Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Corruption

1. But see “Part 1: Terms, Concepts and Definitions” of Heidenheimer and Johnston (2002).

2. For example, Klitgaard, Maclean-Abaroa, and Parris (2000: 2) define corruption as “misuse of office for personal gain.” For a recent review of the general literature on corruption see Jonathan Hopkins (2002).

3. An important exception here is the more sophisticated analytical account offered by Dennis Thompson of political corruption in his book, Ethics in Congress: From Individual to Institutional Corruption.

4. For one of the most influential statements of the abuse of public office for private gain definitions see Joseph Nye (1967: 417-27)

5. Thompson (1995: 7 and 195) distinguishes between individual and institutional corruption; the latter involves infringements of institutional norms – rather than just principles of ordinary morality – by the occupants of institutional roles. However, Thompson remains committed to the conventional definition, albeit only as a definition of institutional corruption - as distinct from individual or private corruption. He says, “Like all forms of corruption, the institutional kind involves the improper use of public office for private purposes” (7).

6. Arguably some forms of nepotism are not also forms of corruption. See Adam Bellow (2003).

7. For an attempt to make out this proposed distinction see G. J. Rossouw (2000: 886-9).

8. This is implicit in much of Susan Rose-Ackerman's influential work on corruption. See Rose-Ackerman (1999).

9. See Rose-Ackerman (1999) for this kind of view. See Barry Hindess (2001) for a contrary view.

10. See the Foreign Corrupt Practices Act of 1977, Public Law 95-213 (5305), December 19, 1977, United States Code 78a, Section 103. See also Organisation for Economic Co-operation and Development (OECD) Convention Against Bribery of Foreign Public Officials in International Business Transactions of 15th February 1999.

11. Nor does there appear to be any institution or institutional process that has been corrupted, e.g., the institution of marriage.

12. It may be that institutional corruption and non-institutional personal corruption are not jointly exhaustive forms of corruption. In particular, there could be corruption of non-institutional practices. If so, then this form of corruption will also involve persons. It might be argued that there can be non-institutional corruption of practices in which no person corrupts and in which no person is corrupted, e.g., corruption of a non-institutional practice without corruption of any participants in the practice. Perhaps the conventional practice in a community of neighbours watching out for one another's property when it is unintentionally left unsecured, e.g., a neighbour keeping an eye on the unlocked garage next door in case of thieves, is corrupted when a large minority of the members of the community can no longer be bothered complying with this convention. Yet, presumably those who flout the convention are not thereby guilty of corruption and have not thereby been corrupted. After-all, they are not under a moral obligation to comply; compliance is a supererogatory act. If so, then it seems that the practice has not been corrupted after all; rather such cases are better thought of simply as partially abandoned practices, rather than corrupted ones.

13. This kind of account has ancient origins, e.g., in Aristotle. See Barry Hindess (2001).

14. Consider the following example in response to the second hypothesis. Q is responsible for counting votes in a precinct. He cheats and records more votes for candidate A, but this does not affect the election result – A wins, but A would have won anyway. It also has no effect on Q, as he is a bad person to begin with. On the causal account of corruption, Q has cheated; but has there been corruption? There are two relevant kinds of case. Suppose there are only two candidates, A and B, in the precinct and the vote count without cheating would have been heavily in favour of A anyway, i.e. the false recording of votes made no significant difference either in terms of the substantive outcome (A winning) or in terms of the margin of the win (A winning by a landslide). According to the causal account there has not been corruption – even if there was attempted corruption and the infringement of an institutional rule. This seems correct. On the other hand, if A would have won anyway, but only by a wafer thin margin absent the false count — then the false vote counting has made a significant difference to the outcome, albeit only in terms of the relative number of votes for A and the electorate's consequent false belief that A was supported by an overwhelming majority. According to the causal account there has been corruption. Again, this seems to be correct.

15. Obviously, here I am working with a simplified definition of moral responsibility that does not take into account complications such as that a person might not be morally responsible if under hypnosis they knowingly performed a corrupt action.

16. On the other hand, if the magistrates became aware of the diminution in the quality of their adjudications and chose to do nothing about it, then arguably the process of corrosion might have become a process of corruption by virtue of the corrupting effect it is having on the character of the magistrates qua magistrates. This example shows that there can be corruption of a person (the magistrate(s)) without a corruptor (assume the government and other officials are unaware of the problem of training and resourcing the magistracy). Naturally, if the resources were simply unavailable then there would not be corruption on anyone's part, notwithstanding their knowledge of the harm being done.

17. This holds even when people are corrupted through coercion, so long as they could have chosen to resist the coercion. On the other hand, if the action they performed was, for example, drug induced or otherwise not under their control, then they cannot be said to have chosen to perform it in my sense.

18. evertheless, since it is possible to be corrupted without intending or foreseeing this – indeed, without the existence of any reasonable expectation that one would foresee it — one can be blameless for being corrupted in a way that one cannot be blameless for an act of corruption. This is because a putative act of corruption of an institutional process or purpose would not be – according to my account — an act of corruption, if the putative corruptor did not intend or foresee the corrupting effect of his action, and could not reasonably have been expected to foresee this corrupting effect. (Naturally, the act could still be an act of corruption if some person was corrupted by it.)

19. Regarding the definition, note that agent B could in fact be agent A. Regarding clause (1), note that agent A is not necessarily morally responsible for the effect E1 or E2 that his or her action x produces. Recall also that we are working with a simplified definition of moral responsibility.

20. Consider the case of bribing a Nazi judge to enable a person guilty of a crime such as common assault, i.e., behaviour that is rightly criminalised, to avoid punishment. On the view expressed here this could be a case of corruption, if the legal system in question is able to be segregated into morally legitimate and morally illegitimate fragments, and the judge was operating within the morally legitimate fragment.

21. The owner's intention is not, of course, necessary for this to be a case of corruption; see the discussions of the first, third and fourth hypotheses.

22. And there is a further and related point to be made here. In general, corruptors corrupt, and the corrupted allow themselves to be corrupted, without adequate moral justification for so doing or allowing to be done. There is more about this in the section on Non-standard Cases.

23. For a detailed treatment from which this section is derived see Seumas Miller and John Blackler (2005: Chapter 5).

24.. A less straightforward case is the one where the action does have a corrupting effect. Consider two possibilities: (A) The sting is continued for a while (to catch other corrupt judges) and bought verdicts are temporarily enforced during the sting. (B) The process of considering and accepting the money offered by the disguised police officer further despoils the judge's character but has no further effect on court proceedings (because the judge is arrested within minutes). In both case arguably the sting officer committed an act of corruption.