Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Computing and Moral Responsibility

1. Analyses in terms of legal responsibility address the very real need to assess liability and to compensate those who have been harmed; however, a survey of these analyses is outside the scope of this entry.

2. Wallace's Reactive Account of Moral Responsibility (1994) makes explicit the connection between violated expectations and reactive emotions such as blame and resentment.

3. This research extends beyond merely attributing responsibility to computers, to include attributions of decision-making capabilities as well as such properties as intentionality, agency. See also Moon and Nass 1996; Nass, Moon, Morkes, Kim, and Fogg 1997; Reeves and Nass 1996.

4. For other related discussions of the moral capabilities of computers, see Allen et al. 2000; Gips 1995; Floridi and Sanders forthcoming; Moor 1979; Moor 1995; Thompson 1999; and Versenyi 1974.

5. Dennett (1973) defends the claim that intentionality is compatible with mechanism by appeal to his account of intentionality, explicated more thoroughly in (1995).

6. Dennett explores the notion of higher order intentionality more thoroughly in (1984), in which he more thoroughly argues that the freedom that is worth wanting for moral responsibility is compatible with determinism.

7. For Dennett's account of intentional systems, see The Intentional Stance (1995). An account of intention similar to Bechtel's can be found in Bynum (1985).

8. On the basis that such a practice would, among other things, facilitate the improvement of technology, Snapper (1985) advocates instituting arrangements (akin to malpractice insurance) that would enable computers to be held legally (i.e., civilly but not criminally) responsible; this insurance would be used to fund court-ordered reparations or fines, and the increasing cost of the malpractice insurance will motivate humans (esp. those who must bear those costs) to improve the systems. The virtue of such a solution is its concern to ensure compensation for those harmed by computer error.