Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Occasionalism

1. Note that some argue that al-Ghazālī was actually not an occasionalist. See Dutton note 1.

2. This description is actually a summary that Ibn Rushd (Averroes) presents in his TT 316. The corresponding passage in al-Ghazali's Incoherence appears to be TF 170.

3. Gabriel Biel (c. 1425-1495), one of the last of the great Scholastics, has also at times been identified as an occasionalist. For instance, see Freddoso 1998, 81-83. Freddoso cites a very interesting summary of Biel's view on causation from Molina's Concordia 159-60 (“De Concursu Dei generali,” Q. 14., A. 13, disp. 25). Here is the passage in question:

He is of the opinion that secondary causes bring about nothing at all, but that God by Himself alone produces all the effects in them and in their presence, so that fire does not produce heat and the sun does not give light, but instead it is God who produces these effects in them and in their presence. Hence … he claims that secondary causes are not properly causes in the sense of having an influence on the effect; for it is only the First Cause which he affirms to be a cause in this sense, whereas secondary causes, he claims, should be called causes sine qua non, insofar as God has decided not to produce the effect except when they are present. … He also asserts with Peter D’Ailly that when God produces an effect in conjunction with fire, He contributes no less than He would contribute were He to produce the same effect by Himself—in fact, He brings about more, since not only does He produce the heat with a concurrence just as great as if the fire were not present, but He also brings it about that the fire too is in its own way a cause of the heat (The translation is Freddoso's).

Though the beginning of the paragraph strongly suggests that Biel was indeed an occasionalist, it is curious that in the latter half of the paragraph he is identified with Peter D’Ailly as asserting that “fire too is in its own way a cause of the heat.” That Biel held with D’Ailly that “God brings it about that fire too is in its own way a cause of the heat” suggests that Biel held that certain natural effects are causally overdetermined by God and the creature. If so, this raises questions about how consistently Biel was committed to occasionalism.

4. For instance, see Garber 1993 and Hatfield 1979.

5. For instance, see Della Rocca 1999 and Schmaltz 2008a.

6. Much work on this topic has been done by Steven Nadler. See Nadler 1993b, 1996, 1998, and 1999.

7. See Lisa Downing 2004.

8. A particular issue of recent interpretive interest is whether minds for Berkeley have causal powers to move their own bodies. See Pitcher 1981 and Jeffrey McDonough forthcoming. For a more general discussion on Berkeley's views on the activity of spirits, see Adams 1973.

9. Occasionalists and “pre-established harmonists” do not deny the causal activity that the infinite substance, God, exerts on finite substances. Thus they affirm inter-substantial causation, insofar as the causal agent is God.

10. Historically speaking, it has not been an easy proposition to come up with a convincing account of how this joint causal activity between God and the creature is supposed to work. On the concurrentist account, God obviously is doing more than merely conserving the being of the creature along with its power. For God is in some sense causally active in bringing about the effect in a direct manner. However, this direct causal activity of God must differ from the way in which God is the sole direct cause of the effect, which is how the occasionalist regards the divine causal activity in question. In what sense God is doing more but not as much as the occasionalist's account has been the topic of much discussion and disagreement. In fact, Malebranche shrewdly points out in Elucidation 15 that the disagreement is so great that “[w]hen people who have no special interest preventing them from agreeing cannot agree, it is a sure sign that they have no clear idea of what they are saying” (Search 658).

11. One way to understand the relation between these arguments is to divide them into two groups, local and global. By “local” arguments, I mean arguments that aim to establish the occasionalist conclusion for the particular type of substance involved. By “global”, I mean arguments that intend to establish the occasionalist conclusion for all created substances, regardless of which type of substance they are. The “passive nature” (PN) and “no knowledge” (NK) arguments fall into the first category, and the “no necessary connection” (NNC) and the “conservation is but continuous creation” (CCC) arguments fall into the latter category.

12. Parts of this section have been incorporated from Lee 2007.

13. Therefore, someone who does not share the Cartesian conception of the nature of bodies as being exhausted by extension would not be in a position to endorse the PN argument.

14. Descartes, Principles of Philosophy II §4, AT VIII 42.

15. In the same section, Malebranche describes the asymmetry between rest and motion in the following manner: “The will of the Author of nature, which creates the power and force that each body has for continuing in the state it is in, concerns only motion and not rest, since bodies have no power whatsoever in themselves” (OCM II 432/Search 517). Note that this seems to be in tension with what Descartes says in the Principles II, §§24-37 (AT VIII, 53-62).

16. I follow Jolley (“Introduction” to the Dialogues) and Nadler 1999 in referring to this argument as the “no knowledge” argument.

17. I follow Nadler 1996 in referring to the argument in this way.

18. For instance, the cotton fibers could be momentarily turned into steel in a miraculous manner as it comes into contact with the fire.

19. Are the necessary connections being discussed here logically necessary connections? Malebranche does not deny that the essences of creatures logically entail certain constraints for divine causal activity. For instance, in the Dialogues, Malebranche notes that the nature of bodies—their impenetrability—obliges God, with “a kind of necessity,” to move bodies when they collide. But he also states that “it is clear that impenetrability has no efficacy of its own and that it can merely provide God, who treats things according to their nature, with an occasion to diversify His action” (Dialogues VII, §XII, p.118-9). So, while certain events might logically necessitate some sort of divine action and, hence, be an occasion for God to act, they are not themselves causally efficacious, according to Malebranche. So I take the necessitation in this passage from the Search to be causal in nature, and not simply logical. The interesting and complex issue of how Malebranche understands the relation between causal necessitation and logical necessitation requires further discussion and cannot be done full justice here. Of particular importance is how to understand the connection that obtains between divine volitions and their effects. It is at least a logically necessary connection, since it is a logically necessary truth for Malebranche that if God wills p, p obtains (insofar as p itself is not inconsistent). But there has to be more going on, since, as we have just seen above, the nature of bodies also obliges with this type of necessity—that is, logical necessity—but such obliging falls short of genuine causation, a shortcoming that does not apply to divine volitions.

20. For more on this weakness of the NNC argument and its relation to the CCC argument in Malebranche, see Lee forthcoming.

21. Durandus is an exception.

22. Also see Principles, Part 1. art. 62.

23. Quoted from Nadler 1998 JHP p.218-9. Translation is Nadler's. La Forge Traité de l’esprit de l’homme in Oeuvres philosophiques, ed. Pierre Clair (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1974; hereafter, Traité), 241.

24. The concurrentist might think that even in the case of the initial creation of the world ex nihilo, while the being or esse of the creature are brought about ex nihilo by God, the modes the creature possesses at creation are the result of the concurrent activity of the creature and God. Leibniz, interestingly enough, actually suggests such a view in his Theodicy section 388.

25. See Garber 1993, 14-5.

26. This portion of the entry is from Lee forthcoming.

27. On the difficult and complex topic of Malebranche on free will, see Elmar Kremer 2000, 190–219 and Schmaltz 1996, 192–234.