Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Medieval Mereology

1. Thirteenth- and fourteenth-century logicians take great care in dissecting the functions of distributive terms by examining a wide variety of linguistically generated sophisms (sophismata). Some of these sophisms involve the terms “whole” and “part”, and while these sophisms are often silly, occasionally one of them touches upon an interesting metaphysical issue. For an overview of syncategorematic terms and the application of the theory of distributive terms to the resolution of various sophismata, see Kretzmann 1982. 

2. One must remember that Aristotle and his medieval students lived in periods of time well before organ transplants were even conceivable. I leave it as an exercise for the reader to think through the implications of modern medical technology on the Aristotelian distinction between substantial and accidental forms. 

3. Some modern interpreters have suggested that the Neoplatonic philosopher Porphyry, and by association, Boethius think that universals are collections of individuals (Cross 2002, and Zachhuber 2000). I have argued elsewhere that this cannot be Porphyry's or Boethius' understanding of universal wholes (Arlig 2005, 75-83). Professor Cross, in private conversation, has recanted his interpretation of Porphyry, although he still suspects that some Neoplatonically influenced thinkers, especially some of the early Greek Church Fathers, did in fact think that the universal is a concrete collection of particulars. Cross may well be right.

4. The only works of Aristotle that were generally available in the twelfth century were his Categories and On Interpretation. On the philosophical material available to Abelard and his contemporaries, consult Marenbon 1997, 37-38, and more generally, Dod 1982.

5. The genus and differentia must be distinguished from another class of items that are often called “essential” parts, namely the matter and form of a composite particular. While many medieval philosophers think that one can understand the unity of a definition as something analogous to the unity of a form with its matter, a genus is not literally matter and a differentia is not literally a form. We also need to distinguish both sets of essential parts from “parts principal in essence” (see Pseudo-Joscelin De generibus §§ 6-7 = Cousin 1836, 507-8), which to many modern readers are perhaps the truly essential—i.e. necessary—parts. To avoid confusion, we could call the parts of the definition of a universal its definitional parts, and the matter and form of a concrete individual its substantial parts.  

6. He may also be one of the few medieval philosophers to appreciate overlap.  Compare Aquinas, who claims that “no part contains in itself a thing divided along with it” (aliam sibi condivisam) (Summa Theol. III, q. 90, art. 3, contra 2).

7. On Buridan's theory of identity over time see King 1994, 413, and Pluta 2001, 52-59. A faithful paraphrase of Buridan's Question can be found in Pluta 2001 (53-59); a newly reconstituted Latin text can be found in his notes 13-26.