Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Mill's Moral and Political Philosophy

1. Though it is fair to say that Mill's greatest philosophical influence nowadays lies in his moral and political philosophy, especially his defense of utilitarianism and liberalism in Utilitarianism and On Liberty, this has not always been true. As Nicholson (1998) documents, during and shortly after his own lifetime, Mill was better known and more widely admired for his work in theoretical philosophy and political economy.

2. For useful accounts of Mill's life and intellectual development, see Packe 1954 and Capaldi 2004.

3. Further support for this conclusion can be found in Mill's appeal to majoritarian considerations to resolve (potential) disagreements among competent judges (II 8). There he claims that majoritarian considerations are the only recourse on matters of quantity as well as quality. But it is very clear that the preferences of competent judges are no more than evidential as to the quantities of pleasure produced by various activities.

4. This conception of act utilitarianism might be contrasted with satisficing act utilitarianism, which says that an act is right just in case its consequences for the general happiness are good enough. Though satisficing act utilitarianism is also a form of direct utilitarianism, Mill shows no signs of being attracted to it, and I will not discuss it further here.

5. Bentham's “dictum” may have been a saying of his, rather than anything he ever wrote, inasmuch as no one has ever found the exact quotation in Bentham's writings. However, Schofield (2006: 84) has identified the source of the dictum as Bentham's claim “Every individual in the country tells for one; no individual for more than one.” in Rationale of Judicial Evidence, which Mill edited (IV 475) and is contained in Bentham's Collected Works (VII 334).

6. For a contrary reading, which treats Mill's commitment to liberal rights as constraining the proper interpretation of the harm principle, see Jacobsen 2000.

7. 250 U.S. 616 (1919) (upholding the conviction of a wartime pamphleteer on behalf of the Russian revolution under the Espionage Act of 1917).

8. (249 U.S. 47 (1919) (upholding conspiracy convictions, under the Espionage Act of 1917, for the distribution of literature aiming to obstruct the military draft). To say that Mill would agree with the clear and present danger test is not to say that he would or should agree that it was correctly applied in Schenck.

9. 315 U.S. 568 (1942) (upholding a state prohibition on the use of offensive language in face-to-face exchanges in public spaces) at 571-572.

10. For fuller discussion of the implications of Millian principles concerning freedom of expression for First Amendment jurisprudence and hate speech, see Brink 2001 and 2008.

11. This is one way of understanding the significance of Michael Moore's defense of legal moralism (1997: ch. 16).

12. Conceiving of rights as secondary principles is similar to what Berger calls “the strategy conception” of rules and rights (1984).

13. Mill raises, but does not settle, the question whether certain kinds of criminal offense might render one ineligible for the franchise (“Parliamentary Reform” 322n).

14. Annas (1977) vigorously defends a strong variant of this conclusion. She distinguishes between Mill's reformist claims (that accept a traditional sexual division of labor but try to make marriage more humane and give women the right to vote) and radical claims (that treat virtually all aspects of the sexual division of labor as the product of sexual discrimination and that demand wholesale egalitarian changes in women's personal, domestic, economic, political, and social roles). She sees Mill's ambivalent response to the normative significance of these alleged feminine traits as a reflection of his ambivalence between his reformist and radical agenda.

15. Arneson (1980) reasonably worries about the unequal impact of Millian principles, especially his anti-paternalism, on people above the threshold with different degrees of normative competence. Suppose that we set the threshold at a C-level competence. Ds are saved from themselves by paternalistic intervention. But, according to Mill, paternalism is equally impermissible for C+s and A+s. But the welfare prospects of C+s and A+s are quite different under Mill's non-scalar principles. One response would be to have a sliding scale of basic liberties that tracks degree of normative competence. Another would be retain non-scalar principles but insist that C+s get a greater share of non-coercive help in promoting their well-being — for instance, in the form of special tutoring and remonstration.