# The Algebra of Logic Tradition

*First published Mon Mar 2, 2009; substantive revision Fri May 1, 2009*

The algebra of logic as introduced by Boole in his *Mathematical
Analysis of Logic* (1847) was designed to provide an algorithmic
alternative (via a slight modification of ordinary algebra) to the
traditional *catalog* approach of Aristotelian logic. However,
three-fourths of the way through this book, after finishing his
discussion of Aristotelian logic, Boole started to develop the general
tools that would be used in his *Laws of Thought* (1854) to
greatly extend the Aristotelian logic by permitting an
argument to have many premises and to involve many classes. To handle
the infinitely many possible logical arguments of this expanded logic,
he presented theorems that provided key tools for an algorithmic
analysis (a catalog was no longer feasible).

From this point until the monumental *Principia Mathematica*
(1910–1913) of Whitehead and Russell (based on Frege's now
famous work on logic), versions of the algebra of logic were the
primary form of logic. (The contributions of Frege to logic date from
the period 1879–1903; at the time they had very little
influence.) Jevons (1864) changed Boole's partial operation of union
of disjoint sets to the modern unrestricted union and eliminated
Boole's dubious use of uninterpretable terms. Peirce (1880) eliminated
the Aristotelian derivation of particular statements from universal
statements by giving the modern semantics for “All *A*
is *B*.” Also he extended the algebra of logic for
classes to the algebra of logic for binary relations and introduced
general sums and products to handle quantification. Schröder,
using the framework developed by Peirce, organized and greatly
fleshed-out the 19th century achievements in the algebra of logic in
his three-volume master-work *Algebra der Logik*
(1890–1910); in particular, as Tarski noted, “Peirce's
work was continued and extended in a very thorough and systematic
way…”

Whitehead and Russell rejected the algebra of logic approach, with
its equational formulations and notations borrowed from ordinary
algebra, in favor of an approach developed by Frege (augmented by the
notation of Peano), namely to use logical connectives, relation symbols
and quantifiers. Hilbert soon picked up on the approach of
*Principia*, and the algebra of logic fell out of favor until
1941 when Tarski returned to the relation algebra of Peirce as
presented in Schröder's *Algebra der Logik*.

Tarski's paper treated relation algebras as an equationally defined
class—such a class has many models besides the
*collection of all binary relations on a given universe* that
was considered in the 1800s, just as there are many Boolean algebras
besides the *power set Boolean algebras* studied in the
1800s. In the years 1948–1952 Tarski, along with his students
Chin and Thompson, created cylindric algebras as an algebraic logic
companion to first-order logic, and in 1956 Halmos introduced polyadic
algebras for the same purpose. As Halmos (1956) noted, these new
algebraic logics tended to focus on studying the extent to which they
captured first-order logic and on their universal algebraic aspects
such as axiomatizations and structure theorems, but offered little
insight into the nature of the first-order logic which inspired their
creation.

- 1. 1847—The Beginnings of the Modern Versions of the Algebra of Logic
- 2. 1854—Boole's Final Presentation of his Algebra of Logic
- 3. Jevons: An Algebra of Logic Based on Total Operations
- 4. Peirce: Basing the Algebra of Logic on Subsumption
- 5. De Morgan and Peirce: Relations and Quantifiers in the Algebra of Logic
- 6. Huntington: Axiomatic Investigations of the Algebra of Logic
- 7. Stone: Models for the Algebra of Logic
- 8. Skolem: Quantifier Elimination and Decidability
- 9. Tarski and the Revival of Algebraic Logic

## 1. 1847—The Beginnings of the Modern Versions of the Algebra of Logic

In late 1847, Boole and De Morgan each published a book on
logic—Boole's *Mathematical Analysis of Logic*
(1847) and De Morgan's *Formal Logic* (1847). De
Morgan's approach was to dissect every aspect of Aristotelian
logic into its minutest components, to consider ways to generalize
these components, and then, in some cases, undertake to build a logical
system using these components. Unfortunately, he was never able to
incorporate his best ideas into a significant system. His omission of a
symbol for equality made it impossible to develop an equational algebra
of logic. It seems that synthesis was not De Morgan's strong
suite.

Boole approached logic from a completely different perspective, namely how to cast Aristotelian logic in the garb of symbolical algebra. Using symbolical algebra was a theme with which he was well-acquainted from his work in differential equations, and from the various papers of his young friend and mentor Gregory, who made attempts to cast other subjects such as geometry into the language of symbolical algebra. Since the application of symbolical algebra to differential equations had proceeded through the introduction of differential operators, it must have been natural for Boole to look for operators that applied in the area of Aristotelian logic. He readily came up with the idea of using “selection” operators, for example, a selection operator for the color red would select the red members from a class. In his 1854 book, Boole realized that it was simpler to omit selection operators and work directly with classes. (However he kept the selection operators to justify his claim that his laws of logic were not ultimately based on observations concerning the use of language, but were actually deeply rooted in the processes of the human mind.) From now on in this article, when discussing Boole's 1847 book, the selection operators have been replaced with the simpler direct formulation using classes.

Since symbolical algebra was just the syntactic side of ordinary
algebra, Boole needed ways to interpret the usual operations and
constants of algebra to create his algebra of logic for classes.
Multiplication was interpreted as intersection, leading to his one new
law, the idempotent law *X**X* = *X* for
multiplication. Addition was defined as union, provided one was
dealing with *disjoint* classes; and subtraction as class
difference, provided one was subtracting a subclass from a class. In
other cases, the addition and subtraction operations were simply
undefined, or as Boole wrote,
*uninterpretable*. The usual laws of arithmetic told Boole that
1 must be the universe and 1−*X* must
be the complement of *X*.

The next step in Boole's system was to translate the four kinds of
categorical propositions into equations, for example
“All *X* is
*Y*” becomes *X* = *X**Y*, and
“Some *X* is *Y*” becomes *V*
= *X**Y*, where *V* is a new symbol. To
eliminate the middle term in a syllogism Boole borrowed an elimination
theorem from ordinary algebra, but it was too weak for his algebra of
logic. This would be remedied in his 1854 book. Boole found that he
could not always derive the desired conclusions with the above
translation of particular propositions (i.e., those with existential
import), so he added the variants *X*
= *V**Y*, *Y* = *V**X*,
and *V**X* = *V**Y*. (See the entry on
Boole.)

The symbolical algebra of the 1800s included much more than just the
algebra of polynomials, and Boole experimented to see which results
and tools might apply to the algebra of logic. For example, he proved
one of his results by using an infinite series expansion. His
fascination with the possibilities of ordinary algebra led him to
consider questions such as: What would logic be like if the idempotent
law were replaced by the law *X*^{3} = *X*? His
successors, especially Jevons, would soon narrow the operations on
classes to the ones that we use today, namely union, intersection and
complement.

As mentioned earlier, three-fourths of the way through his brief book of 1847, after finishing derivations of the traditional Aristotelian syllogisms in his system, Boole announced that his algebra of logic was capable of far more general applications. Then he proceeded to add general theorems on developing (expanding) terms, providing interpretations of equations, and using long division to express one class in an equation in terms of the other classes (with side conditions added).

Boole's theorems, completed and perfected in 1854, gave algorithms for analyzing infinitely many argument forms. This was the death knell for Aristotelian logic, where for centuries scholars had struggled to come up with clever mnemonics to memorize a very small catalog of valid conversions and syllogisms and their various interrelations.

De Morgan's *Formal Logic* was largely ignored, primarily
because it was a large collection of small facts without a significant
synthesis. Boole's *Mathematical Analysis of Logic* had
powerful methods that caught the attention of a few scholars such as
De Morgan and Cayley; but immediately there were serious questions
about the workings of Boole's algebra of logic: Just how closely was
it tied to ordinary algebra? How could Boole justify the procedures of
his algebra of logic? In retrospect it seems quite certain that Boole
did not know why his system worked. His claim, following Gregory, that
in order to justify using ordinary algebra it was enough to check the
commutative law *XY* = *YX* for
multiplication and the distributive law *X*(*Y* + *Z*)
= *X**Y* + *X**Z*, is clearly
false. Nonetheless it is also likely that he had checked his results
in sufficiently many cases to give substance to his belief that his
system was correct.

## 2. 1854–Boole's Final Presentation of his Algebra of Logic

In his second book, *The Laws of Thought*, Boole started by
augmenting the laws of his 1847 algebra of logic (without explicitly
saying that his previous list of three axioms was inadequate), and made
some comments on the rule of inference (performing the same operation
on both sides of an equation). But then he casually stated that the
foundation of his system actually rested on a single (new) principle,
namely
it sufficed to check an argument by seeing if it was correct when the
the class symbols took on only the values 0 and 1, and the operations
were the usual arithmetical operations. Let us call this
*Boole's Rule of 0 and 1*. No meaningful
justification was given for Boole's adoption of this new foundation,
it was not given a special name, and the scant references to it in the
rest of the book were usually rather clumsily stated.

The development of the algebra of logic in the *Laws of
Thought* proceeded much as in his 1847 book, with minor changes to
his translation scheme, and with the selection operators replaced by
classes. There is a new and very important theorem (correcting the one
he had used in 1847), the Elimination Theorem, which says the
following: given an
equation *F*(*x*, *y*, *z*, …) = 0
in the class symbols *x*, *y*, *z*, etc., the
most general conclusion that follows from eliminating certain of the
class symbols is obtained by (1) substituting 0s and 1s
into *F*(*x*, *y*, *z*, …) for the
symbols to be eliminated, in all possible ways, then (2) multiplying
these various substitution instances together and setting the product
equal to 0. Thus eliminating *y* and *z*
from *F*(*x*, *y*, *z*) = 0 gives
*F*(*x*, 0, 0)*F*(*x*, 0,
1)*F*(*x*, 1, 0)*F*(*x*, 1, 1) = 0.

Otherwise, from an algebra of logic point of view, the 1854 treatment at times seems less elegant than that in the 1847 book, but it gives a much richer insight into how Boole thinks about the foundations for his algebra of logic. The final chapter on logic, Chapter XV, was an attempt to give a uniform proof of the Aristotelian conversions and syllogisms. (It is curious that prior to Chapter XV Boole did not present any examples of arguments involving particular propositions.) The details of Chapter XV are quite involved, mainly because of the increase in size of expressions when the Elimination and Development Theorems are applied. Boole simply left most of the work to the reader. Later commentators would gloss over this chapter, and no one seems to have worked through its details.

Aside from the Rule of 0 and 1 and the Elimination Theorem, the 1854 presentation is mainly interesting for Boole's attempts to justify his algebra of logic. He argued that in symbolical algebra it was quite acceptable to carry out equational deductions with partial operations, just as one would when the operations were total, as long as the terms in the premises and the conclusion were interpretable. He said this was the way ordinary algebra worked with the uninterpretable √−1, the square root of −1. (The geometric interpretation of complex numbers was recognized early on by Wessel, Argand, and Gauss, but it was only with the publications of Gauss and Hamilton in the 1830s that doubts about the acceptability of complex numbers in the larger mathematical community were overcome. It is curious that in 1854 Boole regarded √−1 as uninterpretable.)

There were a number of concerns regarding Boole's approach to the algebra of logic:

- Was there a meaningful tie between his algebra of logic and the algebra of numbers, or was it just an accident that they were so similar?
- Could one handle particular propositions in an algebraic logic that focused on equations?
- Was it really acceptable to work with uninterpretable terms in equational derivations?
- Was Boole using Aristotelian semantics (where class symbols were nonempty)?

## 3. Jevons: An Algebra of Logic Based on Total Operations

Jevons, who had studied with De Morgan, was the first to offer an
alternative to Boole's system. In 1863 he wrote to Boole that surely
Boole's operation of addition should be replaced by the more natural
‘inclusive or’ (or ‘union’), leading to the
law *X* + *X* = *X*. Boole completely rejected
this suggestion (it would have destroyed his system which was based on
ordinary algebra) and broke off the correspondence. Jevons published
his system in his 1864 book, *Pure Logic*. By
‘pure’ he meant that he was casting off any dependence on
the algebra of numbers—instead of classes, which are associated
with quantity, he would use predicates, which are associated with
quality, and his laws would be derived directly from the (total)
fundamental operations of inclusive-disjunction and conjunction. But
he kept Boole's use of equations as the fundamental form of statements
in his algebra of logic.

By adopting De Morgan's convention of using upper-case/lower-case
letters for complements, Jevons' system was not suited to provide
equational axioms for modern Boolean algebra. However, he refined his
system of axioms and rules of inference until the result was
essentially the modern system of Boolean algebra for
*ground terms*, that is, terms where the class symbols are to be
thought of as constants, not as variables.

Note: Modern equational logic deals with *universally
quantified* equations (which would have been called *laws*
in the 1800s). In the 19th century algebra of logic one could
translate “All *X* is *Y*” as the
equation *X* = *X**Y*. This is *not* to be
viewed as the universally quantified expression
(∀*X*)(∀*Y*)(*X*
= *X**Y*). *X* and *Y* are to be treated
as constants. Terms that only have constants (no variables) are
called *ground* terms.

By carrying out this analysis in the special setting of an algebra of predicates (or equivalently, in an algebra of classes) Jevons played an important role in the development of modern equational logic. As mentioned earlier, Boole gave inadequate sets of equational axioms for his system, originally starting with the two laws due to Gregory plus his idempotent law; these were accompanied by De Morgan's inference rule that one could carry out the same operation (Boole's fundamental operations in his algebra of logic were addition, subtraction and multiplication) on equals and obtain equals. Boole then switched to the mysterious (no one knew why it should work!), simple and powerful Rule of 0 and 1.

Having replaced Boole's fundamental operations with total operations, Jevons proceeded, over a period of many years, to work on the axioms and rules for his system. Some elements of equational logic that we now take for granted required a considerable number of years for Jevons to resolve:

*The Reflexive Law* (*A*=*A*). In 1864
Jevons listed this as a postulate (p. 11) and then in §24 he
referred to *A* = *A* as a “useless Identical
proposition.” In his 1869 paper on substitution it became the
“Law of Identity.” In the
*Principles of Science* (1874) it was one of the three
“Fundamental Laws of Thought.”

*The Symmetric Law* (*B* = A follows from *A*
= *B*). In 1864 Jevons wrote “*A*
= *B* and *B* = *A* are the same
statement.” This is a position he would maintain. In 1874 he
wrote “I shall consider the two forms *A* = *B*
and *B* = *A* to express exactly the same identity
written differently.”

For a final form of his algebra of logic we turn to the laws which
he had scattered over 40 pages in *Principles of Science*
(1874), having replaced his earlier use of + by ·|·,
evidently to move further away from any appearance of a connection with
the algebra of numbers:

Laws of Combination

A=AA=AAA= &c.Law of Simplicity (p. 33) AB=BAA Law of Commutativeness (p. 35) A·|·A=ALaw of Unity (p. 72) A·|·B=B·|·AA Law of Commutativeness (p. 72) A( B·|·C) =AB·|·AC(no name given) (p. 76)

Laws of Thought

A=ALaw of Identity (p. 74) Aa=oLaw of Contradiction (p. 74) A=AB·|·AbLaw of Duality (p. 74)

For his single rule of inference Jevons chose his principle of substitution—in modern terms this was essentially a combination of ground replacement and transitivity. He showed how to derive transitivity of equality from this; he could have derived symmetry as well but did not. The associative law was missing—it was implicit in the lack of parentheses in his expressions.

It was only in his *Studies in Deductive Logic* (1880) that
Jevons mentioned McColl's use of an accent to indicate negation.
After noting that McColl's accent allowed one to take the
negation of complex bracketed terms he went on to say that, for the
most part, he found the notation of De Morgan, the notation that he had
always used, to be the more elegant.

## 4. Peirce: Basing the Algebra of Logic on Subsumption

Peirce started his research into the algebra of logic in the late
1860s, independently arriving at the same conclusion that Jevons had
reached earlier, that one needed to replace Boole's partial operation
of addition with the total operation of union. In his important 1880
paper, “On the Algebra of Logic,” Peirce quietly broke
with the Aristotelian semantics of classes and introduced modern
semantics, allowing a class symbol to be empty (as well as to be the
universe), and stated the truth values of the categorical propositions
that we use today. For example, he said the proposition
“All *A* is *B*” is true if *A*
and *B* are both the empty class. Conversion by
Limitation, that is, the argument “All *A*
is *B*” therefore “Some *B*
is *A*,” was no longer a valid inference. Peirce said
nothing about the reasons for and merits of his departure from
Aristotelian semantics.

Peirce also broke with Boole's and Jevons' use of equality as the fundamental primitive, using instead “subsumption,” that is, the subclass relation. He stated the partial order properties of subsumption and then proceeded to define the operations of + and × as least upper bounds and greatest lower bounds—he implicitly assumed such bounds existed—and listed the key equational properties of the algebras with two binary operations that we now call lattices. Then he claimed that the distributive law followed, but said the proof was too tedious to include.

Ernst Schröder challenged Peirce to provide a proof of the
distributive law. Peirce (1885) admitted that he could not provide a
proof. Years later Huntington (1904, pp. 300–301) described part
of the content of a December, 1903, letter he had received from Peirce
that claimed to provide the missing proof—evidently Peirce had
stumbled across the long lost pages after the death of Schröder
in 1902. Peirce explained to Huntington that he had originally assumed
Schröder's challenge was well-founded and that this apparent
shortcoming of his paper “was to be added to the list of
blunders, due to the grippe, with which that paper abounds,
…” Actually Peirce's proof did not correct the error
since the distributive law does not hold in lattices in general;
instead his proof brought in the operation of complementation—he
used the axiom ‘if *a* is not contained in the complement
of *b* then *a* and *b* have a common lower
bound’.

Inspired by Peirce's work, Schröder wrote an encyclopedic
three volume work at the end of the 19th century called *Algebra der
Logik* (1890–1910), built on the subsumption framework with
the modern semantics of classes as presented by Peirce. The first
volume concerned the equational logic of classes, the main result being
Boole's Elimination Theorem of 1854. Three rather complicated
counter-examples to Peirce's claim of distributivity appeared in
an appendix to Vol. I, one of which involved nine-hundred and ninety
identities for quasigroups. This volume in turn inspired Dedekind
(1897) to compose an elegant modern abstract presentation of lattices
(which he called Dualgruppen); in this paper he presented a
five-element counter-example to Peirce's claim of the
distributive law.

Volume II augments the algebra of logic for classes developed in
Volume I so that it can handle existential statements. First, using
modern semantics, Schröder proved that one cannot use equations
to express “Some *X* is *Y*.” However, he
noted that one can easily express it with a negated equation,
namely *X**Y* ≠ 0. Volume II, a study of the calculus
of classes using both equations and negated equations, attempted to
cover the same topics covered in Vol. I, in particular there was
considerable effort devoted to finding an Elimination Theorem. After
dealing with several special cases, Schröder recommended this
topic as an important research area—the quest for an Elimination
Theorem would be known as the Elimination Problem.

## 5. De Morgan and Peirce: Relations and Quantifiers in the Algebra of Logic

De Morgan wrote a series of six papers called “On the Syllogism” in the years 1846 to 1863. In his efforts to generalize the syllogism, De Morgan (1850) replaced the copula “is” with a general binary relation in the second paper of the series. By allowing different binary relations in the two premises of a syllogism, he was led to introduce the composition of the two binary relations to express the conclusion of the syllogism. In this pursuit of generalized syllogisms he introduced various other operations on binary relations, including the converse operation, and he developed a fragment of a calculus for these operations. His main paper on this subject was the fourth (1860) in the series, called “On the syllogism, No. IV, and on the logic of relations.”

Inspired by De Morgan's 1860 paper, Peirce (1870) lifted Boole's work to the setting of binary relations—with binary relations one had, in addition to union, intersection and complement, the natural operations of composition and converse. Like De Morgan, Peirce also considered a number of other natural operations on relations. Peirce's main paper on the subject was “On the Algebra of Logic” (1880). By employing unrestricted unions, denoted by Σ, and unrestricted intersections, denoted by Π, Peirce thus introduced quantifiers into his algebra of logic. De Morgan gets credit for introducing the concept of relations, but Peirce is considered the true creator of the theory of relations.

Schröder examined the algebra of logic for binary relations in
Vol. III of his *Algebra der Logik*. One item of particular
fascination for him was this: given an
equation *E*(*x*, *y*, *z*, …) = 0
in this algebra, find the general solution for one of the relation
symbols, say for *x*, in terms of the other relation
symbols. He managed, given a particular solution *x*
= *x*_{0}, to find a remarkable
term *S*(*t*, *y*, *z*, …) with the
following properties: (1) *x*
= *S*(*t*, *y*, *z*, …) yields a
solution to *E* = 0 for any choice of relation *t*, and
(2) every solution *x* of *E* = 0 can be obtained in
this manner by choosing a suitable *t*. Peirce was not
impressed by Schröder's preoccupation with the problem of solving
equations, and pointed out that Schröder's parametric solution
was a bit of a hoax—the expressive power of the algebra of logic
for relations was so strong that by evaluating the
term *S*(*t*, *y*, *z*, …) one
essentially carried out the steps to check
if *E*(*t*, *y*, *z*, …) = 0; if
the answer was yes then *S*(*t*, *y*, *z*,
…) returned the value *t*, otherwise it would return the
value *x*_{0}.

## 6. Huntington: Axiomatic Investigations of the Algebra of Logic

Hilbert's 1899 presentation of Euclidean geometry as an axiomatic subject (that did not depend on drawings for its proofs) led to a wave of interest in studying axiom systems in mathematics; in particular one wanted to know if the axioms were independent, and which primitives led to the most elegant systems. Huntington was one of the first to examine this issue for the algebra of logic. In his 1904 paper he gave three axiomatizations of the algebra of logic, showed each set of axioms was independent, and that they were equivalent. In 1933 he returned to this topic with three new sets of axioms, one of which was the following three-equation system:

a+b=b+a

(a+b) +c=a+ (b+c)

(a′ +b′)′ + (a′ +b)′ =a.

Shortly after this Herbert Robbins conjectured that the third equation could be replaced by the slightly simpler

[(a+b)′ + (a+b′)′]′ =a.

Neither Huntington nor Robbins could prove this, and later it withstood the efforts of many others, including even Tarski and his talented school at Berkeley. Building on partial results of Winker, the automated theorem prover EQP, designed by William McCune of the Argonne National Laboratory, found a proof of the Robbins Conjecture in 1996. This accomplishment was written up as “Computer Math Proof Shows Reasoning Power” in the New York Times, December 10, 1996, by Gina Kolata.

According to Huntington (1933), the term “Boolean
algebra” was introduced by Sheffer (1913) in the paper where he
showed that one could give a five-equation axiomatization of Boolean
algebra using the single fundamental operation of joint exclusion, now
known as the Sheffer stroke. Whitehead and Russell claimed in the
preface to the second edition of *Principia* that this was the
greatest advance in logic since the publication of *Principia*.
(Hilbert and Ackermann (1928), by contrast, stated that the Sheffer
stroke was just a curiosity.) Neither realized that decades earlier
Schröder had discovered that the dual of the Sheffer stroke was
also such an operation—Schröder's symbol for his
operation was that of a double-edged sword.

In the 1930s Garrett Birkhoff established the fundamental results of equational logic, namely (1) equational classes of algebras are precisely the classes closed under homomorphisms, subalgebras and direct products, and (2) equational logic is based on five rules: reflexivity, symmetry, transitivity, replacement, and substitution. In the 1940s, Tarski joined in this development of equational logic; the subject progressed rapidly from the 1950s till the present time.

## 7. Stone: Models for the Algebra of Logic

Aristotelian logic studied certain simple relationships between
classes, namely *being a subclass of* and *having a nonempty
intersection with*. However, once one adopted an axiomatic
approach, the topic of possible models besides the obvious ones
surfaced. Beltrami introduced models of non-Euclidean geometry in the
late 1860s. In the 1890s Schröder and Dedekind
constructed models of
the axioms of lattice theory to show that the distributive law did not
follow. But when it came to the algebra of classes,
Schröder
considered only the standard models, namely each was the collection of
all subclasses of a given class.

The study of general models of the axioms of Boolean algebra did not
get underway until the late 1920s; it was soon brought to a very high
level in the work of Stone (1936, 1937). He was interested in the
structure of rings of linear operators and realized that the central
idempotents, that is, the operators *E* that commuted with all
other operators in the ring under multiplication (that
is, *E**L* = *L**E* for all *L* in
the ring) and which were idempotent under multiplication
(*E**E* = *E*) played an important role. In a
natural way, the central idempotents formed a Boolean algebra.

Pursuing this direction of research led Stone to ask about the
structure of an arbitrary Boolean algebra, a question that he answered
by proving that *every Boolean algebra is isomorphic to a Boolean
algebra of sets*. In his work on Boolean algebras he noticed a
certain analogy between kernels of homomorphisms and the ideals studied
in ring theory—this led him to give the name “ideal”
to such kernels. Not long after this he discovered a translation
between Boolean algebras and Boolean rings; under this translation the
ideals of a Boolean algebra corresponded precisely to the ideals of the
associated Boolean ring. His next major contribution was to establish a
correspondence between Boolean algebras and certain topological spaces
now called Boolean spaces (or Stone spaces). This correspondence would
later prove to be a valuable tool in the construction of exotic Boolean
algebras. These results of Stone are still a paradigm for developments
in the algebra of logic.

Inspired by the rather brief treatment of first-order statements
about relations in Vol. III of the *Algebra der Logik*,
Löwenheim (1915) showed that if such a statement could be
satisfied in an infinite domain then it could be satisfied in a
denumerable domain. Skolem (1920) simplified Löwenheim's
proof by introducing Skolem normal forms, and in 1928 Skolem replaced
his use of normal forms with a simpler idea, namely to use what are now
called Skolem functions. He used these functions to convert first-order
sentences into univeral sentences, that is, into sentences in prenex form
with all quantifiers being universal (∀).

## 8. Skolem: Quantifier Elimination and Decidability

Skolem was strongly influenced by Schröder's *Algebra der
Logik*, starting with his PhD Thesis. Later he took a particular
interest in the quest for an Elimination Theorem in the calculus of
classes. In his 1919 paper he established some results for lattices, in
particular, he showed that one could decide the validity of universal
Horn sentences (*i*.e, universal sentences with a matrix that is a
disjunction of negated and unnegated atoms, with at most one positive
atom) by a procedure that we now recognize to be a polynomial time
algorithm. This algorithm was based on finding a least fixed point of a
finite partial lattice under production rules derived from universal
Horn sentences. Although this result, which is equivalent to the
uniform word problem for lattices, was in the same paper as
Skolem's famous contribution to Löwenheim's Theorem,
it was forgotten until a chance rediscovery in the early
1990s. (Whitman (1941) gave a different solution to the more limited
equational decision problem for lattices; it became widely known as the
solution to the word problem in lattices.)

Skolem (1920) gave an elegant solution to the Elimination Problem
posed by Schröder for the calculus of classes by showing that if
one added predicates to express “has at least *n*
elements,” for each *n* = 1, 2, …, then there was
a simple (but often lengthy) procedure to convert a first-order
formula about classes into a quantifier-free formula. In particular
this showed that the first-order theory of the calculus of classes was
decidable. This quantifier-elimination result was used by Mostowski
(1952) to analyze first-order properties of direct powers and direct
sums of single structures, and then by Feferman and Vaught (1959) to
do the same for general direct sums and direct products of
structures.

The elimination of quantifiers became a main method in mathematical logic to prove decidability, and proving decidability was stated as the main problem of mathematical logic in Hilbert and Ackermann (1928)—this goal was dropped in subsequent editions because of the famous undecidability result of Church and Turing.

## 9. Tarski and the Revival of Algebraic Logic

Tarski revived the algebra of relations in his 1941 paper “On the Calculus of Relations.” First he outlined a formal logic based on allowing quantification over both elements and relations, and then he turned to a more detailed study of the quantifier-free formulas of this system that involved only relation variables. After presenting a list of axioms that obviously held in the algebra of relations as presented in Schröder's third volume he proved that these axioms allowed one to reduce quantifier-free relation formulas to equations. Thus his calculus of relations became the study of a certain equational theory which he noted had the same relation to the study of all binary relations on sets as the equational theory of Boolean algebra had to the study of all subsets of sets. This led to questions paralleling those already posed and resolved for Boolean algebras, for example, was every model of his axioms for relation algebras isomorphic to an algebra of relations on a set? One question had been answered by Korselt, namely there were first-order sentences in the theory of binary relations that were not equivalent to an equation in the calculus of relations—thus the calculus of relations definitely had a weaker expressive power than the first-order theory of relations. Actually the expressive power of relation algebra is exactly equivalent to first-order logic with just three variables. However, if in relation algebras (the calculus of relations) one wants to formalize a set theory which has something such as the pair axiom, then one can reduce many variables to three variables, and so it is possible to express any first-order statement of such a theory by an equation. Monk (1964) proved that, unlike the calculus of classes, there is no finite equational basis for the calculus of binary relations. Tarski and Givant (1987) showed that the equational logic of relation algebras is so expressive that one can carry out first-order set theory in it.

Cylindric algebras, essentially Boolean algebras equipped with unary
cylindric operations *C*_{x} which are
intended to capture the existential quantifiers (∃*x*),
were introduced in the years 1948–1952 by Tarski, working with
his students Louise Chin and Frederick Thompson (see Henkin, Tarski
(1961)), to create an algebra of logic that captured the expressive
power of the first-order theory of binary relations. Polyadic algebra
is another approach to an algebra of logic for first-order
logic—it was created by Halmos (1956). The focus of work in
these systems was again to see to what extent one could parallel the
famous results of Stone for Boolean algebra from the 1930s.

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## Other Internet Resources

- Algebraic Logic Group, Alfred Reyni Insitute of Mathematics, Hungarian Academy of Sciences
- George Boole, William Jevons, Charles Peirce, Augustus De Morgan, at the The MacTutor History of Mathematics Archive

## Related Entries

algebra | Boole, George | Boolean algebra: the mathematics of | Jevons, William Stanley | logical consequence: propositional consequence relations and algebraic logic | Tarski, Alfred