Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Assertion


Conventionalism has, however, been defended by Kotatko (1998). Kotatko claims that convention and social circumstances together determine what kind of act has been made. Speaker intention plays a role, but what determines the act is what intention the speaker counts as having done in the context, not what intention she actually had. Kotatko argues, with Dummett and against communication-intention theorists, that the public nature of language use would be lost if the force of an utterance were determined by the mental states of the speaker.

On the other hand, one problem with such a position is that it is not so easy to say when a particular convention is in force for a speaker without making reference to mental states. If mental states are not public, and whether or not a convention is in force depends on what mental states some relevant agents are in, then it is hard to see how the force of a convention can be public anyway. Moreover, indications of non-sincerity can be subtle (it is fairly common to be unsure whether someone is joking or not), and trying to determine whether the convention applies in a particular case does not seem to be any easier than gauging the sincerity of the speaker in the absence of any convention.

It is fairly clear that some illocutionary act types are conventional, like pronouncements in court proceedings or in wedding ceremonies, by which institutional facts, such as two persons being married, are created. In the taxonomy of Bach and Harnich (1979), these are the verdictives and effectives, and according to Bach and Harnich these types are conventional but not essentially communicative (1979, 113–19). Austin focused on such types in his early examples of performatives and he was criticized by G. J. Warnock (1973) for not distinguishing the conventionality of those types from the non-conventionality of the other performatives (such as ‘I advise you to go west’) generated by the performative prefix.

Nevertheless, Recanati (1987, 81–86) has given a partial defence of Austin's view, with the claim that there are conventional force indicators, like the interrogative and imperative sentence types. These are according to Recanati associated with the ‘illocutionary force potential’ (1987, 81) of sentences of those types, consisting in the range of illocutionary forces with which they can be directly and normally used. But that is how far the defence of Austin goes. For specific illocutionary types like warning, advising and requesting to be conventional, there would have to be conventional indicators of those specific types, and according to Recanati (1987, 86–93) there aren't. The closest we come are the performative prefixes like ‘I advise you’, ‘I warn you’, ‘I request you to’, but these aren't force-indicating devices: they are part of the descriptive content of sentences. When saying ‘I advise you to go west’, the speaker directly asserts that he advises the addressee to go west, and thereby indirectly advises the addressee to go west. The advising arises as an intended implicature from the descriptive content of the assertion. For assertion in particular, the situation is even worse, on Recanati's view (1987, 163–69). This is because the declarative sentence type is not associated with any uniform illocutionary force potential: declaratives can be used directly for assertoric (constative) as well as for directive and commissive utterances. According to Recanati (1987, 165), giving an order by means of the declarative sentence

(1) When you have finished peeling the potatoes, you'll scrub the latrine

is giving an order directly, not indirectly. The reason is that the speaker does not seem to be reporting anything. However, that (1) cannot be seen as a report depends on the fact that it is in the future tense. There does not, by contrast, seem to be any obstacle to regarding the act as directly a prediction, i.e. a predictive assertion, and indirectly an order (the mechanism would be that the speaker would lack appropriate evidence for the prediction unless he intended the addressee to understand the utterance as an order and had good reasons to expect the addressee both to understand and to comply).

Recanati does, however, also back up his claim that declaratives are force-neutral by remarking (1987, 166) that the view that promises and other commissives, when fully explicit, can only be made indirectly, is suspect. If explicitly made, a promise is expressed by means of a declarative, since there is no commissive sentence type, and if such an utterance is directly an assertion, the promise must be indirect. Maybe that view is in fact suspect, and maybe only a careful study of a large statistical material can give the answer.

The conventionality claim does not only depend on statistics, however. If the existence of illocutionary force conventions is more than the existence of regularities of dispositions to speak and interpret in a population, e.g. along the lines suggested by David Lewis (1969, 1975), or along any other line, then there may well be a statistical form-force correlation without any convention to the effect. There does not seem to be any good prior reason why the existence of a correlation must be explained by the existence of a convention.

Return to main text.