should not have existed.

Let W1 be a possible world where Gato would not have existed. If the SOA-property being such that Gato has yellow eyes is a necessarily existing entity, it must exist "in" W1. But if Gato is a constituent of being such that Gato has yellow eyes, then Gato has properties in W1. Assuming that the Principle of Actualism (PA)

(PA) If an item x has any properties, x exists.

is necessarily true, Gato would then exist in W1, which contradicts our hypothesis that W1 is a world where Gato does not exist.

Linsky and Zalta suggest that, in interpreting ordinary talk about particulars like Gato, we interpret "exists" as referring to the property of having a position in spacetime — they call this "being concrete." Thus they re-interpret (4) as:

(4′) It is possible that Gato should have not been concrete.

They thus deny that anything that does exist could have been "missing" from the realm of the existent.

Moreover, there is the possibility of there having existed entities other than the ones that do actually exist, some philosophers will say. This is the problem of entities that are alien to the actual world. Consider (5):

(5) It is possible that there should have existed an individual that is distinct from every individual that exists in W@.

where "W@" designates (rigidly) the actual world. Zalta and Linksy embrace the Barcan Formula, which says:

(BF) ∀xA → □∀xA.
If everything is necessarily A, then necessarily everything is A.

This implies:

(6) ◊∃xAx → ∃xAx
If it is possible that something is A, then something is possibly A.

Hence, (5) would imply:

(7) There exists an individual which is possibly distinct from every individual that exists in W@.

If we assume that nothing is possibly distinct from an individual unless it is distinct from it, (7) will imply the self-inconsistent (8):

(8) There exists an individual which is distinct from every individual that exists.

But Linsky and Zalta would suggest that (7) be re-interpreted as:

(7′) There exists a individual that is possibly distinct from every individual that is concrete in W@.

Thus Gato doesn't become a non-existent individual in W1 but becomes an individual that lacks spatiotemporal position, that is, is non-concrete. This permits quantified modal logic to be developed with a single domain of quantification across all worlds since objects do not "disappear" from one world to the next. Linsky and Zalta argue (Linsky and Zalta 1994) that this approach allows for a much simpler quantified modal logic than alternative actualist approaches. Moreover, there are no alien particulars that don't actually exist, on this approach. There could have existed items in spacetime, in the causal web of the world, other than the ones that do exist in spacetime, but these are not non-existent or non-actual particulars — they are actual, they just aren't in spacetime.

4. Possible Actualist Objections

Actualists are likely to agree that, for concrete particulars, existence in spacetime is what they mean by "exists" or "is actual." But they are also likely to deny that there is any other non-spatiotemporal way that such entities might exist. Philosophers with naturalist sympathies are likely to object to a hypothesis that posits a realm of non-spatiotemporal particulars that can have no causal links with entities in nature. How could Gato exist as anything at all in W1 if no causal conditions for his individuation as a particular obtain in W1? How could Gato exist with no causal dispositions or capacities at all?

The abstract object account of possible worlds and states of affairs, some actualists may say, is committed to entities that aren't actual as they understand "actual" — the abstract object account has a merely verbal agreement with actualism. But if this is the response, then the abstract object account is a challenge to these actualists to articulate more clearly the assumptions of their actualism.

[Return to States of Affairs.]