Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Simone de Beauvoir

First published Tue Aug 17, 2004; substantive revision Mon Aug 16, 2010

There are some thinkers who are, from the very beginning, unambiguously identified as philosophers (e.g., Plato). There are others whose philosophical place is forever contested (e.g., Nietzsche); and there are those who have gradually won the right to be admitted into the philosophical fold. Simone de Beauvoir is one of these belatedly acknowledged philosophers. Identifying herself as an author rather than as a philosopher and calling herself the midwife of Sartre's existential ethics rather than a thinker in her own right, Beauvoir's place in philosophy is now gaining traction. The international conference celebrating the centennial of Beauvoir's birth organized by Julia Kristeva is one of the more visible signs of Beauvoir's growing influence and status. Her enduring contributions to the fields of ethics,politics, existentialism, phenomenology and feminist theory and her significance as an activist and public intellectual is now a matter of record. English readers of The Second Sex have never had trouble understanding the feminist significance of its analysis of patriarchy. They might be forgiven, however, for missing its philosophical importance. So long as they had to rely on an arbitrarily abridged version of The Second Sex that was questionably translated by a zoologist who was deaf to the philosophical meanings and nuances of Beauvoir's French terms it was difficult for them to see the ways that Beauvoir's critique of women's oppression is grounded in phenomenological-existential categories. The new 2010 translation of The Second Sex changes that. It is now possible for English readers to better appreciate the full range of Beauvoir's critique of the situation of woman as the Other.

1. Recognizing Beauvoir

Some have found Beauvoir's exclusion from the domain of philosophy more than a matter of taking Beauvoir at her word. They attribute it to a narrow view of philosophy which, rejecting the method of the metaphysical novel, ignored the philosophical issues raised, explored and argued in Beauvoir's literary works. Between those who did not challenge Beauvoir's self portrait, those who did not accept her understanding of philosophy and thereby ignored the philosophical implications of her fiction, and those who missed the unique signature of her philosophical essays, Beauvoir the philosopher remained a lady in waiting.

Some have argued that the belated admission of Beauvoir into the ranks of philosophers is a matter of sexism on two counts. The first concerns the fact that Beauvoir was a woman. Her philosophical writings were read as echoes of Sartre rather than explored for their own contributions because it was only “natural” to think of a woman as a disciple of her male companion. The second concerns the fact that she wrote about women. The Second Sex, recognized as one of the hundred most important works of the twentieth century, would not be counted as philosophy because it dealt with sex, hardly a burning philosophical issue (so it was said).

This encyclopedia entry shows how much things have changed. Long overdue, Beauvoir's recognition as a philosopher is both secure and fragile. Secure in the fact that we can no longer discuss French existentialism without attending to the works of Simone de Beauvoir. Fragile in that Beauvoir's philosophical legacy will be entangled with the fate of existentialism and feminism and with emerging judgments regarding the viability of a feminism that invokes existentialist categories, and of an existentialism that attends to the questions of embodied subjectivity through the lens of the question of woman/women.

2. Situating Beauvoir

Simone de Beauvoir was born on January 9,1908. She died seventy eight years later, on April 14, 1986. At the time of her death she was honored as a crucial figure in the struggle for women's rights, and as an eminent writer, having won the Prix Goncourt, the prestigious French literary award, for her novel The Mandarins. She was also famous for being the life long companion of Jean Paul Sartre. Active in the French intellectual scene all of her life, and a central player in the philosophical debates of the times both in her role as an author of philosophical essays, novels, plays, memoirs, travel diaries and newspaper articles, and as an editor of Les Temps modernes, Beauvoir was not considered a philosopher in her own right at the time of her death.

Beauvoir would have appreciated the fact that her current philosophical status reflects our changed understanding of the domain of philosophy and the changed situation of women, for one of her crucial contributions to the philosophical lexicon is the idea of situated freedom—that our capacity for agency and meaning- making and whether or not we are identified as agents and meaning- makers is constrained, though never determined, by the conditions of our situation. She would also have appreciated the fact that while her work was instrumental in effecting these changes, their lasting effect is a tribute to the ways in which others have taken up her philosophical and feminist legacies; for one of her crucial contributions to our ethical and political vocabularies is the concept of the appeal—that the success of our projects depends on the extent to which they are adopted by others

Beauvoir detailed her phenomenological and existential critique of the philosophical status quo in her 1946 essay Literature and the Metaphysical Essay, and her 1965 and 1966 essays Que Peut la Littérature? And Mon expérience d' écrivain. This critique, influenced by both Husserl and Heidegger, focused on the significance of lived experience and on the ways in which the meanings of the world are revealed in language. Heidegger turned to the language of poetry for this revelation. Beauvoir, Camus and Sartre turned to the language of the novel and the theater. They looked to Husserl to theorize their turn to these discourses by insisting on grounding their theoretical analyses in the concrete particulars of lived experience. They looked to Heidegger to challenge the privileged position of abstract discourses. For Beauvoir, however, the turn to literature carried ethical and political as well as philosophical implications. It allowed her to explore the limits of the appeal (the activity of calling on others to take up one's political projects); to portray the temptations of violence; to enact her existential ethics of freedom, responsibility, joy and generosity, and to examine the intimacies and complexities of our relationships with others.

Beauvoir's challenge to the philosophical status quo was part of an evolving movement. Her challenge to the patriarchal status quo was more dramatic. It was an event. Not at first, however, for at its publication The Second Sex was regarded more as an affront to sexual decency than a political indictment of patriarchy or a phenomenological account of the meaning of “woman.” The women who came to be known as second wave feminists understood what Beauvoir's first readers missed. It was not sexual decency that was being attacked but patriarchal indecency that was on trial. The Second Sex expressed their sense of injustice, focused their demands for social, political, and personal change and alerted them to the connections between private practices and public policies. The Second Sex remains a contentious book. No longer considered sexually scandalous, its analysis of patriarchy and its proposed antidotes to women's domination are still debated. What is not contested, however, is the fact that feminism as we know it remains in its debt.

As The Second Sex became a catalyst for challenging women's situation, Beauvoir's political and intellectual place was also reset. With regard to the feminism, she herself was responsible for the change. After repeatedly refusing to align herself with the feminist movement, Beauvoir declared herself a feminist in a 1972 interview in Le Nouvel observateur and joined other Marxist feminists in founding the journal Questions féministes. With regard to the philosophical field it took the efforts of others to get her a seat at the table; for though Beauvoir belatedly identified herself as a feminist, she never called herself a philosopher in her own right. Her philosophical voice, she insisted, was merely an elaboration of Sartre's. Those denials coupled with the fact of her life long intimate relationship with Sartre positioned her in the public and philosophical eye as his alter ego. Decoupling Beauvoir from Sartre became the first priority of those interested in rescuing Beauvoir from philosophical oblivion. Sometimes the issue concerned Sartre's originality: Were the ideas of Sartre's Being and Nothingness stolen from Beauvoir's She Came to Stay? Sometimes they concerned matters of influence: What happened in their discussions and critique of each other's work? Eventually these arguments abated and scholars turned their attention to the broad range of influences at work in Beauvoir's thought. The point of those interested in rescuing Beauvoir from being eclipsed by Sartre was not to establish that she was an original thinker without precedent but to show how she, like Sartre and the other existentialists, was influenced by her philosophical heritage and contemporaries, and to examine how she, like her contemporaries, reworked these philosophical legacies in ways that reflected her unique insights. We now understand that to fully appreciate the rich complexities of Beauvoir's thought, we need to attend to the fact that Beauvoir's graduate thesis was on Leibniz; that her reading of Hegel was influenced by the interpretations of Kojèvé that she was introduced to Husserl and Heidegger by her teacher Baruzi; that Marx and Descartes were familiar figures in her philosophical vocabulary; and that Bergson was an early influence on her thinking.

3. She Came to Stay : Freedom and Violence

Though Beauvoir's first philosophical essay was Pyrrhus and Cinéas (1944) many of her interpreters identify She Came to Stay (1943) as her inaugural philosophical foray. It is a clear example of what she calls the metaphysical novel. The letters between Sartre and Beauvoir and Beauvoir's diaries of that period (published in the 1980s), show that both Beauvoir and Sartre were concerned with the question of the other, the issue of bad faith and the dynamics of desire. They were also examining the relationship and tensions between our singular existential status and the social conditions within which our singularity is lived. She Came to Stay is packed with philosophical reflections — reflections on our relationship to time, to each other,to ourselves. These reflections are never, however, systematized,argued for or brought to closure. They are lived in the concrete,ambiguously triangulated lives of Pierre, Xavière and Françoise. Opening with a quote from Hegel “Each conscience seeks the death of the other,” and ending with Françoise's murder of Xavière, which Beauvoir narrates as an act in which Françoise confronts her solitude and announces her freedom, the novel does not necessarily confirm Hegel's claim; for the point of the murder was not to eliminate the other per se but to destroy a particular other, Xavière, the other who threatened to leave Françoise without the other she loved, Pierre. Existential ambiguity trumps Hegelian clarity. The issues raised in this first novel, however, the ambiguity regarding the responsibilities and limits of freedom, the legitimacy of violence, the tension between our experience of ourselves as simultaneously solitary and interwined with others, the temptations of bad faith and the examination of the existentially faithful relationship to time will pervade Beauvoir's subsequent reflections.

4. Pyrrhus and Cinéas : Radical Freedom and the Other

Pyrrhus and Cinéas, published one year after She Came To Stay, is Beauvoir's first philosophical essay. It addresses such fundamental ethical and political issues as: What are the criteria of ethical action? How can I distinguish ethical from unethical political projects? What are the principles of ethical relationships? Can violence ever be justified? It examines these questions from an existential-phenomenological perspective. Beginning from the situation of the concrete existing individual, it provides an analysis of our human condition that takes account of our unique and particular subjectivity, our embeddedness in the world, and our essential relatedness to each other. Though not feminist in any identifiable sense, Pyrrhus and Cinéas raises such compelling feminist questions as: Under what conditions, if any, may I speak for/ in the name of another?

After opening Pyrrhus and Cinéas with Plutarch's account of a conversation between Pyrrhus and Cineas, where the justification of action is questioned, Beauvoir, rejecting the recommendation to be passive, asks three questions: What is the measure of man? What goals can he set for himself? What hopes are permitted him? She then divides the text into two parts. Part one moves from the ontological truth—that I am a finite freedom whose endings are always and necessarily beginnings—to the existential questions: How can I desire to be what I am? How can I live my finitude with passion? This leads to the following moral and political issues: What actions express the truth and passion of our condition? How can I act in such a way as to create the conditions that sustain and support the humanity of human beings? Part I concludes with the observation that: “A man alone in the world would be paralyzed by...the vanity of all of his goals. But man is not alone in the world” (Pyrrhus and Cinéas, 42). Beauvoir opens Part II with the properly ethical question: What is my relation to the other? Here the analysis is dominated by the problem created by her insistence on the radical nature of freedom. According to Beauvoir, the other, as free, is immune to my power. Whatever I do—if as master I exploit the slave, or as executioner I hang the murderer—I cannot violate the other in the inner depths of his free subjectivity. Substituting the inner-outer difference for the Cartesian mind-body distinction, Beauvoir argues that we can never directly touch the other in the heart of her freedom. Our relationships are either superficial, engaging only the outer surface of each other's being, or mediated through our common commitment to a shared goal or value. As free, I am saved from the dangers of intimacy and the threat of dehumanization.

This line of argument would seem to lead either to benign Stoic conclusions of mutual indifference, or to the finding that tyrants and terrorists pose no threat to individual freedom. Beauvoir does not, however, let it drift in these directions. Instead she uses the inner-outer distinction, and the idea that I need others to take up my projects if they are to have a future, to introduce the ideas of the appeal and risk. She develops the concept of freedom as transcendence (the movement toward an open future and indeterminate possibilities) to argue that we cannot be determined by the present. The essence of freedom as transcendence aligns freedom with uncertainty and risk. To be free is to be radically contingent. Though I find myself in a world of value and meaning, these values and meanings were given to the world by others. I am free to reject, alter or endorse these values for the world has no meaning in itself. Whatever choice I make, however, I cannot support it without the help of others. My values will find a home in the world only if others embrace them; only if I persuade others to make my values theirs.

As radically free I need the other. I need to be able to appeal to others to join me in my projects. The knot of the ethical problem lies here: How can I, a radically free being who is existentially severed from all other human freedoms, transcend the isolations of freedom to create a community of allies? Given the necessity of appealing to the other's freedom, under what conditions is such an appeal possible?

In answering these questions Beauvoir turns the inner-outer distinction to her advantage as she develops the concept of situated freedom. Though I can neither act for another nor directly influence their freedom, I must, Beauvoir argues, accept responsibility for the fact that my actions produce the conditions within which the other acts. However irrelevant my conduct may be for the other's inner freedom, it concerns mine. I am, Beauvoir writes, “the face” of the other's misery. I am the facticity of their situation (Pyrrhus and Cinéas, 58). Pursuing this difference between my power to effect the other's freedom and my responsibility for their situation, and exploring the conditions under which my appeal to the other can/will be heard, Beauvoir determines that there are two conditions of the appeal. First, I must be allowed to call to the other and must struggle against those who would silence me. Second, there must be others who can respond to my call. The first condition may be purely political. The second is political and material. Only equals, Beauvoir argues, can hear or respond to my call. Only those who are not consumed by the struggle for survival, only those who exist in the material conditions of freedom, health, leisure and security can become my allies in the struggle against injustice. The first rule of justice, therefore, is to work for a world where the material and political conditions of the appeal are secured.

Violence is not ruled out. Given that Beauvoir has argued that we can never reach the other in the depths of their freedom, she cannot call it evil. She does not, however, endorse it. Neither does she envision a future without conflict. The fact that we are differently situated and engage in the work of transcendence from different historical, economic, sexed, and racial positions, ensures that some of us will always be an obstacle to another's freedom. We are, Beauvoir writes, “condemned to violence” (Pyrrhus and Cinéas, 77). As neither evil nor avoidable, violence, she argues, is “the mark of a failure which nothing can offset” (Pyrrhus and Cinéas, 77). It is the tragedy of the human condition.

The argument of Pyrrhus and Cinéas ends on an uneasy note. As ethical, we are obliged to work for the conditions of material and political equality. In calling on others to take up our projects and give these projects a future, we are precluded from forcing others to become our allies. We are enjoined to appeal to their freedom. Where persuasion fails, however, we are permitted the recourse to violence. The ambiguity of our being as subjects of and objects in the world is lived in this dilemma of violence and justice. Becoming lucid about the meaning of freedom, we learn to live our freedom by accepting its finitude and contingency, its risks and its failures.

5. The Ethics of Ambiguity : Bad Faith, The Appeal, The Artist

It is impossible to know where Simone de Beauvoir's thinking would have gone had she been spared the cold, the hunger, and the fear of living in Nazi occupied Paris. What we do know is that coming face to face with forces of injustice beyond her control, the questions of evil and the Other took on new urgency. Beauvoir speaks of the war as creating an existential rupture in time. She speaks of herself as having undergone a conversion. She can no longer afford the luxury of focusing on her own happiness and pleasure. The question of evil becomes a pressing concern. One cannot refuse to take a stand. One is either a collaborator or not. In writing The Ethics of Ambiguity, Beauvoir takes her stand. She identifies herself as an existentialist and identifies existentialism as the philosophy of our (her) times because it is the only philosophy that takes the question of evil seriously. It is the only philosophy prepared to counter Dostoevsky's claim that without God everything is permissible. That we are alone in the world and that we exist without guarantees, are not, however, the only truths of the human condition. There is also the truth of our freedom and this truth, as detailed in The Ethics of Ambiguity, entails a logic of reciprocity and responsibility that contests the terrors of a world ruled only by the authority of power.

The Ethics of Ambiguity, published in 1947, reconsiders the idea in Pyrrhus and Cinéas of invulnerable freedom. Dropping the distinction between the inner and outer domains of freedom and deploying a unique understanding of consciousness as an intentional activity, Beauvoir now finds that I can be alienated from my freedom. Similar to She Came To Stay, which bears the imprint of Hegel's account of the fight to the death that sets the stage for the master-slave dialectic, and Pyrrhus and Cinéas, which works through the Cartesian implications of our existential situation, The Ethics of Ambiguity redeploys concepts of canonical philosophical figures. Here Beauvoir takes up the phenomenologies of Husserl and Hegel to provide an analysis of intersubjectivity that accepts the singularity of the existing individual without allowing that singularity to justify an epistemological solipsism, an existential isolationism, or an ethical egoism. The Hegel drawn on here is the Hegel who resolves the inequalities of the master slave relationship through the justice of mutual recognition. The Husserl appealed to is the Husserl who introduced Beauvoir to the thesis of intentionality.

The Ethics of Ambiguity opens with an account of intentionality which designates the meaning-disclosing, meaning-making and meaning-desiring activities of consciousness as both insistent and ambiguous—insistent in that they are spontaneous and unstoppable; ambiguous in that they preclude any possibility of self unification or closure. Beauvoir describes the intentionality of consciousness as operating in two ways. First there is the activity of wanting to disclose the meaning of being, of discovering the meanings of the world. Second there is the activity of bringing meaning to the world, of wanting to be the author of the world's meaning. In the first mode of activity consciousness expresses its freedom to discover meaning. In the second, it exists as the freedom of bringing meaning into the world. Beauvoir identifies each of these intentionalities of freedom with a mood: the first with the mood of joy, the second with the dual moods of hope and domination. Whether the second intentionality becomes the ground of projects of liberation or exploitation depends on which mood prevails.

Describing consciousness as ambiguous, Beauvoir identifies our ambiguity with the idea of failure. We can never fulfill our passion for meaning in either of its intentional expressions; that is, we will never succeed in fully revealing the meaning of the world, and never fulfill our desire to impress our meaning on the world. These truths of intentionality set the criteria of Beauvoir's ethics. Finding that ethical systems and absolutes, insofar as they claim to give final answers to our ethical dilemmas and authoritarian justifications for our actions, offer dangerous consolations for our failure to be the source of the world's meaning or being, Beauvoir rejects them in favor of ethical projects that acknowledge our limits and recognize the future as open. From this perspective her ethics of ambiguity might be characterized as an ethics of existential hope.

Beauvoir's Ethics of Ambiguity is a secular humanism which rejects both the ideas of God and Humanity. However different they may be in content, both ideas provide an already given ground of and justification for our actions. They allow us to abdicate our responsibility for creating the conditions of our existence and to evade our ambiguity. Whether it is called the age of the Messiah or the classless society, these appeals to a utopian destiny encourage us to think in terms of ends which justify means. They invite us to sacrifice the present for the future. They are the stuff of inquisitions, imperialisms, gulags, and Auschwitz. They pervert our relationship to time. Insisting that the ethical concerns our existence as temporal, intersubjective beings, Beauvoir argues that as ethical we are obliged work for tomorrow's justice in ways that affirm the value of those who exist today.

Beauvoir rejects the familiar charge against humanism made famous by Dostoevsky's Grand Inquisitor: “If God is dead everything is permitted.” As she sees it, without God to pardon us for our “sins” we are totally and inexcusably responsible for our actions. Dostoevsky was mistaken. The problem of the secular humanist is not that of license, it is the problem of the “we.” Can separate existing individuals be bound to each other? Can each one forge laws for all? The Ethics of Ambiguity insists that we can. It does this by arguing that evil resides in the denial of freedom (mine and others), that we are responsible for ensuring the existence of the conditions of freedom (the material conditions of a minimal standard of living and the political conditions of uncensored discourse and association), and that I can neither affirm nor live my freedom without also affirming the freedom of others.

Beauvoir's argument for ethical freedom begins by noting a fundamental fact of the human condition. We begin our lives as children who are dependent on others and embedded in a world already endowed with meaning. We are born into the condition which Beauvoir calls the “serious world.” This is a world of ready made values and established authorities. This is a world where obedience is demanded. For children, this world is neither alienating nor stifling; at that age we are not yet ready for the responsibilities of freedom. As children who create imaginary worlds, we are in effect learning the lessons of freedom — that we are creators of the meaning and value of the world. Free to play, children develop their creative capacities and their meaning-making abilities without, however, being held responsible for the worlds they bring into being. Considering these two dimensions of the children's lives, their imaginative freedom and their freedom from responsibility, Beauvoir determines that the child lives a metaphysically privileged existence. Children, she says, experience the joys but not the anxieties of freedom. Beauvoir also, however, describes children as mystified. By this she means that they believe that the foundations of the world are secure and that their place in the world is naturally given and unchangeable. Beauvoir marks adolescence as the end of this idyllic era. It is the time of moral decision. Emerging into the world of adults, we are now called upon to renounce the serious world, to reject the mystification of childhood, and to take responsibility for our choices.

All of us pass through the age of adolescence; not all of us take up its ethical demands. The fact of our initial dependency has moral implications, for it predisposes us to the temptations of bad faith, strategies by which we deny our existential freedom and our moral responsibility, and it sets our desire in the direction of a nostalgia for those lost Halcyon days. Looking to return to the security of that metaphysically privileged time, some of us evade the responsibilities of freedom by choosing to remain children, that is, to submit to the authority of others.

Beauvoir does not object to the mystification of childhood. She acknowledges that parental authority is necessary for the child's survival. To treat other adults as children, however, is immoral and evil. To choose to remain a child is an act of bad faith. Whether or not we live a moral life depends on the material conditions of our situation and on our response to the ambiguities and failures of intentionality. If we are exploited and terrorized, we cannot be accused of refusing to be free — of bad faith. In all other cases, however, we are accountable for our response to the experience of freedom. We cannot use the anxieties of freedom as an excuse for either our active participation in or our passive acceptance of the exploitation of others. Hiding behind the authority of others, or establishing ourselves as authorities over others, however, are culpable offenses.

Beauvoir portrays the complexity of the ways in which we either avoid or accept the responsibilities of freedom in the imaginary and (sometimes)historical figures of the sub-man, the serious man, the nihilist, the adventurer, the passionate man, the critical thinker and the artist-writer. The point of delineating these human types is several fold. It is a way of distinguishing between two types of unethical positions. One type, portrayed in the portraits of the sub-man and the serious man, refuses to recognize the experience of freedom. The other type, depicted in the pictures of the nihilist, the adventurer, and the maniacally passionate man, misreads the meanings of freedom. The ethical man, as portrayed by Beauvoir, is also driven by passion. Unlike the egoistic, maniacal passion of the tyrant, ethical passion is defined by its generosity — specifically the generosity of recognizing the other's difference and protecting the other in his difference from becoming an object of another's will . This passion is both the ground of the ethical life and the source of the distinct ethical position of the artist-writer.

In describing the different ways in which freedom is evaded or misused, Beauvoir establishes the difference between ontological and ethical freedom. She shows us that acknowledging our freedom is a necessary but not a sufficient condition for ethical action. To meet the conditions of the ethical, freedom must be used properly. It must, according to Beauvoir, embrace the ties that bind me to others and take up the appeal — an act whereby I call on others, in their freedom, to join me in bringing certain values, projects, conditions into being. The artist-writer embodies the ethical ideal in several respects. Her writing expresses the subjective passion that grounds the ethical life. It describes how the material and political complexities of our situations can either alienate me from my freedom or open me to my freedom. By envisioning the future as open and contingent it challenges the mystifications that validate sacrificing the present for the future. It establishes the freedom of the other as the condition of mine, for the life of the artist-writer, like the ethical life, requires the participation of others.

The Ethics of Ambiguity does not avoid the question of violence. Determining that violence is sometimes necessary, Beauvoir uses the example of the Nazi soldier, to argue that to liberate the oppressed we may have to destroy their tyrants. She distances herself from the argument of Pyrrhus and Cinéas; now she identifies violence as an assault on the other's freedom (however misused) and as such this violence marks our failure to respect the “we” of our humanity. The Ethics of Ambiguity provides an analysis of our existential-ethical situation that joins a hard-headed realism (violence is an unavoidable fact of our condition) with demanding requirements. It is unique, however, in aligning this realism and these requirements with the passion of generosity and a mood of joy.

6. The Second Sex : Woman As Other

In her memoir The Force of Circumstance, Beauvoir looks back at The Ethics of Ambiguity and criticizes it for being too abstract. She does not repudiate the arguments of her text, but finds that it erred in trying to define morality independent of a social context. The Second Sex made be read as correcting this error — as reworking and materially situating the analyses of The Ethics of Ambiguity. It marks the beginning of Beauvoir's commitment to the concrete. Imaginary caricatures will be replaced by phenomenological descriptions of the lived situations of real women.

Where Beauvoir's earlier works blurred the borders separating philosophy and literature, her later writings disrupt the boundaries between the personal, the political and the philosophical. Now, Beauvoir takes herself, her situation, her embodiment and the situations and embodiments of those close to her, as the subjects of her philosophical reflections. Where The Ethics of Ambiguity conjured up images of ethical and unethical figures to make its arguments tangible, the analyses of The Second Sex are materialized in Beauvoir's experiences as a woman and in women's lived realities. Where The Ethics of Ambiguity speaks of mystification in a general sense, The Second Sex speaks of the specific ways in which the natural and social sciences and the European literary, social, political and religious traditions have created a mystified world where impossible and conflicting ideals of femininity produce an ideology of women's “natural” inferiority to justify patriarchal domination.

Beauvoir's self criticism suggests that her later works mark a break with her earlier writings. We should, however, resist the temptation to take this notion of discontinuity too far. Rather than thinking in terms of breaks it is more fruitful to see The Second Sex in terms of a more radical commitment to the phenomenological insight that it is as embodied beings that we engage the world. Our access to, awareness of, and possibilities for world engagement cannot be considered absent a consideration of the body.

Before The Second Sex, the sexed/gendered body was not an object of phenomenological investigation. Beauvoir changed that. Her argument for sexual equality takes two directions. First, it exposes the ways in which masculine ideology exploits the sexual difference to create systems of inequality. Second, it exposes the ways that arguments for equality erase the sexual difference in order to establish the masculine subject as the absolute human type. Here Plato is her target. Plato, beginning with the premise that sex is an accidental quality, concludes that women and men are equally qualified to become members of the guardian class. The price of admission, however, is that they train and live like men. Thus the discriminatory sexual difference remains in play. Beauvoir's argument for equality does not fall into this trap. She insists that women and men treat each other as equals and that such treatment requires that their sexual differences be validated. Equality is not a synonym for sameness.

The Second Sex argues against the either/or frame of the woman question (either women and men are equal or they are different). It argues for women's equality, while insisting on the reality of the sexual difference. Beauvoir finds it unjust and immoral to use sexual difference to exploit women. She finds it un-phenomenological to ignore it. As a phenomenologist she is obliged to examine the ways in which women experience their bodies and to determine how these experiences are co-determined by what phenomenology calls the everyday attitude (the common sense assumptions we unreflectively bring to our experience). As a feminist phenomenologist assessing the meanings of the lived female body and exploring the ways these meanings affect our place in the world, she brackets these assumptions to investigate the ways in which they corrupt our experiences. For example, it is assumed that women are the weaker sex. What, we must ask, is the ground of this assumption? What criteria of strength are used? Upper body power? Average body size? Is there a reason not to consider longevity a sign of strength? Using this criterion, would women still be considered the weaker sex? A bit of reflection exposes the biases of the criteria used to support this supposedly obvious fact and transforms it from a fact to a questionable assumption. Once we begin this questioning, it only takes a moment for other so-called facts to fall to the side of “common sense” in the phenomenological sense.

From a feminist perspective what is perhaps the most famous line of The Second Sex, “One is not born but becomes a woman” (The Second Sex, 267), introduces what has come to be called the sex-gender distinction. Whether or not Beauvoir understood herself to be inaugurating this distinction, whether or not she followed this distinction to its logical/radical conclusions, or whether or not radical conclusions are justified are currently matters of feminist debate. What is not a matter of dispute is that Beauvoir's The Second Sex gave us the vocabulary for analyzing the social constructions of femininity and the structure for critiquing these constructions. From a phenomenological perspective this most famous line of The Second Sex pursues the first rule of phenomenology: suspend judgments, identify your assumptions, treat them as prejudices and put them aside; do not bring them back into play until and unless they have been validated by experience.

Taken within the context of its contemporary philosophical scene, The Second Sex was a phenomenological analysis waiting to happen. Whether or not it required a woman phenomenologist to discover the effects of sex/gender on the lived body's experience cannot be said. That it was a woman who taught us to bracket the assumption that the lived body's sex/gender was accidental to its lived relations, positions, engagements, etc. is a matter of history. What was a phenomenological breakthrough was used in The Second Sex as a liberatory tool: by attending to the ways in which patriarchal structures used sexual difference to deprive women of their “can do” bodies, Beauvoir's phenomenology provided the criteria for declaring this deprivation oppressive. Taken within the context of the feminist movement, The Second Sex was an event. It opened the way for the consciousness-raising that characterized second wave feminism; it validated women's experiences of injustice; and it provided a program for liberation. From the existential-phenomenological perspective, The Second Sex was a detailed analysis of the lived body, and an ethical and political indictment of the ways in which patriarchy alienated women from their embodied capacities; from the feminist perspective, it was also an appeal—an analysis (both concrete and theoretical) that called on women to take up the cause of their liberation.

Several concepts are crucial to the argument of The Second Sex. The concept of the Other is introduced early in the text and drives the entire analysis. It has also become a critical concept in many theories that analyze the situation of marginalized people. Beauvoir will use it again in her last major work, The Coming of Age, to structure her critique of the ways in which the elderly are “othered” by society.

Beauvoir bases her idea of the Other on Hegel's account of the master-slave dialectic. Instead of the terms “master” and “slave,” however, she uses the terms “Subject” and “Other.” The Subject is the absolute. The Other is the inessential. Unlike Hegel who universalized this dialectic, Beauvoir distinguishes the dialectic of exploitation between historically constituted Subjects and Others from the exploitation that ensues when the Subject is Man and the Other is Woman. In the first case the Other experiences his oppression as a communal reality. He is part of an oppressed group. Here, the oppressed Other may call on the resources of a common history and a shared abusive situation to assert his subjectivity and demand recognition and reciprocity.

The situation of women is comparable to the condition of the Hegelian Other in that men, like the Hegelian Master, identify themselves as the Subject, the absolute human type, and, measuring women by this standard of the human, identify them as inferior. Women's so-called inadequacies are then used as justification for seeing them as the Other and for treating them accordingly. Unlike the Hegelian Other, however, women are unable to identify the origin of their otherness. They cannot call on the bond of a shared history to reestablish their lost status as Subjects. Further, dispersed among the world of men, they identify themselves in terms of the differences of their oppressors (e.g., as white or black women, as working class or middle class women, as Muslim, Christian, Jewish, Buddhist or Hindu women ) rather than with each other. They lack the solidarity and resources of the Hegelian Other for organizing themselves into a “we” that demands recognition. Finally, their conflict with men is ambiguous. According to Beauvoir, women and men exist in a “primordial Mitsein”: there is a unique bond between this Subject and its Other. In contesting their status as inessential, women must discover their “we” and take account of the Mitsein. Beauvoir uses the category of the Inessential Other to designate the unique situation of women as the ambiguous Other of men. Unlike the Other of the master-slave dialectic, women are not positioned to rebel. As Inessential Others, women's routes to subjectivity and recognition cannot follow the Hegelian script (Second Sex, xix-xxii).

This attention to what Beauvoir, borrowing from Heidegger, calls a “primordial Mitsein” may be why Beauvoir does not repeat her earlier argument that violence is sometimes necessary for the pursuit of justice in The Second Sex. Often criticized as one mark of Beauvoir's heterosexism, this reference to the Mitsein is not made in ignorance of lesbian sexuality and is not a rejection of non-heterosexual sexualities. It is a recognition of the present state of affairs where heterosexuality dominates. If patriarchy is to be dismantled we will have to understand how heterosexuality serves it. We will have to denaturalize it. To Beauvoir's way of thinking, however, the institutional alienations of heterosexuality ought not be confused with the erotics of heterosexual desire. The realities of this desire and the bond of the “primordial Mitsein” that it forges must be taken into account: not only is it used to enforce women's isolation and to support their inability to identify a common history, it is also responsible for the value and relationship that Beauvoir calls the “bond,” a situation-specific articulation of the appeal found in in The Ethics of Ambiguity.

A brief but packed sentence that appears early in the Second Sex alerts us to the ways in which Beauvoir uses existential and Marxist categories to alert us to the unique complexities of women's situation. It reads, “Thus woman may fail to lay claim to the status of subject because she lacks definite resources, because she feels the necessary bond that ties her to man regardless of reciprocity, and because she is often very well pleased with her role as the Other” (Second Sex, xxiv-xxv). This phenomenological-existential statement needs to be read in the context of Beauvoir's ethical-political question, “How can a human being in a woman's situation attain fulfillment?” (Second Sex, xxxiv).

Between the statement and the question we discover that the ethical-political issue of fulfillment does not concern a woman's happiness. Happiness may be chosen or accepted in exchange for the deprivations of freedom. Recalling the argument of The Ethics of Ambiguity we know why. As Others, women are returned to the metaphysically privileged world of the child. They experience the happiness brought about by bad faith—a happiness of not being responsible for themselves, of not having to make consequential choices. From this existential perspective women may be said to be complicitious in their subjugation. But this is not the whole story. If women are happy as the other, it may be because this is the only avenue of happiness open to them given the material and ideological realities of their situation. Beauvoir's existential charge of bad faith must be understood within her Marxist analysis of the social, economic and cultural structures that frame women's lives. Though Beauvoir will not allow that these structures deprive women of their freedom, neither will she ignore the situations that make the exercise of that freedom extremely difficult. Her assertion that woman feels her necessary bond with man regardless of reciprocity, however, escapes existential and Marxist categories. It is crucial to Beauvoir's analysis of women's condition and draws on the notion of the appeal developed in The Ethics of Ambiguity. In making an appeal to others to join me in my pursuit of justice I validate myself and my values. Given that my appeal must be an appeal to the other in their freedom, I must allow for the fact that the other may reject it. When this happens, I must ( assuming that the rejection is not a threat to the ground value of freedom) recognize the other's freedom and affirm the bond of humanity that ties us to each other. In the case of women, Beauvoir notes, this aspect of the appeal (the affirmation of the bond between us) dominates. She does not approve of the way in which women allow it to eclipse the requirement that they be recognized as free subjects, but she does alert us to the fact that recognition in itself is not the full story of the ethical relationship. To demand recognition without regard for the bond of humanity is unethical. It is the position of the Subject as master.

Moving between the statement that women are pleased with their alienated status as the Other and the question, “How can women achieve human fulfillment?”, Beauvoir argues that women's exploitation is historical, and therefore amenable to change. It is also an existential situation and therefore women have a responsibility to change it. Liberation must be women's work. It is not a matter of appealing to men to give women their freedom, but a matter of women discovering their solidarity, rejecting the bad faith temptations of happiness, and discovering the pleasures of freedom. Further, though Beauvoir alerts us to the tensions and conflicts that this will create between men and women, she does not envision a permanent war of the sexes. Here her Hegelian-Marxist optimism prevails. Men will (ultimately) recognize women as free subjects.

The last chapters of The Second Sex, “The Independent Woman” and the “Conclusion”, speak of the current (1947) status of women's situation—what has changed and what remains to be done. Without ignoring the importance of women's gaining the right to vote and without dismissing the necessity of women attaining economic independence, Beauvoir finds these liberal and Marxist solutions to women's situation inadequate. They ignore the effects of women's socialization (the subject of volume two of The Second Sex) and they are inattentive to the ways in which the norm of masculinity remains the standard of the human. The liberated woman must free herself from two shackles: first, the idea that to be independent she must be like men, and second,the view that there is no other option than to undergo the process of being socialized as a woman passively. The first alienates her from her sexuality. The second makes her adverse to risking herself for her ideas/ideals. Attentive to this current state of affairs, and to the phenomenology of the body, Beauvoir sets two prerequisites for liberation. First, women must be socialized to engage the world. Second, they must be allowed to discover the unique ways in which their embodiment engages the world. In short, the myth of woman must be dismantled. So long as it prevails, economic and political advances will fall short of the goal of liberation. Speaking in reference to sexual difference, Beauvoir notes that disabling the myth of woman is not a recipe for an androgynous future. Given the realities of embodiment, there will be sexual differences. Unlike today, however, these differences will not be used to justify the difference between a Subject and his inessential Other.

The goal of liberation, according to Beauvoir, is our mutual recognition of each other as free and as other. She finds one situation in which this mutual recognition (sometimes) exists today, the intimate heterosexual erotic encounter. Speaking of this intimacy she writes, “The dimension of the relation of the other still exists; but the fact is that alterity has no longer a hostile implication” (The Second Sex, 448). Why? Because lovers experience themselves and each other ambiguously, that is as both subjects and objects of erotic desire rather than as delineated according to institutionalized positions of man and woman. In Beauvoir's words, “The erotic experience is one that most poignantly discloses to human beings the ambiguity of the condition; in it they are aware of themselves as flesh and as spirit, as the other and as the subject” (The Second Sex, 449). The concept of ambiguity, developed abstractly in The Ethics of Ambiguity, is erotically embodied in The Second Sex and is identified as a crucial piece of the prescription for transcending the oppressions of patriarchy. This description of the liberating possibilities of the erotic encounter is also one of those places where Beauvoir reworks Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology of embodiment. For in drawing on Merleau-Ponty's descriptions of the ways in which we are world-making and world-embedded subject-objects, she reveals the ways in which it is as subject-objects “for the world”, “to the world”, and “in the world” that we are passionately drawn to each other.

7. Must We Burn Sade? : Freedom and the Flesh

We are a long way away from Pyrrhus and Cinéas, where Beauvoir declared our freedom is immune from assault. In that early work, our freedom insulated us from the risks of intimacy. In The Second Sex, avoiding the risks of intimacy remains possible, but now this avoidance is identified as a mark of our moral failure to live the ambiguity of our condition. Beauvoir's essay, “Must We Burn Sade?” (1951, 1952), written in response to a request to write an introduction to Sade's Justine, details the effects Beauvoir's changed position on the relationship between freedom and intimacy has on her ethical reflections. The central ethical question, “the problem of the true relation between man and man”, remains unchanged. Indeed what interests Beauvoir about Sade is that, “[he] posed the problem of the Other in its most extreme terms”. What has changed is Beauvoir's understanding of the drama of intersubjectivity. Marking this change, this essay also marks a return to the question of the responsibility of the artist raised in The Ethics of Ambiguity.

Must we Burn Sade? identifies the Marquis's decision to write as an existential project, an authentic ethics, and a politics of rebellion. Beauvoir credits Sade with uncovering the despotic secrets of the political machine. She is sympathetic with his utopian appeal to freedom. She finds, however, that Sade perverted the meaning of freedom. Thus Beauvoir identifies Sade as a great moralist who endorsed an unsatisfactory ethics.

Sade is Beauvoir's Janus-faced ally. She does not refute his claim that cruelty establishes a relationship between the self and the other. Sade is correct. Cruelty reveals us to each other in the particularities and ambiguities of our conscious and fleshed existence. The tyrant and victim, Beauvoir tells us, are a genuine couple. They are united by the bonds of the flesh and freedom.

Sade is the epitome of maniacal passion dedicated to the project of cruelty. Because he takes full responsibility for his choices, he must be credited with choosing freedom and accepted as being authentically ethical. This does not, however, make him either an ethical or moral figure; for his choices destroy the intersubjective bonds of our humanity. Though his account of the power of cruelty provides a convincing critique of our social, political and personal hypocrisies, it does not critique the ways in which cruelty is a perversion of freedom and an exploitation of the vulnerability of the flesh. Thus his descriptions of the powers of cruelty and the meaning of torture are incomplete and inadequate. The case of the Marquis de Sade makes it clear that authenticity, assuming responsibility for one's choices, is a necessary, but not sufficient, condition of an existential ethics of freedom.

In the end, Beauvoir finds that Sade was mislead (which does not mean that he was innocent). He mistook power for freedom and misunderstood the meanings of the erotic. In his fascination with the conflict between consciousness and the flesh, Sade exposed the failure of the sadistic enterprise; for in attempting to lose himself in the pleasures of the flesh and in this way to experience both the ambiguity of his being as consciousness made flesh (or flesh made consciousness) and the reality of his being for and with others, Sade substitutes the spectacle for the lived experience and accepts counterfeit transactions of domination and assimilation/incorporation for genuine relationships of reciprocity and gratuitous generosity. He never reaches the other.

Centering his life in the erotic, Sade missed the truth of the erotic event. This truth, Beauvoir tells us, can only be found by those who abandon themselves to the risks of emotional intoxication. Living this intoxication we discover the ways in which the body turned flesh dissolves all arguments against the immediacy of our bonds with each other and grounds an ethic of the appeal, risk and mutual vulnerability.

Between the early Pyrrhus and Cinéas and the later “Must We Burn Sade?” we discern the impact of what might be called Beauvoir's phenomenological turn to the body. Once she abandons the idea that our freedom, as absolutely internal, is immune from an assault by the other, and accepts the radical vulnerability of our lived embodiment, questions of violence and desire cannot be severed from the question of our fundamental humanity or questions of ethics and justice. In condemning Sade for his perversion of the erotic, Beauvoir also faults him as an artist. Though she criticizes him for being a technically poor writer, the heart of her criticism is ethical not aesthetic. Sade, according to Beauvoir, violated his obligations as an author. Instead of revealing the world to us in its promise and possibilities,and instead of appealing to us to work for justice, he took refuge in the imaginary and developed metaphysical justifications for suffering and cruelty. In the end, Beauvoir accuses Sade of being the serious man described in her Ethics of Ambiguity.

8. Djamila Boupacha : The Concrete Appeal

In 1962, Beauvoir and Gisile Halimi co-authored the story of Djamila Boupacha, an Algerian girl accused of being a terrorist and tortured by the French during the French-Algerian War. This book may be read as an extension of Beauvoir's critique of the Marquis de Sade. Instead of fleeing from the horrors of the real into the safety of the imaginary, Beauvoir takes up her responsibility as an author to expose and confront realities that the state would rather hide. Her purpose in writing is concrete and political. The book is both a protest and an appeal. Countering Sade, Beauvoir and Halimi show that the truth of torture lies in the unjustifiable politics of abusive power.

9. All Men are Mortal, A Very Easy Death, Adieux: A Farewell to Sartre : Finitude, Passion, and the Body

The ways in which the phenomenological turn to the body becomes increasingly important in Beauvoir's work, and the ways in which this turn to the body remains sensitive to the materialities of our situated freedom and the power of the category of the Other, may be traced in Beauvoir's attention to the question of human finitude. This question is raised early in her 1946 novel, All Men Are Mortal, the story of Fosca, a man who chooses to cheat death. His desire for immortality, however, is, by Beauvoir's later phenomenological standards, abstract. Fosca does not embrace immortality to escape the ambiguities of the flesh and embodiment. His decision is motivated by his desire to save the world. He believes that time is his enemy so long as his time is limited. He believes that with sufficient time he can take up a project, bring it to closure, and secure it from failure.

Fosca learns, however, that time becomes his enemy when it stretches endlessly before him. It is not time that he needs to secure his vision, but the commitment of others. No amount of time can secure that. As immortal, Fosca confronts the inevitability of failure that haunts humanity. Unlike mortals, however, who, confronted with the constraints of time, take up their failure with passion, Fosca becomes immobilized. Indifference to life replaces the passion for life. In the end, he discovers the crucial truth of ethical action from his many-generations-removed grandson, Armand. Understanding that the future belongs to others who may or may not take up his projects, Armand commits himself to the possibilities of the particularity of the concrete and the now. His passion is embodied in the appeal to others, not in a goal that would secure justice by closing off the future and the freedom of coming generations.

In All Men Are Mortal the givenness of finitude and death concerns our relationship to time. Eighteen years later, writing about the dying and death of her mother in A Very Easy Death (1964); six years after that, analyzing the situation of the aged in Coming of Age (1970),and eleven years subsequent to that, chronicling Sartre's last days in Adieux: A Farewell to Sartre, (1981), it is not so much our relationship to time but more a matter of our embodiment that concerns Beauvoir. In A Very Easy Death and Adieux, Beauvoir assumes the position of the phenomenological witness. The bodies of her mother and Sartre are given to us in all their disturbing breakdowns and deteriorations. Some have found these works cold, insensitive and even cruel. They miss Beauvoir's point. She is showing us who we are. The “I can” body revealed by other phenomenologists as a crucial mark of embodiment is the limited condition of the mature healthy body. It is but one phase of the life of the body. In its early days the body is still learning its “I can's”. As we age, the body begins losing them. It is one thing, as with the myth of woman, to alienate an “I can” from its capacities. It is quite another to refuse to attend to the full range of embodied life.

10. The Coming of Age : The Other Again

We need to read A Very Easy Death and Adieux within the context of the analyses of The Coming of Age to fully appreciate Beauvoir's role as witness. The project of The Coming of Age is similar to that of The Second Sex. Like The Second Sex, it focuses on a group of people designated as Other; like The Second Sex it exposes the mythical status of the “facts” about aging and the aged; and like The Second Sex it indicts society for its dehumanization of those it designates as Other. The Coming of Age also emulates The Second Sex in its method and scope. It trains a phenomenological lens on biological, psychological and sociological factors in order to understand the phenomenon of marginalized otherness. In many ways, however, The Coming of Age corrects what Beauvoir sees as the flaw of The Second Sex.

In reflecting on The Second Sex, Beauvoir says that were she to write it again she would pay less attention to the abstract issue of consciousness and more attention to the material conditions of scarcity. Though it is impossible to say what a revised version of The Second Sex would look like, The Coming of Age gives us some idea of how it might read. There is no talk here of THE AGED. Reminding us that old age is our universal destiny, Beauvoir tells us that its lived meaning is specific to our historical, class and cultural situations. Where The Second Sex identifies the ways in which the myth of woman hides the diversity of women and does not seem to see that the single category of the inessential Other may not capture the diverse meanings of women's situations, The Coming of Age keeps making the point that if we speak of old age as a universal category we will miss the crucial differences among the aged that the myths and images of aging hide. Further, unlike The Second Sex which speaks of a single myth of femininity, The Coming of Age tells us that the image of the aged differs from time to time and place to place.

Comparing the status of the aged to that of women as woman, Beauvoir notes that both occupy the position of the Other and that as Other both are subject to the powers of mythical, exploitive biologies. Though The Coming of Age pays closer attention to the diversity behind the unifying myths and works with a somewhat different conception of otherness, it sounds remarkably similar to The Second Sex as it traces the sources of the marginal status of the aged. While The Second Sex accused patriarchy of depriving women of their subject status by barring them from the project and devaluating the fleshed experience of the erotic, The Coming of Age argues that the non-subject status of the aged can be traced to the fact that they are barred from their projects and their erotic possibilities. “The old man”, Beauvoir writes,“looks like a different species to others because unlike active members of the community he is not engaged in a project….”

Like The Second Sex, which attended to the givens of biology without allowing them to determine the meaning of the subject, The Coming of Age also gives biology its due. The lack of engagement of the aged, Beauvoir notes, is in part imposed from without and in part comes from within; for as we age, the body is transformed from an instrument that engages the world into a hindrance that makes our access to the world difficult. The point of The Coming of Age, however, is that it is unjust to use these difficulties to justify reducing the aged to the status of the Other. Adieux's witnessing makes this point clearly. However diminished Sartre's body became, it never severed him from his projects. He could not have sustained his work by himself, but he was in a situation where others refused to marginalize him. They did not equate his diminished bodily capacities with a diminished humanity. The Coming of Age argues that the situation of a privileged Sartre ought to be our common destiny.

In a world which recognized the phenomenological truth of the body, the existential truth of freedom, the Marxist truth of exploitation, and the humanist truth of the bond, the category of the Other would be eradicated. Neither the aged nor women, nor anyone by virtue of their race, class, ethnicity or religion would find themselves rendered inessential. Beauvoir knows that it is too much to hope for such a world. She understands the lures of domination and violence. Throughout her career, however, she used philosophical and literary tools to reveal the possibilities of such a world and appealed to us to work for it.


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