Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Perfectionism in Moral and Political Philosophy

1. It may be true that the best life for a human being is the life that is best in terms of well-being for that human being. But this claim is a substantive claim, not a conceptual one. The distinction between a successful life and a life that is best in terms of well-being is suggested by Scanlon. See Scanlon (1998), 112.

2. The distinction between human nature and objective goods perfectionism drawn here tracks the distinction between narrow and broad perfectionism suggested by Hurka (1993), 4.

3. Sidgwick (1907) claims that no moralist would recommend that a person sacrifice his own perfection for the sake of perfecting of others. But Sidgwick here views moral virtue as the key component of perfection. He is, accordingly, rejecting the thought that morality requires us to sacrifice our own virtue for the sake of promoting it in others.

4. The idea of an agent-centered prerogative was introduced by Scheffler (1982); and its implications for consequentialism are explored in the debate between Kagan (1989) and Scheffler (1991).

5. That is, we should weight an equal unit increase in perfection more the greater the perfection already achieved in a human life. (Hurka 1993, 77).

6. Defenders of state neutrality differ as to which political decisions the constraint applies to: to all political decisions, to constitutional issues only, to coercive laws and policies, etc. This complication is ignored here.

7. It is common to mention the view that the consequences of state action should be neutral between conceptions of the good. Here the constraint is formulated in terms of neutrality of effect. But proponents of state neutrality generally mention this view to put it to one side.

8. It is possible to distinguish the doctrine that the state should not take sides between different conceptions of the good from the doctrine that enjoins the exclusion of ideals from political justification (Raz 1986, 108-109). In this entry, the doctrine of state neutrality is construed to include both of these more specific doctrines.

9. To make the example cleaner, we can stipulate that the money for the subsidy is raised by a voluntary state-run lottery.

10. For a fuller development of this point see the distinction between state-centered and multi-centered perfectionism in Chan (2000).