Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Fictionalism

1. The distinction hermeneutic/revolutionary comes from Burgess (1983), who distinguishes between hermeutic and revolutionary nominalism. This distinction is also put to important use in Burgess and Rosen (1997). Stanley (2001, p. 36), introduces the terminology of hermeneutic versus revolutionary fictionalism.

2. What Yablo actually says is, “Objects with a tendency to turn up unexpected in truth-conditions like this can be called platonic”. Strictly, objects are platonic relative to areas of discourse. An example: many hold that the truth-condition for “argument A is invalid” is: A has a countermodel. Given this, countermodels are platonic, relative to discourse about validity.

3. For criticisms of specific fictionalisms see e.g. MacBride (1999) on Field's mathematical fictionalism; Rosen (1994) on how exactly to understand the fictionalist element in van Fraassen's scientific fictionalism (see too van Fraassen's (1994) reply); Blackburn (2005), Hussain (2004), and Lillehammer (2004) on moral fictionalism; and Sider (1993), Eklund (2002) and Uzquiano (2004) on van Inwagen's fictionalism about ordinary objects. Consult Daniel Nolan's entry on modal fictionalism for what criticisms have been leveled specifically against modal fictionalism. (With respect to each of the fictionalist theories here mentioned, there are other important critical discussions. The critical discussions mentioned here are ones specifically directed at the fictionalist element in the theories concerned.)

4. One nice question here is how fictionalism fares, as an option for the antirealist, as compared to other alternatives to an outright error theory, such as Blackburn's quasi-realism. See the exchange between David Lewis and Simon Blackburn in Kalderon (2005).