Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Assertion


The alternative strategy is to try to account for what is intuitively asserted, by means of a combination of semantic and pragmatic means. For example, in the case of the step from

The ham sandwich left without paying


The guest that had ordered the ham sandwich left the restaurant without paying

on several current theories, two pragmatic phenomena are involved, both of which add content to what is literally expressed. First there is the adding of ‘the restaurant’, i.e. adding an argument to the verb ‘leave’, without which the sentence isn't truth evaluable. This is called saturation by Recanati (2001, 299; 2004, 7–10), completion impliciture by Bach (1994) and explicature in Relevance Theory (Sperber and Wilson 1992, 182). Secondly, there is the addition of ‘the guest that had ordered’, which isn't necessary in that way. This is called free enrichment by Recanati (2001, 300; 2004, 10), expansion impliciture by Bach, and again explicature in Relevance Theory.

Although there are different views of the mechanisms involved in successful communication of this kind, with pragmatically added content, it is hard to deny that the phenomenon is real (but see Stanley 2000). According to skeptical views, no systematic meaning theory can specify the content of any assertion, because the content will always be different from the meaning of the sentence used according to such a theory. There is accordingly pessimism about a systematic understanding the pragmatics involved (Cappelen and Lepore 2005), and pessimism about a systematic semantic theory because that (Travis 1985, Recanati 2004). There is also some optimism about combining semantics theory with general pragmatic principles (e.g. Recanati).

The considerations above concerned the relation between utterance content and non-linguistic context. There is also, however, a complex of issues concerning linguistic context and utterance content. To take a classical example, in the discourse

A man walks in the park. He whistles.

the second sentence, ‘he whistles’, does not have a self-contained truth conditional content, not even relative to context. There is no assignment of a referent to the pronoun ‘he’ that gives the truth conditions of ‘he whistles’ in this discourse. Rather, the addition of this second sentence has the function of adding information. More precisely, it has the function of adding information in such a way that what information is added depends on what information we start out with. The first sentence gives the information (relative to contextual parameters of time and place) that there is a man that walks in the park, and after the addition we have the more complete information that there is a man that walks in the park and whistles. If truth conditions is a set of possible worlds, then because of the addition the truth conditions of the whole discourse is a proper subset of the truth conditions of the first sentence; the range of possibilities has been narrowed down.

The meaning of the second sentence should then be characterized as a function that maps truth conditions on truth conditions, rather than simply as truth conditions. This can be generalized to all sentences, since simple truth conditions correspond to additions that don't depend on what information one starts out with (the function involved is then just the intersection of the initial set of worlds with the added set, and if you don't have any prior information, the initial set is the entire universe of worlds, in which case the intersection is identical with the second set). If the utterance that adds the second sentence is an assertion in its own right, then these considerations give a reason for denying that in general assertoric content is truth conditions. Theories of discourse semantics, concerned with phenomena of this kind, include Discourse Representation Theory (Kamp and Reyle 1993) and Dynamic Predicate Logic (Groenendijk and Stokhof 1991). Stalnaker's account (Stalnaker 1970, 1974, 1978) of the interplay between context and assertion offers a more general perspective of the phenomenon.

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