Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to William of Ockham

1. For an account of Ockham's life, including a discussion of how these dates are calculated in Ockham's case, see Wood [1997], Chap. 1. For further details of Ockham's life, see Courtenay [1999].

2. Earlier biographies generally put the date in 1285, but scholars now put it later. The modern English spelling of the village's name is ‘Ockham’, although because of the distinguished prominence of several French medievalists early in the twentieth century, one still occasionally sees the spelling ‘Occam’. One also sometimes sees his name without the ‘of’, treating ‘Ockham’ as a surname rather than a place name. See, e.g., the title of Adams [1987].

3. By this time Latin was virtually no one's native language. Ockham's first language was probably Middle English or French. Latin was exclusively a second language that lived primarily in very specialized and artificial contexts: academic, ecclesiastical, legal, diplomatic. This fact suggests that it is probably wrong to look for “ordinary language” considerations in the Latin philosophical writings of this period, whether by Ockham or anyone else.

4. The technical term is ‘oblatus’ (“offered”); Ockham was an “oblate.” Although this perhaps sounds shocking to us, like giving away one's children, in fact the practice was quite common and amounted to little more than sending one's child to boarding school. Various religious schools would often take in children from the surrounding area, educate them, feed and house them. The children were not necessarily expected to pursue a religious vocation later in life, although many of them did. For families that were not especially wealthy, this practice was a good way to educate their children. Moreover, it offered the possibility of social mobility, since the Church was probably the only institution of the day where it was possible to advance on the basis of hard work and one's own native talent, regardless of social origins. (Even for wealthy families, the practice provided a good solution to the problem posed by primogeniture: what to do with the second son.)

5. Ockham's accuser may have been John Lutterell, who had been Chancellor at the University of Oxford for a while. Recall that the Papacy at this time, together with all the offices and bureaucracy that went with it, was not located in Rome, but at Avignon, a moderate-sized town in southeastern France, on the Rhone River. It was there between 1309 and 1377.

6. It is not certain that Ockham had ever actually been ordered to stay in Avignon. Michael of Cesena later on claimed that this was an utter fabrication (Wood [1997], p. 10 n. 21). Note that Ockham was excommunicated for his actions, not for his views.

7. With the possible exception of two short works on logic—Lesser Treatise on Logic (Tractatus minor logicae) and Primer of Logic (Elementarium logicae)—the authenticity of which has been questioned.

8. One still often sees it stated that Ockham died in 1349. But Gál [1982] convincingly establishes the correct date as 1347.

9. There are two doubtful exceptions, the Lesser Treatise on Logic and the Primer of Logic, which appear to be late and may not be authentic. See note 7 above.

10. A complete list of Ockham's works, with information on modern editions and English translations, can be found in Spade [1999], pp. 4-11. References below to the works will be made using the titles, abbreviations, internal divisions and other conventions specified in Spade [1999], xv-xvii. The Dialogue is being published in an on-line web edition and English translation by the British Academy, available at (in progress).

11. Ockham's treatment of insolubilia (paradoxes like the Liar Paradox), for instance, appears to be copied wholesale from Walter Burley (Spade [1974]), and his account of the semantics of relative pronouns as well as the machinery (although not the underlying semantics) of his theory of supposition are likewise derived from Burley (Brown [1972]). Important details of his theory of truth conditions for tensed and modal propositions likewise already appear in Burley, although this may reflect more a “British,” as distinct from a “Continental,” way of formulating these conditions (Spade [1980], section III, pp. 13-22).

12. For example, his theory of topical “middles” and their role in his theory of consequence. See Normore [1999], p. 46.

13. In medieval terminology, “hypothetical” propositions included more than conditionals. The distinction between categorical and hypothetical propositions is approximately the same as the modern distinction between atomic and molecular propositions—with one important difference: the negation of an atomic proposition is molecular, whereas the negation of a categorical proposition is still categorical, not hypothetical. A hypothetical proposition requires two or more categorical components.

14. Ockham's treatment of modal syllogistic is fuller and more complete than any of his predecessors', and is a significant achievement. See Normore [1999], p. 33.

15. This notion of signification is ultimately derived from Aristotle, On Interpretation 3, 16b19-21. (See also Augustine, De doctrina christiana, II.1.1.) Although it is tempting, one should be wary of treating signification in the medieval sense as “meaning.” Signification is a kind of causal relation and is therefore transitive, a fact that some authors acknowledged explicitly; whatever we nowadays mean by “meaning,” it is not typically transitive. See Spade [1996], Chap 3, at pp. 82-84.

16. See Spade [1975a] for a discussion of the implications of this.

17. This way of putting the matter suggests that Ockham sees no problem with referring to non-existent objects by means of demonstratives. But the secondary literature is not agreed on this. See Normore [1975] and Karger [1976].

18. These first approximations are not strictly correct, but will serve as a start. In fact, matters are greatly complicated by considerations that go beyond the scope of this article. For a discussion, see Spade [1975] and [1996], Chap. 7. See also the discussion of mental language below.

19. This ignores a prior division Ockham and others make, between “proper” and “improper” supposition. Improper supposition is in effect metaphorical or figurative reference. Medieval semantics did not have a good theory of metaphor, so that this part of supposition theory remained undeveloped, by Ockham and others, beyond a few sketchy remarks. Ockham's three main kinds of supposition were not original, and were in fact fairly standard among medieval logicians, although his way of defining them reflects peculiarities of his own theory of signification. The origins of supposition theory are not yet well understood, although the terminology of “personal” supposition suggests that it had something to do with theological considerations about “person” vs. “nature” in Trinitarian and Christological theory.

20. Note that the subject of ‘Every dog is a mammal’ and of ‘Dog has three letters’ is (apart from the quantifier in the former) exactly the same term. Medieval logic did not have quotation mark conventions, which were not regularly used until after the invention of printing, and the theory of material supposition provided a substitute for them. But material supposition had other uses that cannot be easily handled by quotation marks. For example, in ‘It is possible for him to run’, according to Ockham and many other medieval logicians, the expression ‘for him to run’ has material supposition not for itself but for the proposition ‘He runs’ or ‘He is running’.

21. For details of these claims, see Spade [1988].

22. Other contributors to the theory of mental language include John Buridan and, later, Peter of Ailly. Curiously, the main work in this area seems to have been done exclusively by nominalists.

23. For details of the following discussion, see Spade [1975] and Spade [1996], Chap. 7. For a nuanced critique of some of the details presented there (and here), see especially Panaccio [2004].

24. For example, proper names of individuals and the names of the Aristotelian categories. The reasons for these exceptions need not detain us here.

25. This tells us that the real definitions of absolute terms will be complex connotative expressions.

26. For interesting discussions of the history of “Ockham's Razor,” see Brampton [1964], and Maurer [1978] and [1984].

27. The story of this change of heart is told in Boehner [1946]. For a penetrating discussion of the reasons behind Ockham's change of heart, see Panaccio [2004], pp. 23-27.

28. For more on the theory of exposition and its relation to connotation theory, see Spade [1990], and Ashworth and Spade [1992].

29. For a detailed discussion of Ockham's procedure in a wide variety of cases, see Adams [1987], especially “Part One: Ontology” (pp. 3-313) and “Part Four: Natural Philosophy” (pp. 633-899).

30. For opposite viewpoints, contrast Adams [1987], Chap. 9 (pp. 287-313), and Spade [1998].

31. In addition to the Exposition and the Questions on Aristotle's Book of the Physics, cited earlier, Ockham wrote:

plus occasional treatises:

In addition, there is much material relevant to natural philosophy in the Quodlibets and in the Commentary on the Sentences.

32. Translated in Boehner [1990], Chap. 1. Ockham also treats this question in Sent. I, d. 2, q. 4, translated in Spade [1994], pp. 114-48, where he is arguing against Walter Burley, who explicitly held that one reason we need universals in our ontology is to make science (in the Aristotelian sense) possible.

33. With this section, and for much further detail on Ockham's physics, see Goddu [1984] and [1999].

34. ‘Species’ in this sense should not be confused with species as opposed to genus. In the present usage, ‘species’ means something like “appearance.” English preserves traces of this meaning in our term ‘specious’.

35. Stump [1999], p. 170.

36. That last step is the difficult one, and the one over the details of which medieval authors disagree the most. It goes without saying that many details of the epistemological story are omitted from this quick sketch.

37. E.g., Quodl. V.4. Note the use of Ockham's Razor.

38. E.g., Sent. II.13.

39. Stump [1999], p. 178, argues that this “filtering” account of what the agent intellect does is not the theory held by someone like, say, Aquinas. But there is another consideration. Although the present author knows of no passage where Ockham himself argues this way, it is worth noting once again that the theory of species requires that the same structure or configuration be entirely and simultaneously (although with different “encodings”) in several things at once—in the original object, in the sense organ, perhaps in an intervening medium, etc. In short, species themselves look very much like universals, and so are unacceptable for Ockham the nominalist, quite apart from how one interprets the activity of the agent intellect.

40. For a discussion, see Tachau [1988].

41. Sent. I, Prologue, q. 1. Translation by the present author.

42. The issue is argued in Stump [1999] (who defends the “standard” view) and Karger [1999] (who argues against it).

43. This point is developed in McGrade [1999], in terms of what he calls “implicit divine command.”

44. The text is translated with an informative introduction and commentary in Wood [1997].

45. For a discussion of the issues in this passage, and for much else about Ockham's moral theory, see Adams [1986], Freppert [1988], Wood [1997], King [1999].

46. This remark needs to be carefully qualified, since Aquinas's moral psychology is very subtle. But this is not the place to do it.

47. See, e.g., Maurer [1962], pp. 285-86.

48. Duns Scotus allowed that we can choose not to act toward our ultimate good; but he did not think we can knowingly choose to act directly against it. For a discussion of Aquinas, Scotus, Ockham and others on these issues, see Adams [1999].

49. McGrade [1999] argues that this difference does not represent a real change of mind on Ockham's part, but instead only a shift of emphasis. See note 43 above.

50. Note that the Franciscan ideal of poverty did not imply that there was anything morally wrong with property, that property was evil, either individually or collectively. Poverty was not a duty but a “counsel of perfection.” That is, it is perfectly acceptable to own property, but it is better—more perfect—not to have any. St. Francis seems to have wanted his friars not just to do their duty, but to go beyond that and be perfect as far as possible. The issue was not, therefore, strictly a moral one.

51. Mollat [1963], p. 16.

52. For this entire discussion of Ockham's political theory, the author is greatly indebted to Kilcullen [1999].