Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Assertion


There is a connection between assertion and presupposition that was noted and stressed by Robert Stalnaker (1974, 1978). On Stalnaker's pragmatic account of presupposition, propositions are presupposed in a conversation if they are on record as belonging to the common ground between the speakers. When an assertion is made and accepted in the conversation, its content is added to the common ground, and the the truth of the proposition in question will be presupposed in later stages. Stalnaker uses a possible worlds framework, and characterizes the common ground as a set of possible worlds (the worlds where all that is presupposed is true), the context set. What is presupposed at a given stage has an effect on the interpretation of new utterances made in the conversation.

In this framework Stalnaker (1978, 88–89) proposes three rules or principles of assertion:

(RS) (1) A proposition is always true in some but not in all of the possible worlds in the context set.
(2) Any assertive utterance should expresses a proposition, relative to each possible world in the context set, and that proposition should have truth value in each possible world in the context set.
(3) The same proposition is expressed relative to each possible world in the context set.

Stalnaker comments on the first rule: ‘To assert something incompatible with what is presupposed is self-defeating … And to assert somthing which already presupposed is to attempt to do something that is already done.’

On such an approach, the satisfaction of a presupposition is an admittance condition of an assertion that makes it (cf. Karttunen 1974, Heim 83). This idea connects with Austin's more general pragmatic idea of felicity conditions of speech acts.

As was stressed by Lewis (1979), however, an assertion that intuitively presupposes the truth of another proposition need not fail, but can instead have the effect of adjusting the common ground. In so-called accommodation, the hearer adds background assumptions that would be required for interpretation. For instance, upon hearing Lewis utter

The cat has gone upstairs

the hearer who didn't know may accommodate by adding the assumption that there is a unique contextually salient cat.

Return to main text.