Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Epistemology

1. What are propositions? Propositions must be distinguished from sentences. For example, there is the proposition that cats have four legs. This proposition must be distinguished from the English sentence ‘Cats have four legs', which expresses the proposition that cats have for legs, or has that proposition as its content. Sentences in different languages can express the same proposition. For example, the German sentence "Katzen haben vier Beine", too, expresses the proposition that cats have four legs. Sentences are physical entities, since they are when uttered sounds and ink marks when printed. Propositions, in contrast, are (supposed to be) non-physical, abstract objects. The qualifier in parentheses was added as an indication of the fact that, according to some, abstract objects, and therefore propositions, do not exist. For more information on this topic, see Jeffrey C. King's article Structured Propositions in this encylopedia.

2. For example, if Hal believes he has a fatal illness, not because he was told so by his doctor, but solely because as a hypochondriac he can't help believing it, and it turns out that in fact he has a fatal illness, Hal's being right about this is merely accidental: a matter of luck (bad luck, in this case). For a monograph that focuses on the phenomenon of epistemic luck and the conceptual tools employed to capture the way knowledge and epistemic luck are incompatible, see Pritchard 2005. See also Engel 1992.

3. For further reading, see the entry "The Analysis of Knowledge" in this Encyclopedia, linked at the end of this article. See also Shope 1983 and Steup 1996, chapters 1 and 2. For an altogether different approach to the analysis of knowledge, see Williamson 2000.

4. For readings on evidentialism, see Conee and Feldman 1985 and 2004. For literature advocating reliabilism, see Armstrong 1973, Goldman 1979, 1986, 1991, and Swain 1981.

5. They are referred to as Gettier cases because, in his 1963 paper "Is Justified True belief Knowledge, Edmund Gettier described two cases that decisively refute the analyses of knowledge as justified true belief. For an excellent discussion of the Gettier problem, see the appendix in Pollock 1986.

6. The barn-facades case first appears in Goldman 1976.

7. This might not be easy to pull off in a systematic and principled manner. In Henry's environment, his vision is certainly reliable as far as telling a cow from a sheep is concerned. So the appeal to Henry's environment must be fine-tuned in such a way that it allows us to say that Henry's vision is unreliable when it comes to barn-recognition, without thereby committing ourselves to the outcome that it is also unreliable when it comes to cow-recognition. A second problem arises with regard to determining the borders of Henry's area. Suppose we compare two cases. Each involves a real barn that Henry looks at. They are 50 yards apart from each other. One is just inside the fake-barn environment, one just outside of it. Since a borderline must be drawn somewhere, it would seem hard to avoid such comparison cases. But once we draw a borderline, we get the result that, when Henry looks at the barn outside the border, he knows there's a barn, whereas when he looks at the barn inside the border, he doesn't. Given that the barns are just 50 yards apart from each other, this might seem strange.

8. For examples of reliabilism as a theory of knowledge, see Dretske 1971, 1981, and Nozick 1981. Both of these are subjunctive accounts of knowledge. Dretske brings reliability into the picture by imposing the condition that, if S knows that p, then S has a conclusive reason for p: a reason such that, if p were false, S would not have it. Similarly, Nozick ensures reliability by making what has been called sensitivity a necessary condition of knowledge: If S knows that p, then S would not believe that p if p were false. Sensitivity must be distinguished from safetey, which is weaker: If S knows that p, then not easily would S believe incorrectly in believing that p. For discussion of the sensitivity-safety distinction, see Sosa 1999.

9. For the distinction between definitional and substantive questions, see Alston's essay "Concepts of Epistemic Justification," in Alston 1989 pp. 81-114, Goldman 1979, and Steup 1996, chapter 2.

10. This definition employs the notion of obligations. Alternative definitions can be given employing other members of the family of deontological terms: requirement, duty, permission, or prohibition. Still further definitions are possible when we widen the range of relevant concepts, employing notions such as responsibility, being in the clear, and blameworthiness.

11. For literature on the deontological understanding of justification, see essays 4 and 5 in Alston 1989, pp. 115-152, Ginet 1975, BonJour 1985 chapter 2, Feldman 1988, 2001a, Haack 2001, Plantinga 1993, Russell 2001, and Steup 1996, chapter 4.

12. For discussion of truth as the epistemic goal and the connection between truth and justification, see Conee 2004, David 2001, and the essays by David and Kvanvig in Steup and Sosa 2005.

13. See Alston's essays "Concepts of Epistemic Justification" and "The Deontological Conception of Epistemic Justification," both in Alston 1989.

14. See Feldman 2001a.

15. See Ryan 2003 and Steup 2000.

16. For a response to this objection, see Steup 1999.

17. See Alston 1989, p. 7f. Alston writes: "I agree that ‘justification’ is the wrong word for a nondeontological concept, but we seem to be stuck with it in contemporary theory of knowledge."

18. A belief can be objectively probable in a way that is completely irrelevant to the beliefs being, or not being, an instance of knowledge. In that case, it wouldn't be "properly probabilified". Suppose Jack believes Meyer will win the election. Suppose further Jack's belief originates solely in wishful thinking. Finally, suppose Meyer's winning the election is objectively probable because it's a fact that 80% of those who will vote will vote in his favor. So the p that Jack believes is objectively probable. As a result, it's objectively probable that Jack's belief is true. But, since Jack's belief is the result of wishful thinking, it wouldn't be justified or an instance of knowledge. So the kind of objective probability arising from p's being objectively probable is not of the right kind. What we need is objective probability not by virtue of what the subject believes (the belief's content), but objective probability by virtue of the manner in which the belief came about. So what we are looking for is that the belief's origin makes it objectively probable. But then we must find, in a systematic and principled way, a way of pinning down what a belief's origin is. If we think of a belief's origin in terms of cognitive processes, this endeavor raises what has been called the "generality problem". See essay 6 in Conee and Feldman 2004.

19. For elaboration on the non-deontological concept of justifiation, see essays 4, 5, and 9 in Alston 1989.

20. The word ‘always’ is important here because externalists need not, and indeed should not, assert that justification, understood externalistically in terms of reliability, is never recognizable on reflection. For example, you hear, and thus come to believe, that there is a dog barking outside. Arguably, in a typical case like this, reflection will tell you that your belief has a reliable origin. If it does, then you can, on this occasion, recognize on reflection that your belief is justified even if we understand justification in terms of reliability.

21. Access internalism has been defended by Roderick Chisholm, who can reasonably be viewed as the chief advocate of internalist, traditional epistemology in the second half of the twentieth century. In his 1977, p. 17, Chisholm writes: "We presuppose … that the things we know are justified for us in the following sense: we can know what it is, on any occasion, that constitutes our grounds, or reason, or evidence for thinking that we know." (Emphasis added.)

22. See Conee and Feldman 2001.

23. Arguably, there are non-evidentialist versions of internalism. For example, consider the view that the coherence of one's belief system is a J-factor. According to this view, the justificational status of one's beliefs is determined by more than just one's evidence. If a belief system's coherence is something suitably internal, such a non-evidentialist view would count as internalist. Among externalist theories, reliabilism is not the only candidate either. For example, Plantinga's proper functionalism, Nozick's tracking theory, and Dretske's conclusive reasons theory all qualify as externalist, but neither of them is in any straightforward sense a version of reliabilism. See Plantinga 1993b, Nozick 1981, and Dretske 1971 and 1981.

24. I borrow the term ‘luminosity’ from Williamson 2000, chapter 4. Williamson rejects the claim that mental states are luminous.

25. At first sight, this might seem a strange claim. For example, when upon being immersed in a liquid a strip of litmus paper turns red, that could be viewed as being evidence for the liquid's being an acid solution. Surely, it could be argued, that the paper's color change is evidence of acidity is not the sort of thing that can be found out solely on reflection. However, if you don't know that litmus paper when being immersed in an acid solution turns red, your observation of the paper's color change will not be any evidence for you at all for thinking that the liquid in question is an acid solution. So if we are careful about describing what the evidence in this case really is, we would have to say that it consists of the following two items:

(1) The general principle that, when immersed in an acid solution, litmus paper turns red.
(2) The observation that the strip of litmus paper immersed in the liquid turned red.

What's evidence for

(3) The liquid is an acid solution.

is not (2) by itself but the conjunction of (1) and (2). When TK theorists argue that evidential connections are recognizable on reflection, they always have in mind principles that identify the relevant evidence in its completeness. So regarding the present example, advocates of TK would argue that what's recognizable on reflection is the proposition that the conjunction of (1) and (2) is evidence for (3). That claim can certainly be disputed, but it is not in any obvious way lacking in plausibility.

26. Chisholm held that there are necessarily true and a priori recognizable principles of evidence, and that these principles are internal "in that the proper use of them at any time will enable us to ascertain the epistemic status of our own beliefs at that time." Chisholm 1989, p. 62. For Chisholm's view regarding the a priori status of these principles, see p. 72. For an excellent account of classical internalism, Chisholmian internalism, and post-Chisholmian internalism, see Plantinga 1993.

27. Is the combination of evidentialism with Luminosity and Necessity enough to yield access internalism? This is a complicated question that cannot be pursued here. To settle this issue, we would have to address, among other things, the question of exactly what it is for something to be recognizable on reflection.

28. Typically, externalists will also reject Luminosity and Necessity.

29. See Conee and Feldman 2004, p. 56.

30. For literature on the internalism-externalism issue, see Kornblith 2001, George Pappas' article "Internalist vs. Externalist Conceptions of Epistemic Justification," linked at the end of this article, and Sosa 2001b.

31. For literature in defense of internalism, see BonJour 1985, BonJour's contributions to BonJour and Sosa 2003, Conee and Feldman 2001, Feldman 2005, and Steup 1999b, 2001.

32. For literature advocating externalism, see essays 8 and 9 in Alston 1989, Greco 2005, Goldman 1999a, Kornblith 1999, 2001, and Sosa's contributions to BonJour and Sosa 2003.

33. For literature on the foundationalism-coherentism issue, see Audi 1997, BonJour 1999, 2001, 2002 chapter 2, BonJour and Sosa 2003, Chisholm 1982, 1989, chapters 4, 8, and 9 in Dancy 1985, DePaul 2001, chapter 4 in Feldman 2003, Fumerton 2001, Haack 1993, Pryor 2005, Sosa's essays 9 and 10 in Sosa 1991, Sosa 1999, chapters 5-7 in Steup 1996, and chapters 5-8 in Steup and Sosa 2005, Williams 1999a, 2005, and Van Cleve 1985, 2005.

34. For a discussion of various kinds of epistemic privileges, see essay 10 in Alston 1989.

35. A conception of basicality along this lines is employed in Huemer 2000 and Pryor 2005. It is also at work in Van Cleve 2005. Huemer holds the view that a belief that p can be justified solely by a seeming that p. Pryor holds that a perceptual belief that p can be justified solely by a perceptual experience that p. Van Cleve argues in support of a foundationalist position characterized by the claim that memory beliefs can be justified solely by ostensible memories. So each of them holds that a belief can be justified by an experiential ground alone, that is, without the subject's having any further justification for believing something in addition to the belief in question.

36. For articles advocating compromise positions, see DeRose 2004 and Steup 2004.

37. One problem that arises for this approach is the following: Many epistemologists share the intuition that, if an evil demon deceives you and your perceptual experiences are therefore completely misleading you, they are nevertheless a source of justification for you because, from your own, internal point of view, such deception is not detectable. The externalist answer we just considered, however, implies that they would not be a source of justification.

38. It follows from this internalist answer that your perceptual experiences are a source of justification for you even if an evil demon deceives you.

39. See chapter 7 in Harman 1986.

40. Thus Richard Fumerton says the following, in the context of employing circular reasoning for the purpose of rebutting skepticism: "You cannot use perception to justify the reliability of perception! You cannot use memory to justify the reliability of memory! You cannot use induction to justify the reliability of induction! Such attempts to respond to the skeptic's concerns involve blatant, indeed pathetic, circularity." See also Alston 1993 for an excellent discussion of the problems involved in arguing for the reliability of perception.

41. For recent literature defending various versions of coherentism, see BonJour 1985, Elgin 1996, 2005, Lehrer 1990, Lycan 1996.

42. There is a further option: the regress ends in a belief that is not justified. It is difficult to see, though, how a belief that is not justified could possibly justify any other beliefs.

43. We should distinguish between the regress problem and various regress arguments. The regress problem is that of explaining how justification is possible given that it generates a seemingly infinite regress of justification. A regress argument is meant to support a particular solution to the regress problem on the basis of rejecting the competing solutions. Thus the regress argument for foundationalism rejects coherentism and infinitism as viable options. Klein, however, rejects both foundationalism and coherentism to argue for infinitism. (See Klein 1999 and 2005; see Ginet 2005 for a response to Klein's defense of initism.) Likewise, coherentists could argue that neither foundationalism nor infinitism is a viable option.

44. Doxastic coherentists might reply that, when the chameleon changes its color to purple, Kim forms the belief that the chameleon looks purple to her. Because of this belief, she would not be justified in still believing that the chameleon is blue. Therefore, doxastic coherentism can explain after all why Kim's belief (the chameloen is blue) is unjustified after the chameleon changed its color to purple. The problem with this reply is that foundationalists are free to describe the example in whatever way they want (as long as it remains conceivable). And obviously, they would want to describe it by stipulating that Kim does not form any beliefs about how the chameleon appears to her. In response to that, doxastic coherentists could say that Kim's failing to form beliefs about how the chameleon appears to her is inconceivable. That claim, however, does not recommend itself as a plausible one.

45. For literature on this issue, see Brewer 1999, Pryor 2000, 2005, Sellars 1963, Steup 2001c, Williams 2005, and the debate between Bill Brewer and Alex Byrne in Steup and Sosa 2005.

46. It could be argued that, by ascribing propositional content to perceptual experiences, we thereby turn them into mental states that are sufficiently belief-like to be like beliefs in this regard: they can justify only if they are justified themselves. This claim is more easily made than defended. If the hat looks blue to you, then your perceptual experience presents a certain propositional content to you, namely that the hat is blue. Nevertheless, even though it has that content, it is distinct form the belief that the hat is blue. Why? Obviously, because it's possible that the hat looks blue to you while you fail to believe, or while you even disbelieve, that the hat is blue. You might know independently, for example, that the hat is white and looks blue to you only because you are wearing blue-tinted glasses. In that case, the hat would look blue to you without your believing that it looks blue to you. It is not easy to see, therefore, in which sense the possession of propositional content should make perceptual experiences "belief-like".

47. For literature on the epistemological problems of perception, see Alston 1999 and chapters 10 and 11 in Dancy 1985. More bibliographical references can be found on p. 442 in Greco and Sosa 1999. See also BonJour's article "Epistemological Problems of Perception" and Crane's article "The Problem of Perception" in this encyclopedia, linked at the end of this article.

48. For an introductory article and bibliographical references, see Brie Gertler's article "Self-Knowledge" in this encyclopedia, linked at the end of this article.

49. For an introductory article and bibliographical references, see Tom Senor's article "Epistemological Problems of Memory" in this encylopedia, linked at the end of this article.

50. There is no escape from Gettier problems even in the area of a priori justification. What would be an example of a true belief that is justified a priori but is nevertheless not an instance of knowledge? Suppose Carl is a logician. He is trying to prove that p (which we assume to be a rather complicated proposition) is a necessary truth. He runs through a long and complex proof and concludes that p is indeed necessarily true. Unfortunately, even though Carl is right, he made a small and subtle mistake so difficult to spot that it leaves Carl's justification intact. It seems we should judge that, because of his mistake, that Carl does not know that p is a necessary truth. So Carl's belief that p is a necessary truth is a justified true belief that fails to be knowledge.

51. For literature on a priori knowledge, see BonJour 1998, 2005, Boghossian and Peacocke 2000, Casullo 2003, and Devitt 2005.

52. For literature on this issue see Lackey 2003. This article contains extensive bibliographical references and is available on-line.

53. For a selection of the literature on skepticism, chapter 1 in Dancy 1986, see chapters 6 and 7 in Feldman 2003, chapter 10 in Steup 1996, Stroud 1984, and Williams 1999. See also DeRose's introduction to, as well as the articles in, DeRose and Warfield 1999, and the debate between Vogel and Fumerton in Steup and Sosa 2005. For further recent literature on skepticism and how to reply to it, see Fumerton 1995, Greco 2000, Huemer 2000, and Pryor 2000.

54. One complication arises from the the fact that, knowing p and that p entails q, I might nevertheless simply not bother forming the belief that p. Thus a more cautious way of putting the principle will say in the consequent: "then I am in a position to know that q." A suitably fine-tuned articulation of the closure principle calls for considering even further complications. For a systematic discussion of the difficulties in finding an acceptable version of the closure principle, see Hawthorne 2005.

55. For further discussion of the closure principle and the role it plays in skeptical reasoning, see Steven Luper's article "The Epistemic Closure Principle" in this encyclopedia, linked at the end of this article. See also Pritchard 2004.

56. A caveat: this is correct if the relevant alternative theory is understood as construed in Dretske 1970. Subsequently, some advocates of the relevant alternatives approach have worked out a contextualist variation of it with the explicit goal of making it compatible with closure. See Stein 1976.

57. For an early defense of closure denial and the relevant alternatives approach, see Dretske 1970. Closure denial as a strategy of anti-skepticism is also defended in Nozick 1981. For the "abominable conjunction" objection to closure denial, see DeRose 1995. For a debate on the merits of avoiding skepticism by giving up closure, see Dretske 2005 and Hawthorne 2005.

58. For G. E. Moore's response to skepticism, see his essays "Four Forms of Scepticism" and "Certainty" in Moore 1959. An objection to the Moorean response that's not discussed here is that the response is question begging. It's, however, an open question whether it really is. What's needed to make that charge stick is a precise account of when an argument begs the question. Until such an account is provided, the charge of question begging is rather ad hoc. But even if Counter-BIV is not question begging, we may still wonder whether we could come to know we are not BIVs on the basis of employing this argument. The issue here is that of epistemic priority. It might be that I must know in the first place that I'm not a BIV if I am to know that I have hands. If that's right, one couldn't acquire knowledge of not being a BIV by virtue of employing Counter BIV. For discussion on the Moorean response, see Pritchard 2004, Pryor 2004 and Sosa 1999b.

59. For an initial selection of the large body of contextualist literature, see Cohen 1988, 1999, 2001, 2005, Conee 2005, DeRose 1992, 1995, 1999, Feldman 1999b, 2001b, Hawthorne 2004, Lewis 1996, Schiffer 1996, and Sosa 2003. For further bibliographical references on contextualism, see Keith DeRoses's extensive and annotated bibliography at Contextualism in Epistemology — A Bibliography.

60. That is, if a particular version of contextualism construes the low-standards/ high-standards differences in terms of fallible vs. infallible evidence. If the low-standards/high-standards difference is cashed out differently, different propositions will be at stake.

61. For a clear statement of the ambiguity response, see Fred Feldman 1986, chapter 2, especially pages 33 to 37. Feldman distinguishes between practial knowledge (the kind of knowledge we ascribe to ourselves in ordinary life) and metaphysical knowledge (the kind Descartes had in mind in his Meditations. Feldman writes: "So she upshot [of my reply to skepticism] is that if we take the [skeptical] argument to be about practical knowledge, it has a remarkable conclusion, but an indefensible premise. If we take it to be about metaphysical knowledge, it is sound, but the conclusion is not of much interest. If we try to retain the interesting conclusion, but make the premises all true, the argument will lose its soundness. In any case, we have no proof of any sursprising form of skepticism." (p. 36) For literature advocating the ambiguity response, see Engel 2003, Russell 2004, and Steup 2005.

62. What about, then, travel to and from another galaxy within a couple of months? Well, if we consider Andromeda the galaxy that's closest to us, getting there at the speed of light will take 2.2 million years. Coming back will take another 2.2 million years. Actual space travel will be a bit slower than the speed of light, and thus will add a few more million years. So even factoring in a healthy margin of error in calculating how far Andromeda is away, it seems safe to say we know that getting there and coming back in a couple of months is not within the realm of what's physically possible. According to a recent discovery, the Canis Major Dwarf galaxy is actually the galaxy that's closest to us. This one is merely 25,000 light years away. Still too far, though, to make it back and forth within a couple of months. So knowing that we can't travel to these places and come back within a couple of months involves no more than knowing a few tidbits from the textbooks of modern physics. Likewise, there are the textbooks of modern neurophysiology. They tell us, among other things, what happens to someone who takes LSD or other mind-altering drugs. They also tell us what happens if a person's skull is opened up and various parts of her brain are probed and prodded. What they don't tell us is how to accomplish "envatment": to keep a brain alive for an extended period and create the illusion of a normal life. If we consulted experts on such matters, they would tell us that, as of today, it can't be done. In this way, it would seem, one can come to know that (a)-(c) are all false.

63. Two further responses to skepticism not discussed here are those of semantic externalism and epistemic externalism. For discussion of these, DeRose and Warfield 1999.

64. For literature on virtue epistemology, see Axtell 1997, Brady and Pritchard 2003, Greco 1993, 1999, and Greco's article "Virtue Epistemology" in this encyclopedia (linked at the end of this article), Kvanvig 1996a, Montmarquet 1993, essays 8, 11, 13, and 16 in Sosa 1991, Sosa 1997, Sosa's contributions to BonJour and Sosa 2003, and Zagzebski 1996, 1999.

65. For literature on the issue of naturalized epistemology, see Feldman 1999a, Feldman's article "Naturalized Epistemology" in this encyclopedia (linked at the end of this articled), Kornblith 1999 and 2002, Goldman 1986, Quine 1969, and chapter 9 in Steup 1996.

66. For literature on religious epistemology, see Alston 1991, Audi 1997a, 2000, Plantinga 2000, and Wolterstorff 1999. Useful bibliographical references can be found in Greco and Sosa 1999, p. 445.

67. For literature on moral epistemology, see Audi 1997b, 1999, 2000, 2004 and Richmond Campbell's article "Moral Epistemology" in this encyclopedia (linked at the end of this article." Further bibliographical references are given in Greco and Sosa 1999, p. 444f.

68. For literature on social epistemology, see Alvin Goldman's article "Social Epistemology" in this encyclopedia (linked at the end of this article), Goldman 1999, and Schmitt 1994 and 1999. For a list of bibligraphical references, see Greco and Sosa 1999, p. 448.

69. For literature on feminist epistemology, see Longino 1999 and Elizabeth Anderson's article "Feminist Epistemology and Philosophy of Science" in this encyclopedia (linked at the end of this article). For a long list of bibligraphical references, see Greco and Sosa 1999, pp. 455ff.