Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Harriet Taylor Mill

1. Hayek gives the date as 10 October (1951, 23); Jacobs, in the introductory material to The Complete Works of Harriet Taylor Mill, gives it as 8 October (1998, xli). While the use of Harriet's and John's first names is admittedly overly familiar, it is a convenient expedient for distinguishing them.

2. Eliza Flower.

3. In The Subjection of Women, John writes more generally that

Hardly anything can be of greater value to a man of theory and speculation who employs himself not in collecting materials of knowledge by observation, but in working them up by processes of thought into comprehensive truths of science and laws of conduct, than to carry on his speculations in the companionship, and under the criticism, of a really superior woman. There is nothing comparable to it for keeping his thoughts within the limits of real things, and the actual facts of nature. A woman seldom runs wild after an abstraction. (1984a, 306)

4. Clearly this entry could not have been made until the Mills married, several years after the Principles was published. In fact, the bibliography's editors relate that after the first page the entries were made in a hand that is not John's and that probably belongs either to Helen Taylor or an amanuensis she employed. This might indicate that it was not compiled until John was working on his Autobiography with Helen's assistance (MacMinn, Hainds, and McCrimmon 1945).

5. While it is her intellectual involvement in the work's production that interests us, of course, it bears mentioning that Harriet was also of considerable help to John in negotiating with the Principles' publisher, choosing fonts, etc. (J. S. Mill 1972, 17).

6. John, by the way, describes morality as an art as contradistinguished from a science in his essay “On the Definition of Political Economy; and on the Method of Investigation Proper to It.” This essay was first published in 1836, but was apparently originally drafted in 1831 (J. S. Mill 1967, 309, 319–20). The essay of Harriet's in question was written on paper watermarked in 1832. In fairness to Harriet, the possibility exists that the art/science distinction was added to John's essay in the revision process prior to publication.

7. Worth noting in this regard is John's criticism of Harriet's assertion that, if given the opportunity, the cleverer members of a community would find it “easy” to raise the children of the next generation to be “perfect,” and could do so with in ten years. John responds that “I cannot persuade myself that you do not greatly overrate the ease of making people unselfish. Granting that in ‘ten years’ the children of a community might by teaching be made ‘perfect’ it seems to me that to do so there must be perfect people to teach them (J. S. Mill 1972, 19). This exchange might be taken to imply that despite the strength of Harriet's commitment to human development as a goal, she could be more than a little naïve about what its realization would involve.

8. Of course, it is fair to say that works like Utilitarianism and On Liberty, aimed at they are at a popular audience, are themselves more suggestive than rigorous at many points. Today, however, many students of John's work believe that it is possible to unearth arguments that he is prepared to make but that were never fully and explicitly developed in print. Needless to say, even scholars who believe that there is more to these works than meets the eye disagree about precisely what that is.