Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Logical Constants

1. They are called “constants” not (as Kuhn 1981 supposes) because their interpretations do not vary across models—after all, the “nonlogical constants” are called “constants” too—but because they are not variables.

2. (3) is called a “second-level” function because its arguments are (“first-level”) functions.

3. Wittgenstein strenuously rejects the Fregean view that the quantifiers and logical connectives represent relations (1922, 5.42, 5.44): “My fundamental thought is that the ‘logical constants’ do not represent” (4.0312). But this cannot be the basis for a Wittgensteinian demarcation of the logical constants, because on Wittgenstein's view, predicate signs do not represent either. On his view, the sign “R” in “aRb” does not stand for a relation; rather, the fact that “R” stands between “a” and “b” represents that the object represented by “a” stands in a certain relation to the object represented by “b” (cf. 3.1432). One might say that on Wittgenstein's theory, all signs except names are syncategorematic.

4. Strictly speaking, it is the grammatical constructions themselves, not the expressions involved in them, that should be called logical or nonlogical: not the sign “&”, but the placing of a token of “&” between two sentences. That is one lesson of Wilfrid Sellars's (1962) language Jumblese, which contains nonlogical predicate constructions but no nonlogical predicate expressions. To say “a is green” in Jumblese, one writes the letter “a” in boldface, and to say “a is redder than b”, one writes the letter “a” above the letter “b.” A similar trick could be used to devise a language with no logical expressions: for example, the disjunction of A and B might be written “AB”, and the conjunction “AB”. Although this language would not contain specifically logical expressions, it would have logical modes of construction. In the main text we abstract from this complexity and assume that aside from predication or functional application, each logical mode of construction is associated with a specific expression, as is the case in most commonly used logical calculi.

5. Quine solves the problem of the sign for identity (“=”) by denying that it is a logical constant (1980, 28) and showing how it can be defined or “simulated” in a language with a finite stock of predicates (1986, 63-64), whereas Dummett qualifies the grammatical criterion and allows “=” to count as a logical constant in virtue of its semantic features (1981, 22 n.). More precisely, he proposes that identity should count as logical because it allows us to express “quantifier conditions” (properties of predicates that are invariant under permutations of elements of the domain) that we could not express otherwise.

6. “Satisfaction” is Tarski's name for truth on an assignment of values to the variables. To specify a satisfaction condition for a sentence is to say on which assignments of values to its variables it comes out true.

7. For simplicity, I assume that all complex terms, e.g. “the mother of Abraham” or “the square of 4”, can be treated as definite descriptions, and hence as quantifiers (see Neale 1990). Otherwise recursive axioms will be needed for reference-on-an-assignment as well as for satisfaction (truth-on-an-assignment).

8. Evans' version of this clause is stated in terms of predicates rather than arbitrary open sentences, but this is problematic because it does not allow recursion (see Lepore and Ludwig 2002, 73 n. 13). The present approach uses a variable that is not present in English surface structure, but so do Davidson's own clauses for the quantifiers. This is okay, because Davidsonian meaning theories have two parts: a recursive truth theory for a regimented portion of the language and a finitely specified mapping of all sentences of the language into the regimented portion (Evans 1976, 201-2).

9. This criterion judges sets of expressions together, leaving open the possibility that (say) {A, B, C} and {A, B, D} will both satisfy the criterion, while {A, B, C, D} won't. However, a criterion that works this way may still be of some use in constraining the choice of logical constants, even if it does not determine it.

10. Note that this third clause is redundant if <x, y> is defined in the usual way as {{x}, {x, y}}.

11. Note that if we follow Frege and take the two truth values to be objects, then the truth functional connectives do have extensions in the usual sense, but they are not permutation invariant, because they treat the True and the False differently from other objects.

12. p circa is the composition of a and p: (p circa)(x) = p(a(x)). An assignment is just a function from variables to values, so if a is an assignment, so is p circa.

13. As McGee acknowledges, the revised criterion still allows logical constants to behave very differently on domains of different cardinalities. For example, “it would permit a logical connective which acts like disjunction when the size of the domain is an even successor cardinal, like conjunction when the size of the domain is an odd successor cardinal, and like a biconditional at limits” (577). Feferman 1999 takes this to be a strong reason for preferring a more stringent criterion for logicality: one on which the behavior of a logical connective on one domain connects naturally with its behavior on other domains.

14. For a different way of motivating the permutation invariance criterion for logical constancy, starting from the “pretheoretical intuition that logical consequences are distinguished from material consequences in being necessary and formal,” see Sher 1991, ch. 3.

15. In this respect it seems superior to Peacocke's epistemic gloss on topic neutrality (Peacocke 1976). Peacocke's idea is that “α is a logical constant if α is noncomplex and, for any expressions β1, …, βn on which α operates to form expression α(β1, …, βn), given knowledge of which sequences satisfy each of β1, …, βn and of the satisfaction condition of expressions of the form α(β1, …, βn), one can know a priori which sequences satisfy α(β1, …, βn), in particular without knowing the properties and relations of the objects in the sequences” (223; for a more carefully qualified statement, see 225-6, and for the connection with topic neutrality, see 229). As it stands, this criterion is too demanding, as Peacocke himself points out. One might know which sequences satisfy “F(x)” without knowing that they are all the sequences, and hence without being able to determine which sequences satisfy “∀ x F(x)”. Yet “∀” is presumably a logical constant. Similarly, one might know of a sequence s that it satisfies “F(x)” and also that it satisfies “G(x)” without knowing that it satisfies “F(x) & G(x)”. For example, one might know of Venus that it satisfies “is the morning star” and know of Venus that it satisfies “is the evening star” without knowing of Venus that it satisfies “is the morning star and is the evening star.” Peacocke deals with these problems by further specifying the kind of knowledge his imaginary knowers have (227), but his additional conditions seem ad hoc (McCarthy 1981, 503-4; Sainsbury 2001, 378). Moreover, given some natural theses about what is required to “know which object” a number, set, or syntactic string is, Peacocke's criterion will count “is the successor of ...”, “is the pair set formed from ... and ...”, “is the concatenation of ... and ...”, and other intuitively non-logical expressions as logical constants (McCarthy 1981, 506-7). McCarthy suggests that the notion of topic neutrality Peacocke is trying to capture can be better captured by a non-epistemic invariance criterion like the one we are here considering.

16. The criterion would also appear to rule out operators like “Now it is the case that” and “It is actually the case that”, which pay special attention to the world or time of utterance. However, settling this question would require stating the invariance criterion in a semantic framework suitable for a logic of indexicals: one that relativizes truth to contexts as well as circumstances of evaluation (see Kaplan 1989). Such a framework would also be needed to decide whether the invariance criterion rules out counterfactual conditionals, which (on many popular accounts) are sensitive to a contextually determined similarity metric on worlds.

17. Assuming the standard definition of a logical truth as a sentence that is true in all domains and on all reinterpretations of its nonlogical constants. A modal definition of logical truth would give different results here.

18. A similar argument in (McCarthy 1981, 515) rests explicitly on the premise that logical truths should be true necessarily.

19. McGee backs up this intuitive claim with the following argument:

  1. If “#” is a logical constant, then “#¬0=0 ∨ ¬0=0” is a logical truth (that is, it is true in every domain on every interpretation of its nonlogical constants).
  2. But “#¬0=0 ∨ ¬0=0” entails “water is H2O”, which is not a logical truth.
  3. And logical truths entail only logical truths. Thus,
  4. “#” is not a logical constant.

The argument is problematic, because it is not clear what McGee means by “entails” in (2) and (3). If he has in mind the standard notion of logical implication (truth preservation on every domain and interpretation of the nonlogical constants), then (2) is false: “#¬0=0 ∨ ¬0=0” is true on every interpretation, but “water = H2O” is false on many interpretations (those that assign distinct referents to the nonlogical constants “water” and “H2O”). If he has in mind the standard modal notion of entailment (A entails B just in case it is impossible for A to be true and B false), then (3) is false, for in that sense of entailment, logical truths entail all necessary truths, not just other logical truths. Perhaps McGee has in mind some other notion of entailment that makes both premises true, but pending clarification on this point, the force of his argument remains unclear.

20. An expression is a rigid designator if its denotation is constant across possible worlds.

21. For versions of this idea, see Popper 1946-7, 1947; Kneale 1956; Prawitz 1978; Zucker 1978; Zucker and Tragesser 1978; Hacking 1979; Peacocke 1987; Kremer 1988; Dummett 1991; Koslow 1992, 1999; Došen 1994; and Hodes 2004.

22. The premise of this argument is far from obvious. The notion of a valid inference (and hence of an inference rule) is a pretty sophisticated one, and its connection to norms for reasoning is not as straightforward as is sometimes assumed. For example, knowledge that Y can be validly inferred from X does not license one to believe Y if one believes X; it may be more rational to abandon one's belief in X, or to take up a sceptical position towards both X and Y (see Harman 1984). The technical practice of “inference” that the introduction and elimination rules govern is not to be confused with “inference” in its more generic sense—the formation of beliefs on the basis of other beliefs. But unless these two senses of “inference” are conflated, it is not clear why we should assume that a capacity for articulate thought and reasoning implies an understanding of the former as well as the latter.

23. Gentzen (1935, §5.13; 1969, 80) holds that a constant is defined by its introduction rules, and that the elimination rules are just consequences of these. This idea is developed further in Prawitz 1978 and Dummett 1991. Koslow (1992, 1999) takes the elimination rules as fundamental, defining each logical operation as the weakest object in an implication structure that satisfies the elimination rule. Kneale (1956, 257) uses two-way (reversible) sequent rules, both left and right. Hodes (2004, 143) takes the introduction rules to be fundamental for some constants, the elimination rules for others (and in some cases, he holds, neither is fundamental).

24. Popper (1947) and Koslow (1992, 1999) give genuine explicit definitions, not of the constants themselves, but of metalinguistic predicates like “is a negation of A” and “is a disjunction of A and B.” For example, an item A in an implicational structure counts as a “disjunction” of two other items B and C iff it is the weakest item in that structure that is implied by both B and C. This definition does not guarantee that in a given implicational structure there will be a disjunction of any two arbitrary items. For an excellent critical discussion of Popper's project, see Schroeder-Heister 1984.

25. Warmbrod's approach is to paraphrase modal claims into first-order claims about relations between possible worlds, while Harman's is to introduce a non-logical predicate “is necessary” and a logical operator that forms names of propositions. It is also possible to treat the sentential operators “necessarily” and “possibly” as non-logical operators in an intensional language (Kuhn 1981).

26. I focus on arguments for the sake of brevity. Logic is of course also concerned with properties of sentences (logical truth and falsity, provability), sets of sentences (consistency), and sequences of sentences (proof); and with relations between sentences (logical equivalence and implication) and between sets of sentences and sentences (logical consequence and independence).

27. Frege seems to have been sceptical about the possibility of proving logical invalidity and independence precisely because he saw that such proofs would not be possible without a principled demarcation of logical constants, which he did not see how to provide (Frege 1906, 429; and for discussion, Ricketts 1997).

28. An alternative response to the Demarcater's challenge, one that does not rely on the analytic-synthetic distinction, goes like this. Although logic is the study of validity as such, it should not be expected to pronounce on every question about the validity of particular arguments. After all, physics can justly be described as the study of space, time, matter, and energy, even though there are many questions concerning the distribution of matter and energy in spacetime that physics cannot answer. (For example: was there an olive on this marble slab two thousand years ago this day?) Logicians answer general questions about validity, and although often the answers to these general questions settle questions about the validity of particular arguments, there is no reason to think they should settle all such questions (Read 1994). Alternatively, the Debunker might argue that what is distinctive of logic is its use of certain methods (formalization, proof, counterexample) to investigate validity.