Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to The Analysis of Knowledge

1. This objection is due to Nicholas Maxwell.

2. It is important not to misunderstand this question. When advocates of the JTB approach say that knowledge requires justification, they don't mean to suggest that, if S has knowledge of p, S has engaged in the activity of justifying, or attempted to show that p is true. Rather, what the justification condition requires is merely that a belief that qualifies as knowledge have the property of being justified. It can have that property even if S did not engage in the activity of justifying her belief that p. Consider an ordinary person's belief that five and five is ten. Most people have never attempted to justify this belief, and probably would be at a loss as to how to go about justifying it. But for most people, that belief would qualify as an instance of knowledge. The importance of the distinction between the activity of justifying and a belief's property of being justified is emphasized by William Alston in the following passage:

To turn to justification, the first point is that I will be working with the concept of a subject S's being justified in believing that p, rather than with the concept of S's justifying a belief. That is, I will be concerned with the state or condition of being justified, rather than with the activity of justifying a belief. It is amazing how often these concepts are conflated in the literature. The crucial difference between them is that while to justify a belief is to marshal considerations in its support, in order for me to be justified in believing that p it is not necessary that I have done anything by way of an argument for p or for my epistemic situation vis-à-vis p. Unless I am justified in many beliefs without arguing for them, there is precious little I justifiably believe. (Alston 1991, p. 71)

For an alternative view, see Almeder 1999, pp. 90 and 123. Almeder defends the view that, "as a matter of ordinary discourse, ‘being justified’ is not something we can always separate from the activity of giving, or being able to give, reasons when the question ‘How do you know?’ is appropriately asked." Ibid, p. 92.

3. For a defense of evidentialism, see Conee and Feldman 1985 and 2004. For criticisms of evidentialism, see De Rose 2000, and Plantinga 1996, pp. 358-361.

4. For a good discussion of objections to the belief condition, see Lehrer 1990, chapter 2.

5. Gettier states explicitly the assumption that a justified belief can be false.

6. There are, then, two reasons why knowledge is not to be analyzed as true belief. First, a true belief might fail to be justified. Second, a true belief might be justified but fail to be knowledge because the subject is in a Gettier-type situation.

7. See Chisholm 1977, chapter 6. Chisholm's strategy of building a degettierization clause into the justification condition is difficult to understand, given Chisholm's deep commitment to internalism. Since degettierization is an external matter, this strategy makes justification an external property. (See note 46) Thus, for internalists the place to take care of the Gettier problem is clearly a fourth condition.

8. See, for example, Armstrong 1973, p. 152, and Clark 1963. For further references, see Shope 1983, p. 24. This monograph provides a comprehensive discussion of the Gettier literature up to 1980. For a shorter but excellent discussion of the Gettier problem, see the Appendix in Pollock 1986.

9. For examples of J-reliabilism, see: Goldman 1979, 1986, and Swain 1981.

10. For examples of K-reliabilism, see: Armstrong 1973, Dretske 1981, and Nozick 1981.

11. This objection is due to Fritz Allhoff.

12. For some discussion of what Dretske would say about the barn facades case, see Dretske 2005, p. 24, note 4. For an example of a reliability condition amended so as to solve the Gettier problem, see Goldman 1976. See also Goldman 1986, pp. 46-7.

13. For literature discussing the internalism/externalism debate, see Alston 1989, pp. 185-226, BonJour 1985, chapter 3, BonJour and Sosa 2004, Goldman 1999, Fumerton 1995, Kornblith 2001, Sosa 1999, Steup 1999, Steup 2001b, and the debate between Feldman and Greco in Steup and Sosa 2005.

14. For a defense of this view, see Conee and Feldman 2001.

15. If mental states/events are not directly recognizable, then the mental state criterion might not give internalists what they want. The problem here is that internalists would not want to count, for example, the state of being reliably clairvoyant as a mental state. If they did, they would not be in a position to deny that (unwittingly) reliable clairvoyance is a source of justification. Thus the need arises to differentiate between neurophysiological states that are, and those that are not, mental states. It might be that the best way to achieve this is to say that only directly recognizable neurophysiological states are mental states. But if the direct recognizability criterion is needed to define mental states, then mental state internalism does not appreciably differ from accessibility internalism.

16. If S is knocked out, or perhaps only sleeping, is he in a position to know the justificational status of any of his beliefs? Those who would say ‘no’ should reformulate the definition of J-internalism as follows: At any time t at which S is capable of thinking and holds a justified belief B, S is in a position to know at t that B is justified.

17. See the critique of externalism in chapter 3 of BonJour 1985.

18. Evidentialists, then, do not conceive of evidence in the way that concept is used in a court of law and perhaps to some extent in ordinary life. According to the non-philosophical concept of evidence, physical objects themselves, such as guns and bullets, can be viewed as evidence. Likewise, relevant facts about, say, a defendant's motives, DNA, or financial dealings can in a court of law be appealed to as evidence. Evidentialists would say that such things, by themselves, are not the kind of evidence that can justify a subject's belief. Rather, in the philosophical sense, what constitutes evidence is a subject's knowledge of such matters. For example, if a person on the jury hears an expert testify about the defendant's DNA and the DNA samples found at the scene of the crime, then the facts about DNA the expert has testified about constitute evidence for the juror. So, according to evidentialism, what's in the philosophical sense evidence in this example are not the facts described or physical objects mentioned by the expert, but rather the juror's memory of having heard the expert testify about these things. -- For a brief article on the concept of evidence, see Feldman 1992. See also Feldman 1988b.

19. For objections to this thesis, see Williamson 2000, chapter 4.

20. For discussion of this issue, see Goldman 1999, and Steup 2001b.

21. Strictly speaking, evidentialism about justification does not entail evidentialism about knowledge. It is possible to hold the view that a person's justification for her beliefs is determined by her evidence, but that knowledge does not require justification. That is not, however, how evidentialism is typically understood. Rather, advocates of evidentialism subscribe to two theses: (i) justification is a function of evidential fit; (ii) knowledge requires evidence.

22. This view was held, for example, by Chisholm. In the second edition of his Theory of Knowledge, he wrote:

We may assume that every person is subject to a purely intellectual requirement—that of trying his best to bring it about that, for every proposition h that he considers, he accepts h if and only if h is true. (1977, p. 14)

The deontological concept of justification is also defended in BonJour's The Structure of Empirical Knowledge. He expresses it thus:

The distinguishing characteristic of epistemic justification is thus its essential or internal relation to the cognitive goal of truth. It follows that one's cognitive endeavors are epistemically justified only if and to the extent that they are aimed at this goal, which means very roughly that one accepts all and only those beliefs which one has good reason to think are true. To accept a belief in the absence of such a reason, however appealing or even mandatory such acceptance might be from some other standpoint, is to neglect the pursuit of truth; such acceptance is, one might say, epistemically irresponsible. My contention here is that the idea of avoiding such irresponsibility, of being epistemically responsible in one's believings, is the core of the notion of epistemic justification. (1985, p. 8)

In more recent work, however, BonJour rejects the deontological concept of justification. See BonJour 2004, p. 175ff. For further literature on the deontological conception of justification, see Alston 1989, pp. 81-152, Feldman 1988, Steup 1996, chapter four, Steup 1999, and the essays by Haack and Russell in Steup 2001.

23. For literature on the role of truth in epistemology, see Alston 1996, chapter 8, David 2001, De Paul 2001, and the debate between David and Kvanvig in Steup and Sosa 2005.

24. Alternatively, evidentialists could drop the first part of this conjunction. Is it really my epistemic duty to believe everything that my evidence supports? It could be objected that it is hard to understand why it should be my epistemic duty to clutter up my belief system with trivial logical consequences of what my evidence supports. The reply to that would be that the consideration of clutter is not an epistemic, but a practical consideration. For discussion of this issue, see Feldman 1988.

25. For example, Goldman (1999) takes the rationale for internalism to rest on the deontological conception of justification as its main premise. For discussion of this issue, see Conee and Feldman 2001 and Steup 2001b.

26. The argument for (3) would go as follows: The concept of a duty has built into it an epistemic aspect. That by virtue of which a subject has a duty must, in the very least, be readily knowable, if not directly recognizable, to the subject. Otherwise, there could be such a thing as an unrecognizable duty, which could be viewed as conceptual impossibility. Critics of the argument displayed in the main text could argue that ready knowability is less than direct recognizability, but certainly enough to put the concept of duty on a solid footing. Hard-boiled internalists would insist that ready knowability either amounts to direct recognizability, or isn't quite enough.

27. The evil demon objection to reliabilism can be found in Cohen 1984, pp. 280-82, Foley 1985, Ginet 1985, and Lehrer 1990, p. 166.

28. See Chisholm 1989, p. 61f, where Chisholm makes it abundantly clear that he intends his "formal epistemic principles" to state what epistemic justification supervenes on. See also Steup 1996, chapter 9, where I argue that, as far as the analytic goal is concerned, there is surprising overlap between the internalist Chisholm and the externalist Goldman.

29. For relevant literature, see the Kornblith 1999, 2002, and Feldman 1999.

30. Thus Chisholm writes: "According to [the] traditional conception of "internal" epistemic justification, there is no logical connection between epistemic justification and truth. A belief may be internally justified and yet be false. This consequence is not acceptable to the externalist. He feels that an adequate account of epistemic justification should exhibit some logical connection between epistemic justification and truth." Chisholm 1989, p. 76f. See also Fumerton 1995, pp. 200-203.

31. An externalist alternative to reliabilism is Plantinga's proper functionalism. See Plantinga 1993a and 1993b.

32. It should be mentioned, however, that Alston also makes an effort to appreciate the appeal of internalism. See pp. 227-248 in his 1989.

33. For a discussion of Dretske's question, see Almeder 1998, p. 132-136.

34. Alston, for example, endorses the view that animals and small children cannot have justified beliefs. He writes: "Lower animals, very small children, and idiots acquire and utilize much perceptual knowledge concerning the immediate environment; otherwise they would not be able to move around in it successfully. But they are not capable of acting in the light of rules. So [justification as a normative property] is at best a necessary condition for the knowledge possessed by the likes of normal mature human beings." (1989, p. 173) I am inclined to concur with Alston. Although animals do of course have sensory experiences, I do not think that these experiences constitute evidence for them, for I take the concept of evidence to have a deontological aspect. A subject doesn't have evidence for p simply by virtue of being, for example, in a sensory state of the right sort. Rather, such a sensory state is evidence only if it entitles the subject, or makes it permissible for her, to believe that p. But animals are not subject to entitlements or permissions of that sort. I would, therefore, reject the suggestion that animals and little children can have evidence. For a contrary view, see Russell 2001.

35. The distinction between animal knowledge and reflective knowledge figures prominently in the works of Ernest Sosa. See Sosa 1991, 1997, and Sosa's contributions to BonJour and Sosa 2004.

Notes to the Supplement

1. Early statements of RAT include Dretske 1970 and Goldman 1976. For essays critical of RAT, see Sosa 2003 and Vogel 1999.

2. The qualifier within parentheses is needed because, without it, the principle would be too strong. Knowing that p does not require of me that, for every proposition q I know to be an alternative to p, I form the belief that q is false.

The Elimination of Alternatives Principle can be seen as a corollary to what is known as the Closure Principle, which can be stated as follows:

If I know that p, and I know that p entails q, then I know (or am at least in a position to know) that q.

The connection between the two principles is this: Suppose q is an alternative to p. So if p is true, q is false. Now, if you know that p entails that q is false, then Closure tells us that you know that p only if you know that q is false. Advocates of RAT, therefore, reject Closure. See Dretske 1970 and 2005. For a defense of Closure, see Hawthorne 2005.

3. Goldfinch-knowledge is discussed in Austin 1962 and Stroud 1984, chapter 2.

4. Stine 1976 proposes that an alternative is relevant to me if and only if I have evidence indicating its truth. The alternatives entertained by skeptics are not relevant because they don't meet this evidential requirement. Interestingly, though, Stine wishes to preserve Closure, and thus proposes that we know skeptical hypotheses to be false even though such knowledge could not be based on any evidence.

5. See DeRose 1995.

6. For the point a skeptical argument can be turned on its head, see Moore 1959, p. 247; for his hand-based proof of the external world, see ibid, p. 146.

7. For discussion of Moore's response to skepticism, see Pryor 2005 and Sosa 1999.

8. Assume Moorean Anti-BIV does not beg the question. Its not being question-begging does not guarantee that it would be a satisfying response to the BIV Argument. When confronted with the BIV Argument, what we wish to find out is on what grounds we can reject the second premise. How could I possibly know that I am not a BIV? According to Moorean Anti-BIV, I can come to know this by deducing it from knowledge of my hands. But that doesn't seem right, for it arguably reverses the direction of epistemic priority. My being a BIV is incompatible with my having hands. Thus to know I have hands, I must, in the first place, have evidence that enables me to know I am not a BIV. As already mentioned, such evidence might be constituted by my knowledge that BIV technology does not exist. Likewise, I cannot come to know that the little yellow bird in my yard is not a canary by deducing this from my knowledge that it's a goldfinch. Rather, to know it's a goldfinch, I must have, in the first place, evidence enabling me to know that the bird is not a canary. Such evidence might consist of my knowledge of how the appearance of goldfinches differs from that of canaries, or of my knowledge that canaries do not exist in the area in which I live.

9. An admirably clear statement of the ambiguity approach can be found in Fred Feldman's excellent book A Cartesian Introduction to Philosophy, pp. 33-37. Having distinguished between lower-grade practical knowledge and higher-grade metaphysical knowledge, Feldman says the following in response to a skeptical argument regarding knowledge of the future: "So the upshot is that if we take the argument to be about practical knowledge, it has a remarkable conclusion, but an indefensible premise. If we take it to be about metaphysical knowledge, it is sound, but the conclusion is not of much interest. If we try to retain the interesting conclusion, but make the premises all true, the argument will lose its soundness. In any case, we have no proof of any surprising form of skepticism." Feldman 1986, p. 36. For essays defending the ambiguity response, see Engel 2004, Russell 2004, and Steup 2005. DeRose considers and criticizes the ambiguity respone in his 1999, p. 195.

10. Lewis 1996, p. 550. For a defense of fallibilism, see Leite 2004.

11. Consider again how the BIV Argument and Fallibilist Anti-BIV are structurally related: the second premise of Fallibilist Anti-BIV presupposes the existence of what the BIV Argument is meant to call into question: knowledge of the external world. The question is whether this, in and by itself, is sufficient for making Anti-BIV a question-begging argument. One way to tackle this issue is to search for a second and structurally analogous pair of arguments, A and Anti-A, where we are inclined to judge that Anti-A does not beg the question against A. If there is such a pair of arguments, we may conclude that the structural feature in question by itself is not sufficient for making Anti-BIV question-begging.

Consider the following example, which is again about the existence of God. This time we think of God as a being who has created the universe and actively designed its features. If God thus conceived exists, then universe is not ruled by chance. The first argument, given by the Theist, makes a case for the existence of God appealing to the existence of intelligent design. The second, articulated by the Atheist, appeals to the existence of chance to argue against the existence of design.

(DG) If the universe is designed, then God exists.
(D) The universe is designed.
(G) God exists.
(C~D) If the seemingly design-exhibiting features of the universe are actually due to chance, then the universe is not designed.
(C) The seemingly design-exhibiting features of the universe are actually due to chance.
(~D) The universe is not designed.

Suppose the Theist responds to the Atheist as follows: "The second premise of Anti-Design presupposes that the conclusion of Design is false. For if the seemingly design-exhibiting features of the universe are actually due to chance, then God does not exist. Therefore, you beg the question against my argument." It would seem that the Theist's come-back is a non sequitur. True, if the seemingly design-exhibiting features of the universe are actually due to chance, that is, if the universe is ruled by chance, then God (the kind of God at issue in this debate) does not exist. But from this, it doesn't follow that Anti-Design begs the question against Design. Suppose the Atheist has excellent evidence for thinking that those features of the universe that exhibit design are deceiving and in fact due to the workings of chance. If so, Anti-Design can hardly be accused of being question-begging. Rather, Anti-Design would then be a well-supported argument against the existence of design.

It would seem, then, that Anti-Design does not beg the question against Design even though Anti-Design is structurally related to Design in the same way in which Fallibilist Anti-BIV is related to BIV. We might conclude, therefore, that Fallibilist Anti-BIV does not beg the question against the BIV Argument simply because the second premise of Fallibilist Anti-BIV presupposes the existence of the very thing the BIV Argument is intended to call into question, namely knowledge of the external world.

12. What is here referred to as ‘contextualism’ is what's known as attributor contextualism, to be distinguished from subject contextualism. The latter of these is defended in Hawthorne 2004. According to subject contextualism, the truth value of a knowledge attribution such as ‘S knows that p’ is determined not by the attributor's context but by S's context.

13. See Cohen 1999, p. 63 and Cohen 2005, p. 56f.

14. Assuming contextualism is true, can an attribution such as ‘S knows that he is not a BIV’ ever be true? An attributor, A, who makes such an attribution is thinking about the possibility of S's being a BIV. Arguably, this makes the possibility of being a BIV salient to A. As a result, A would be in a high-standards situation and would thus have to judge that S does not know that he is not a BIV. This, of course, does not mean that S himself does not meet the condition of knowing, in the low-standard sense of ‘know’, that S is not a BIV. It's just that such knowledge, if contextualism is true, could never (or at least not easily) be attributed.

15. For essays articulating and defending contextualism, see Cohen 1988, 1999, 2001, 2005, DeRose 1992, 1995, 1999, and Lewis 1996.

16. For literature critical of contextualism, see Conee 2005, Engel 2004, Feldman 1999, Hawthorne 2004, Russell 2004, Schiffer 1996, and Sosa 2003.

17. Cohen says, for example:

On a contextualist view, the standards that govern a context are determined by a complicated pattern of interaction among the intentions, expectations, and presuppositions of the members of the conversational context. Though skeptical considerations frequently lead to a strong upward pressure on the standards, the shift to a skeptical context is not inevitable. The pressure toward higher standards can sometimes be resisted. One device for doing this is adopting a certain tone of voice. (Cohen 2001, p. 92f)

18. For a defense of the ambiguity response vis-a-vis contextualism, see Steup 2005.