Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Plato on utopia

1. Guthrie (1987, p. 322).

2. Stalley (1983, p. 3). On authenticity, see Guthrie (1987, pp. 321-2).

3. For discussions of stylometry, see Brandwood (1976, pp. xvi-xviii), (1990), Brandwood in Kraut (1992, pp. 90-120), Kahn (1996, especially pp. 36-70), Keyser (1991), (1992), Ledger (1989), Nails (1992) and Young (1994).

4. Also see Laws 660Dff., 696B-697C and 742D-744A. Note that justice includes wisdom (phronêsis), 631C5-8. There will be citizens, to be sure, in whom the law fails to instill the whole of virtue, but Plato never suggests that the laws fail in the case of every non-philosopher. Indeed, he expects that there will be quite a few successes, see, e.g., Laws 630C, 631CD, 641BC, 647CD, 705E-706A, 707D, 731E-732B, 734E-735A, 742C-743C, 770C-771A, 790B, 807CE, 817BC, 818CD, 822E-823A, 853BC, 876CD, 878AB, 913BC, 921D-922A, 945BE, 946E-947B, and 963A.

The Republic (e.g. 419A-421C) holds that the goal of the laws is to bring about the greatest possible happiness in the city. The Laws (e.g., 631B3-6, 718B2-4, 743C5-6, 806C3-7) still holds that the ultimate end of the legal system is to bring about the greatest possible happiness in the city. This agreement between the Republic and the Laws that the goal of the laws is to make the city or its citizens as happy as possible is compatible with the claim that such happiness is realized in quite different ways in the two dialogues and, in particular, with the idea that they disagree about whether non-philosophical citizens can be become genuinely virtuous.

5. E.g. Saunders (1976, pp. 27-8).

6. Dodds (1973, pp. 209-13), Vlastos (1981, pp. 210-17).

7. Gregory Vlastos (1981, p. 216), for example, suggests that Plato came to think in the Laws that no one, not even a fully virtuous philosopher, could hold autocratic power without being corrupted because of Plato's own final encounter with Dionysus the Younger in Sicily. But this explanation is unsatisfying. Even if Plato had thought that Dionysus was well-brought up, fully virtuous, and possessed full philosophical understanding, it would be rash to generalize from this one case to all possible cases. But Plato thought that Dionysus was badly brought up (Epist. VII 332CD) and had a low opinion of his philosophical knowledge (Epist. VII 338D-339B, 340B-341B, 344D-345C).  (This assumes, for the sake of the argument, that the Seventh Letter is genuine and that it gives us direct insight into Plato's state of mind. On the latter point, see Annas (1999, pp. 72-7.)) It would thus be irrational for Plato to generalize from his experience with Dionysus to the capacities of all human beings. Dion would come closer to Plato's ideal (although his early upbringing must have been somewhat defective, Epist. VII 327B1-4) and Vlastos (1981, p. 216, n. 29) plausibly suggests that Plato did not think that Dion was an autocrat corrupted by power, but was a good man who came to grief because of his associates' villainy (Epist. VII 351DE).

8. Bobonich (2002). For others who think that there are significant differences between the Republic and the late dialogues on some important points, especially the education of the citizens, see Cooper (1999, pp. 165-91), Irwin (1995, pp. 349-53) and the nuanced accounts of Laks (1990), (2000).

9. Plato's ranking here is:  in first place, full communism throughout the entire citizen body; in second place, the constitution of Magnesia that they are now describing (Laws 739E, 807B and 875D); in third place, constitutions approximating the second best one in less favorable circumstances. See Barker (1960, pp. 370-1 n. 2). The point that this is not the ideal of the Republic was rightly noted long ago by Natorp and recently reemphasized by André Laks (2001). Barker's (1960, p. 251 n. 1, pp. 370-1 n. 1) only reason for rejecting what he agrees is the clear meaning of the text is that he cannot accept that Plato could have a higher ideal than the Republic.

10. Laws 737Eff. and see Brunt (1993, p. 247). Golding and Golding (1975, p. 353) estimate Magnesia's population at about 50,000 plus resident aliens.

11. On land ownership in Magnesia, see Morrow (1960, pp. 105-7). For limitations on the lotholder's testamentary powers, see Laws 877CE and 923Aff.

12. Laws 955E3-4 and 847E2-848B6; also see Morrow (1960, pp. 395-6).

13. Some have interpreted Plato to mean that the highest class has only between two and three times the value of the lot, i.e. their total property taking the notional value of the lot into account would be worth up to four times the value of the lot. The interpretation that they may have movable assets up to four times the value of the lot is held by Aristotle (Politics 1265b22 and 1266b7) and is convincingly argued for by Morrow (1960, p. 131 n. 112). This is important, since the other interpretation reduces the lowest class to the level of subsistence farmers and thus significantly reduces their chances for political participation or leisurely activity.

14. See Morrow (1960, p. 112-3).

15. The legal and social status of women in Magnesia is not entirely clear, for good treatments, see Cohen (1987), Okin (1979), and Saunders (1995). For more discussion with further references see Bobonich (2002, pp. 384-91).

16. On the Assembly, see Morrow (1960, pp. 156-65, 174-6 and 229) and Piérart (1973, pp. 89-121).

17. Morrow (1960, pp. 195-215) and Piérart (1973, pp. 152-208).

18. For discussion with references, see Bobonich (2002, pp. 395-408) and Saunders (1995).

19. For (i), see Stalley (1994, p. 171 n. 65); for (ii) Laks (1991). For recent discussions of the preludes and related issues, see Bobonich (2002, pp. 97-119), Cooper (1999, pp. 184-90), Irwin (1995, pp. 349-53), Laks (1990), (1991), Nightingale (1993), (1999), Stalley (1994), and van Harten (forthcoming).

20. For a defense of (II), see Bobonich (2002, pp. 41-88) with discussion of and references to opposing points of view. Among such opposing views, see especially Kamtekar (1998) and Kraut (1973).

21. See especially Cooper (1999, pp. 165-91).

22. “Nocturnal Council” is by now traditional, but “Dawn Council” would be a more accurate translation and would avoid the sinister connotations of the former

23. Barker (1960, pp. 406-10) and Klosko (1988).

24. Klosko (1988, p. 85).

25. Laws 875A1-C3, on the Laws’ provisions against unchecked power, see Morrow (1960, pp. 521-43).

26. Morrow (1960, pp. 500-18).

27. For a fine discussion of what he calls the “documentary fallacy,” see Saunders (1995).

28. This claim is stated only roughly here, the issues that it raises are complex. For further discussion, see Bobonich (2002, pp. 418-73) and for a related point concerning Aristotle's political theory, see Irwin (1990).

29. For a spirited rejection of this claim, see Annas (1999).

30. For one attempt to do so, see Bobonich (2002).

31. A group of four -- Parmenides, Phaedrus, Republic, and Theaetetus -- are stylistically similar to each other and are closer to the late group of six than they are to the remaining dialogues. Most scholars taking other considerations into account go further than this with regards to dating. Even Kahn (1996, pp. 47-8) finds it reasonable to date the Phaedrus and the Theaetetus in that order between the Republic and the late group of six. The following scholars (in addition to Kahn) accept that the Phaedrus and the Theaetetus occur in that order between the Republic and the late group of six: Guthrie (1987, vol. 4, pp. 50-1), Kraut in Kraut (1992, pp. 46 n. 57, 47 n. 61), Ross (1953, p. 10) and Vlastos (1991, pp. 46-7). Brandwood (1976, p. xvii) and Ledger (1989, pp. 224-5) accept this order, except for placing the Theaetetus just before the Phaedrus. For further discussion of the Phaedrus’ date, see de Vries (1969, pp. 7-11), Nussbaum (1986, pp. 465 n. 7, 470-1 n. 5), and Rowe (1986b, pp. 13-4). I would like to thank Corinne Gartner for her help in turning my text into a webpage.