# Peirce's Logic

*First published Fri Dec 15, 1995; substantive revision Thu Aug 30, 2007*

Charles Peirce's contributions to logical theory are numerous and profound. His work on relations building on ideas of De Morgan influenced Schroder, and through Schroder, Peano, Russell, Lowenheim and much of contemporary logical theory. Although Frege anticipated much of Peirce's work on relations and quantification theory, and to some extent developed it to a greater extent, Frege's work remained out of the mainstream until the twentieth century. Thus it is plausible that Peirce's influence on the development of logic has been of the same order as Frege's. Further discussion of Peirce's influence can be found in Dipert (1995).

In contrast to Frege's highly systematic and thoroughly developed work in logic, Peirce's work remains fragmentary and extensive, rich with profound ideas but most of them left in a rough and incomplete form. Three of the Peirce's contributions to logic that are not as well-known as others are described below:

- 1. Three-Valued Logic
- 2. Calculus of Relations
- 3. Existential Graphs
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

Among Peirce's other contributions to logic are: (i) quantification theory (see Peirce (1885) and Berry (1952)), (ii) propositional logic (see Berry (1952)), (iii) Boolean algebra (see Lewis (1918)), and (iv) “Peirce's Remarkable Theorem” (see Herzberger (1981) and Berry (1952)).

## 1. Three-Valued Logic

In three unnumbered pages from his unpublished notes written before 1910, Peirce developed what amounts to a semantics for three-valued logic. This is at least ten years before Emil Post's dissertation, which is usually cited as the origin of three-valued logic. A good source of information about these three pages is Fisch and Turquette (1966), which also includes reproductions of the three pages from Peirce's notes.

In his notes, Peirce experiments with three symbols representing
truth values: *V*, *L*, and *F*. He associates
*V* with “1” and “*T*”,
indicating truth. He associates *F* with “0” and
“*F*”, indicating falsehood. He associates
*L* with “1/2” and “*N*”,
indicating perhaps an intermediate or unknown value.

Peirce defines a large number of unary and binary operators on these three truth values. The semantics for the operators is indicated by truth tables. Two examples are given here. First, the bar operator (indicated here by a minus sign) is defined as follows:

xVLF− xFLV

Applied to truth the bar operator yields falsehood, applied to unknown it yields unknown and applied to falsehood it yields truth.

The *Z* operator is a binary operator which Peirce defines as
follows:

VLFVVLFLLLFFFFF

Thus, the *Z* operator applied to a falsehood and anything else
yields a falsehood. The *Z* operator applied to an unknown and
anything but a falsehood yields an unknown. And the *Z* operator
applied to a truth and some other value yields the other value.

The bar operator and the *Z* operator provide the essentials
of a truth-functionally complete strong Kleene semantics for
three-valued logic. In addition to these two strong Kleene operators,
Peirce defines several other forms of negation, conjunction, and
disjunction. The notes also provide some basic properties of some of
the operators, such as being symmetric and being associative.

## 2. Calculus of Relations

Building on ideas of De Morgan, Peirce fruitfully applied the concepts of Boolean algebra to relations. Boolean algebra is concerned with operations on general or class terms. Peirce applied the same idea to what he called “relatives” or “relative terms.” While his ideas evolved continually over time on this subject, fairly definitive presentations are found in Peirce (1870) and Peirce (1883). The calculus of relatives is developed further in Tarski (1941). A history of work on the subject is Maddux (1990).

Given relative terms such as “friend of” and
“enemy of” (more briefly “*f*” and
“*e*”), Peirce studied various operations on these
terms such as the following:

(union) friend of or enemy of

A pair <*a*, *b*> stands in this relation if and
only if it stands in one or both of the relations. In symbols
“*f* + *e*”.

(intersection) friend of and enemy of

A pair <*a*, *b*> stands in this relation if and
only if it stands in both of the relations. In symbols
“*f* . *e*”.

(relative product) friend of an enemy of

A pair <*a*, *b*> stands in this relation if and
only if there is a *c* such that *a* is a friend of *c*
and c is an enemy of *b*. In symbols “*f* ;
*e*”.

(relative sum) friend of every non-enemy of

A pair <*a*, *b*> stands in this relation if and
only if *a* is a friend of every object *c* that is not an
enemy of *b*. In symbols “*f* ,
*e*” (Peirce uses a dagger rather than a comma)

(complement) is not a friend of

A pair <*a*, *b*> stands in this relation if and
only if <*a*, *b*> does not stand in the friend-of
relation. In symbols “-*f*” (Peirce places a bar
over the relative term).

(converse) is one to whom the other is friend

A pair <*a*, *b*> stands in this relation if and
only if *b* is a friend of *a*. In symbols
“~*f*” (Peirce places an upwards facing semi-circle
over the relative term).

Peirce presented numerous theorems involving his operations on relative terms. Examples of the numerous such laws identified by Peirce are:

~( r+s)= ~ r+ ~s−( r;s)= − r, −s( r.s) ,t= ( r,t) . (s,t)

Peirce's calculus of relations has been criticized for remaining unnecessarily tied to previous work on Boolean algebra and the equational paradigm in mathematics. It has been frequently claimed that real progress in logic was only realized in the work of Frege and later work of Peirce in which the equational paradigm was dropped and the powerful expressive ability of quantification theory was realized.

Nevertheless, Peirce's calculus of relations has remained a topic of interest to this day as an alternative, algebraic approach to the logic of relations. It has been studied by Lowenheim, Tarski and others. Lowenheim's famous theorem was originally a result about the calculus of relations rather than quantification theory, as it is usually presented today. Some of the subsequent work on the calculus of relations is outlined in Maddux (1990).

## 3. Existential Graphs

Following his development of quantification theory, Peirce developed a graphical system for analyzing logical reasoning that he felt was superior in analytical power to his algebraic and quantificational notations. A large portion of this material is reprinted as volume 4, book 2 of Peirce (1933) and is discussed, for example, in Roberts (1964), Roberts (1973), Zeman (1964) and Hammer (1996). This system of “existential graphs” encompassed propositional logic, first-order logic with identity, higher-order logic, and modal logic.

The “alpha” portion of the system of existential graphs is concerned with propositional logic. Conjunction is indicated by juxtaposing graphs next to one another. Negation is indicated by enclosing a graph within an enclosed circle or other closed figure, which Peirce calls a “cut.” Here (and occasionally in Peirce's writings) cuts will be indicated by matching parentheses. So

(P)

is equivalent to “not *P*”, and

(P(Q))

is equivalent to “if *P* then *Q*”. Observe
that this is the same graph as

((Q)P)

because order is irrelevant. Juxtaposition and enclosure are the only relevant logical operations. Peirce provides five elegant rules of inference that form a complete set. The rules are Insertion in Odd, Erasure in Even, Iteration, Deiteration, and Double Cut.

Insertion in Odd

Any graph can be added to an area enclosed within an odd number of cuts.

The following table gives some examples of this rule:

(( B))( A(B(C)))( A)(( B)A)( A(B(CD)))(( B)A)

In the first case from “not not *B*”, “if
*A* then *B*” is obtained. In the second case from
“if *A*, then both *B* and not *C*”,
“if *A*, then both *B* and not both *C* and
*D*” is obtained. In the third case from “not
*A*”, “if *A* then *B*” is
obtained.

Erasure in Even

Any graph can be erased that occurs within an even number of cuts.

The following table gives some examples of this rule:

(A(B)) ( A(B(C)))B(A)( A( ))( A( (C)))B

In the first case from “if *A* then *B*”,
“if *A* then true” is obtained. In the second case
from “if *A*, then both *B* and not
*C*”, “if *A*, then not *C*” is
obtained. In the third case from “not *A* and
*B*”, “*B*” is obtained.

Iteration

Any graph can be recopied to any other area that occurs within all the cuts the original occurs within.

Here are some examples of Iteration:

( A(B))( ( A) (B) )B(A)( A(AB))( ( A) (B(A)) )B(A)B(A)

In the first case from “if *A* then *B*”,
“if *A* then both *A* and *B*” is
obtained. In the second case from “If not *A* then
*B*”, “if not *A* then both *B* and
not *A*” is obtained. In the third case from
“*B* and not *A*”, “*B* and not
*A* and *B* and not *A*” is obtained.

Deiteration

Any graph that could have been obtained by iteration can be erased.

Here are some examples of Deiteration:

( A(AB))( ( A) (B(A)) )B(A)B(A)( A(B))( ( A) (B) )B(A)

These are just the exact converses of the examples of Iteration.

Double cut

Two cuts can be put immediately around any graph, and two cuts immediately around any graph can be erased.

Here are some examples of Double Cut:

( A(B))( A)(( B))(A)((( A))(B))((( A)))B(A)

From “if *A* then *B*”, “if not not
*A*, then *B*” is obtained. From “not
*A*”, “not not not *A*” is obtained.
From “not not *B* and not *A*”,
“*B* and not *A*” is obtained.

A proof of modus ponens:

P( P(Q))premises: (i) if PthenQ. (ii)PP( ( Q))Deiteration PQDouble Cut QErasure in Even

A proof of “if *A*, then if *B* then
*A*”:

(( )) Double Cut ( A( ))Insertion in Odd ( A(A))Iteration ( A( ((A)) ))Double Cut ( A( (B(A)) ))Insertion in Odd

A proof of “if not *B* then not *A*” from
“if *A* then *B*”:

( A(B))premise ( (( A)) (B))Double Cut

Finally, a proof of “if *A* then *C*” from
“if *A* then *B*” and “if *B*
then *C*”:

( A(B)) (B(C))premises ( A(B(B(C)) )) (B(C))Iteration ( A(B(B(C)) ))Erasure in Even ( A(B( (C)) ))Deiteration ( A(BC))Double Cut ( A(C))Erasure in Even

The “beta” portion of Peirce's system of existential graphs is equivalent to first-order logic with identity. It does not use variables to fill the argument places of predicates. Instead, the argument places are filled by drawn lines. Two or more such argument places can be identified (analogous to filling them with the same variable) by connecting them with a drawn line. These “lines of identity” play the role of quantifiers as well as variables. The order of interpretation of the various lines of identity and cuts of a beta graph is determined by the portions of lines of identity that are enclosed within the fewest cuts. Elements enclosed by fewest cuts are interpreted before more deeply embedded elements. Rules of inference for the beta portion are generalizations of the rules for the alpha portion. They allow lines of identity to be manipulated in various ways, such as erasing portions of lines connecting loose ends, extending loose ends, and retracting loose ends. More information about the beta portion of the system of existential graphs can be found in Roberts (1973).

## Bibliography

- Berry, George D. W. (1952) “Peirce's Contributions to the
Logic of Statements and Quantifiers.” In P. Wiener and F. Young
(Eds.)
*Studies in the Philosophy of Charles S. Peirce*Cambridge: Harvard University Press. - Burch, Robert W. (1991)
*A Peircean Reduction Thesis*. Texas Tech University Press. - Dipert, Randall (1995) “Peirce's Underestimated Role in the
History of Logic.” In Kenneth Ketner (Ed.)
*Peirce and Contemporary Thought*. New York: Fordham University Press. - Fisch, Max and Atwell Turquette (1966) “Peirce's Triadic
Logic.”
*Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society*11: 71 - 85. - Hammer, Eric M. (1998) “Semantics for Existential
Graphs.”
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*27: 489 - 503. - Herzberger, Hans (1981) “Peirce's Remarkable Theorem.”
In L. W. Sumner, J. G. Slater, and F. Wilson (Eds.)
*Pragmatism and Purpose: Essays Presented to Thomas A. Goudge*Toronto: University of Toronto Press. - Lewis, C. I. (1918)
*A Survey of Symbolic Logic.*Berkeley: University of California Press. - Maddux, Roger D. (1990) “The Origin of Relation Algebras in
the Development and Axiomatization of the Calculus of Relations.”
*Studia Logica*3: 421 - 55. - Peirce, Charles S. (1870) “Description of a Notation for the
Logic of Relatives, Resulting from an Amplification of the Conceptions
of Boole's Calculus of Logic.”
*Memoirs of the American Academy of Sciences*9: 317 - 78. Reprinted in Peirce (1933). - Peirce, Charles S. (1883) “Note B: The Logic of
Relatives.” In
*Studies in Logic by Members of the Johns Hopkins University*Boston: Little Brown and Co. Reprinted in Peirce (1933). - Peirce, Charles S. (1885) “On the Algebra of Logic; A
Contribution to the Philosophy of Notation.”
*American Journal of Mathematics*7: 180 - 202. Reprinted in Peirce (1933). - Peirce, Charles S. (1933) “Collected Papers.” Edited by
Charles Hartshorne and Paul Weiss. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
In Edward Moore and Richard Robin (Eds.)
*Studies in the Philosophy of Charles S. Peirce*., Amherst, University of Massachusetts Press. - Roberts, Don (1964) “The Existential Graphs and Natural
Deduction.” In Edward Moore and Richard Robin (Eds.)
*Studies in the Philosophy of Charles S. Peirce*, Amherst, University of Massachusetts Press. - Roberts, Don (1973)
*The Existential Graphs of Charles S. Peirce*. Mouton and Co. - Tarski, Alfred (1941) “On the Calculus of Relations.”
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*6: 73 - 89. - Zeman, J. Jay (1964)
*The Graphical Logic of C. S. Peirce*. Ph.D. Diss., University of Chicago.

## Other Internet Resources

- The MacTutor History of Mathematics Archive, (University of St. Andrew's, Scotland)
- Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society: A Quarterly Journal in American Philosophy
- Peirce Edition Project, (Directed by Nathan Houser, Indiana University Purdue University Indianapolis)