Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Wittgenstein's Aesthetics

First published Fri Jan 26, 2007

Given the extreme importance that Wittgenstein attached to the aesthetic dimension of life, it is in one sense surprising that he wrote so little on the subject. It is true that we have the notes assembled from his lectures on aesthetics given to a small group of students in private rooms in Cambridge in the summer of 1938 (Wittgenstein 1966) and we have G. E. Moore's record of some of Wittgenstein's lectures in the period 1930-33 (Moore 1972). Of Wittgenstein's own writings, we find remarks on literature, poetry, architecture, the visual arts, and especially music and the philosophy of culture more broadly scattered throughout his writings on the philosophies of language, mind, mathematics, and philosophical method, as well as in his more personal notebooks; a number of these are collected in Culture and Value (Wittgenstein 1980). In another sense, it is not surprising at all, precisely because of the central position he gave to the aesthetic: in writing about questions of meaning, as he did throughout his life from the earliest pre-Tractatus (Wittgenstein 1961, 1971) writings to the remarks from the last weeks of his life in On Certainty (Wittgenstein 1969), in writing about perception, as he did in Part II of Philosophical Investigations (Wittgenstein 1958), Remarks on the Philosophy of Psychology, Volumes I and II (Wittgenstein 1980a, 1980b), and Last Writings on the Philosophy of Psychology, volume I (Wittgenstein 1982), and in writing about the contextual prerequisites to the emergence of sense in his philosophy of mind and language (in (Wittgenstein 1958) as well as his writings on the philosophy of mathematics), he was writing—if at one remove—about aesthetics. For questions of meaning, of perception, and of sense are all clearly central to aesthetic experience, and the writing he undertook on these subjects holds significance for questions of artistic meaning and interpretation that is still being explored and articulated (Lewis 2004, Dauber and Jost 2003, Gibson and Huemer 2004). Wittgenstein placed the aesthetic, not on a distant periphery of philosophical subjects, but then not at the center of a grouping of such interests either—for then it would still be a subject area unto itself. Rather, Wittgenstein interweaves the subject's various and variegated strands throughout his writing in a way that in some cases shows explicitly, and in many more cases suggests implicitly, the layered interconnections between aesthetic considerations and every other area of philosophy upon which he wrote. In this article I will, then, look at the record we have of his lectures on the topic (which, predictably, take up many connections to extra-aesthetic issues along the way), but throughout try to offer a reading of them that situates them into the larger context of his philosophical work.

1. The Critique of Traditional Aesthetics

Wittgenstein's opening remark is double-barreled: he states that the field of aesthetics is both very big and entirely misunderstood. By “very big”, I believe he means both that the aesthetic dimension weaves itself through all of philosophy in the manner suggested above, and that the reach of the aesthetic in human affairs is very much greater than the far more restricted reach of the artistic; the world is densely packed with manifestations of the aesthetic sense or aesthetic interest, while the number of works of art is very much smaller. There is good reason, in his discussions that follow, to believe that he intends that any comprehensive account of the aesthetic would acknowledge the former, and not just – as a good number of philosophical accounts have so restricted themselves – the latter. By “entirely misunderstood”, it emerges that he means both (1) that aesthetic questions are of a conceptual type very distinct from empirical questions and the kind of answer, or conceptual satisfaction, we want is very unlike what we might get from an experiment in empirical psychology, and (2) that the philosophically traditional method of essentialistic definition – determining the essence that all members of the class “works of art” exhibit and by virtue of which they are so classified – will conceal from our view more than it reveals. 

1.1 Properties and Essence

It is also vividly apparent from the outset of these lectures that Wittgenstein is urging a heightened vigilance to the myriad ways in which words can, on their grammatical surface, mislead. If, right at the beginning of the inquiry, we see that we use the word “beautiful” as an adjective, we may well very shortly find ourselves asking what is the essence of the property beauty that this particular example exhibits. Imagining a book of philosophy investigating parts of speech (but very many more parts than we find in an ordinary grammar book) where we would give very detailed and nuanced attention to “seeing”, “feeling”, along with other verbs of personal experience, and equally lengthy studies of “all”, “any”, “some”, numerals, first person pronoun usages, and so forth, he suggests that such a book would, with sufficient attention paid to the contextual intricacies of the grammar of each usage, lay bare the confusion into which language can lead us. Later, in his Philosophical Investigations (Wittgenstein 1958), he will go on to famously develop the analogy between tools and language as a way of breaking the hold of the conceptual picture that words work in one way (by naming things—including the naming of properties, as in the way we too-quickly think of the problem of beauty above), showing the diversity of kind and of use among the various things we find in the tool box (e.g. hammer, glue, chisel, matches). If we redirect our attention, away from the idée fixe of the puzzle concerning the common property named by the word “beauty” or the description “beautiful”, and look to the actual use to which our aesthetic-critical vocabulary is put, we will see that it is not some intrinsic meaning carried internally by the linguistic sign (Wittgenstein 1958a) that makes the word in question function as an aesthetic or critical interjection or expression of approval. We will, rather, be able to focus our redirected attention on what actually does make the word in question function aesthetically, i.e. “on the enormously complicated situation in which the aesthetic expression has a place”, and he adds that, with such an enlarged vision, we see that “the expression itself has almost a negligible place” (p. 2). He here mentions (seeing aesthetic issues as interwoven with the rest of philosophy) that if he had to identify the main mistake made in philosophical work of his generation, it would be precisely that of, when looking at language, focusing on the form of words, and not the use made of the form of words. He will go on to imply, if not quite to directly assert, that the parallel holds to the work of art: to see it within a larger frame of reference, to see it in comparison to other works of the artist in question and to see it juxtaposed with still other works from its cultural context, is to see what role itplayed in the dialogically unfolding artistic “language-game”[1] of its time and place. In using language, he says next in the lectures, in understanding each other—and in mastering a language initially—we do not start with a small set of words or a single word, but rather from specific occasions and activities. Our aesthetic engagements are occasions and activities of just this kind; thus aesthetics, as a field of conceptual inquiry, should start not from a presumption that the central task is to analyze the determinant properties that are named by aesthetic predicates, but rather with a full-blooded consideration of the activities of aesthetic life.

1.2 Predicates and Rules

But the adjectival form of many—not all—critical predicates quickly reinforces the “property-with-name” model, and against this Wittgenstein places examples from musical and poetical criticism, where we simply call attention to the rightness of a transition or to the precision or aptness of an image. And it is here that Wittgenstein reminds us that descriptions such as “stately”, “pompous”, or “melancholy” (where the latter is said of a Schubert piece) are like giving the work a face (Shiner 1978), or we could instead (or in further specification of such descriptions) use gestures.[2] In cases of re-construing a work (e.g. the meter of a poem) so that we understand its rhythm and structure anew, we make gestures, facial expressions, and non-descriptive-predicate based remarks, where aesthetic adjectives play a diminished role or no role at all. And we show our approval of a tailor's work not by describing the suit, but by wearing it. Occasions and activities are fundamental, descriptive language secondary.

Wittgenstein here turns to the subject of rules, and rule-following, in aesthetic decision-making. This stems from his reflection on the word “correct” in aesthetic discourse, and he mentions the case of being drilled in harmony and counterpoint. Such rule-learning, he claims, allows what he calls an interpretation of the rules in particular cases, where an increasingly refined judgment comes from an increasingly refined mastery of the rules in question. It is of particular interest that a qualification is entered here, that such rules in contexts of artistic creativity and aesthetic judgment, “may be extremely explicit and taught, or not formulated at all” (Wittgenstein 1966). This itself strongly suggests that, in this way too, actions come first, where these actions may (to invoke Kant's famous distinction) either explicitly follow from the rule, or stand in accordance with them but (for Wittgenstein) in an inexplicit way. The mastery of a practice can be, but need not be, characterized as a cognitive matter of rule-following. Here we thus find one of the points of intersection between Wittgenstein's work in aesthetics and his work in the philosophy of language: the rule-following considerations (Holtzman and Leich 1981 and McDowell 1998) and the debate concerning non-cognitivism (McDowell 2000) link directly to this discussion.

Regrettably, Wittgenstein closes this matter prematurely (claiming that this issue should not come in at this point); the linkage between rule-following in language and in aesthetics is still to this day too little investigated. Yet there is a sense in which Wittgenstein extends the discussion, if only implicitly. In investigating the kinds of things meant by aesthetic “appreciation”, he does say that “an appreciator is not shown by the interjections he uses but rather by his choices, selections, his actions on specific occasions. To describe what appreciation consists in, he claims, would prove an impossibility, for “to describe what it consists in we would have to describe the whole environment” (Wittgenstein 1966, 7), and he returns to the case of the tailor—and thus implicitly to rule-following. Such rules, as we discern them in action ranging on a continuum from the cognitively-explicit and linguistically encapsulated to the non-cognitively implicit and only behaviorally manifested, have a life – have an identity as rules—within, and only within, those larger contexts of engagement, those “whole environment[s]”. And those environments, those contexts, those language-games, are not reducible to a unitary kind which we then might analyze for essential properties: “correctness”, for example, plays a central role in some cases of aesthetic appreciation and understanding, and it is irrelevant in others, e.g. in garment-cutting versus Beethoven symphonies, or in domestic architecture versus the Gothic cathedral. And he explicitly draws, if too briefly, the analogy that emerges here between ethics and aesthetics: he notes the difference between saying of a person that he behaves well versus saying that a person made a great or profound impression. Indeed, “the entire game is different” (Wittgenstein 1966, 8).

1.3 Culture and Complexity

The central virtue of these lectures is that Wittgenstein never loses a sense of the complexity of our aesthetic engagements, our language attending and in cases manifesting those engagements, and the contextually embedded nature of the aesthetic actions he is working to elucidate. Nor does he lose a sense of the relation—a relation necessary to the meaning of the aesthetic language we use – between the aesthetically-descriptive expressions we employ within particular contexts and “what we call the culture of the period” (Wittgenstein 1966, 8). Of those aesthetic words, he says, “To describe their use or to describe what you mean by a cultured taste, you have to describe a culture” (Wittgenstein 1966, 8). And again making the relation between his work in the philosophy of language and his work in the philosophy of art explicit (if again too briefly), he adds, “What belongs to a language game is a whole culture” (Wittgenstein 1966, 8). There the link to the irreducible character of rule-following is made again as well: “To describe a set of aesthetic rules fully means really to describe the culture of a period” (Wittgenstein 1966, 8, n. 3). If our aesthetic engagements and the interrelated uses of our aesthetic terms are widely divergent and context-sensitive, so are our aesthetic actions and vocabularies context-sensitive in a larger sense as well: comparing a cultured taste of fin-de-siecle Vienna or early-twentieth-century Cambridge with the Middle Ages, he says—implicitly referring to the radically divergent constellations of meaning-associations from one age to the other, “An entirely different game is played in different ages” (Wittgenstein 1966, p. 8). Of a generic claim made about a person that he or she appreciates a given style or genre of art, Wittgenstein makes it clear that he would not yet know—stated in that generic, case-transcending way—not merely whether it was true or not, but more interestingly and more deeply, what it meant to say this. The word “appreciates” is, like the rest of our aesthetic vocabulary, not detachable from the particular context within which it has its life.[3] If, against this diversity or context-sensitivity, we seek to find and then analyze what all such cases of aesthetic engagement have in common, we might well focus on the word “appreciation”. But that word will not have meaning with a bounded determinacy fixed prior to its contextualized use, which means that we would find ourselves, because of this philosophical strategy (the entire field “is very big and entirely misunderstood”), in a double bind: first, we would not know the meaning of the term upon which we were focusing; and second, we would, in trying to locate what all cases of aesthetic engagement have in common, leave out of view what he calls in this connection “an immensely complicated family of cases” (Wittgenstein 1966), blinding ourselves to nuance and complexity in the name of a falsifying neatness and overarching generality. “In order to get clear about aesthetic words you have to describe ways of living. We think we have to talk about aesthetic judgments like ‘This is beautiful’, but we find that if we have to talk about aesthetic judgments we don’t find these words at all, but a word used something like a gesture, accompanying a complicated activity” (Wittgenstein 1966, 11).

2. The Critique of Scientism

Wittgenstein turns to the idea of a science of aesthetics, an idea for which he has precious little sympathy (“almost too ridiculous for words” [Wittgenstein 1966, 11]). But as is often the case in Wittgenstein's philosophical work, it does not follow from this scornful or dismissive attitude that he has no interest in the etiology of the idea, or in excavating the hidden steps or components of thought that have led some to this idea. In the ensuing discussion he unearths a picture of causation that under-girds the very idea of a scientific explanation of aesthetic judgment or preference. And in working underground in this way, he reveals the analogies to cases of genuine scientific explanation, where the “tracing of a mechanism” just is the process of giving a causal account, i.e. where the observed effect is described as the inevitable result of prior links in the causal chain leading to it. If, to take his example, an architect designs a door and we find ourselves in a state of discontentment because the door, within the larger design of the façade (within its stylistic “language-game”, we might say), is too low, we are liable to describe this on the model of scientific explanation. Then, we make a substantive of the discontent, see it as the causal result of the lowness of the door, and in identifying the lowness as the cause, think ourselves able to dislodge the inner entity, the discontent, by raising the door. But this mischaracterizes our aesthetic reactions, or what we might call, by analogy to moral psychology, our aesthetic psychology.

2.1 Aesthetic Reactions

The true aesthetic reaction—itself rarely described in situ in terms of a proximate cause (“In these cases the word ‘cause’ is hardly ever used at all” [Wittgenstein 1966, 14]) is far more immediate, and far more intertwined with, and related to, what we see in[4] the work of art in question. “It is a reaction analogous to my taking my hand away from a hot plate” (Wittgenstein 1966). He thus says:

To say: “I feel discomfort and know the cause”, is entirely misleading because “know the cause” normally means something quite different. How misleading it is depends on whether when you said: “I know the cause”, you meant it to be an explanation or not. “I feel discomfort and know the cause” makes it sound as if there were two things going on in my soul—discomfort and knowing the cause (Wittgenstein 1966, 14).

But there is, as he next says, a “Why?” to such a case of aesthetic discomfort, if not a cause (on the conventional scientific model). But both the question and its multiform answers will take, indeed, very different forms in different cases. Again, if what he suggested before concerning the significance of context for meaning is right, the very meaning of the “Why?”-question will vary case to case. This is not a weaker thesis concerning variation on the level of inflection, where the underlying structure of the “Why?”-question is causal. No, here again that unifying, model-imposing manner of proceeding would leave out a consideration of the nuances that give the “Why?”-question its determinate sense in the first place.

But again, Wittgenstein's fundamental concern here is to point out the great conceptual gulf that separates aesthetic perplexities from the methodology of empirical psychology. To run studies of quantified responses to controlled and isolated aesthetic stimuli, where emergent patterns of preference, response, and judgment are recorded within a given population's sample, is to pass by the true character of the aesthetic issue—the actual puzzlement, such as we feel it, will be conceptual, not empirical. And here again we see a direct link to his work in the philosophy of psychology: the penultimate passage of Part II of Philosophical Investigations (1958, sec. xiv), was “The existence of the experimental method makes us think we have the means of solving the problems which trouble us; though problem and method pass one another by” (Wittgenstein 1958, II, iv, 232). He says, near the close of this part of his lectures on aesthetics, “Aesthetic questions have nothing to do with psychological experiments, but are answered in an entirely different way” (Wittgenstein 1966, 17). A stimulus-response model adapted from scientific psychology—what we might now call the naturalizing of aesthetics—falsifies the genuine complexities of aesthetic psychology through a methodologically enforced reduction to one narrow and unitary conception of aesthetic engagement. For Wittgenstein complexity, and not reduction to unitary essence, is the route to conceptual clarification. Reduction to a simplified model, by contrast, yields only the illusion of clarification in the form of conceptual incarceration (“a picture held us captive”).[5]

2.2 The “Click” of Coherence

Aesthetic satisfaction, for Wittgenstein, is an experience that is only possible within a culture and where the reaction that constitutes aesthetic satisfaction or justification is both more immediate, and vastly larger and more expansive, than any simple mechanistic account could accommodate. It is more immediate in that it is not usually possible to specify in advance the exact conditions required to produce the satisfaction, or, as he discusses it, the “click” when everything falls into place. Such exacting pre-specifications for satisfaction are possible in narrowly restricted empirical cases where, for example, we wait for two pointers in a vision examination to come into a position directly opposite each other. And this, Wittgenstein says, is the kind of simile we repeatedly use, but misleadingly, for in truth “really there is nothing that clicks or that fits anything” (Wittgenstein 1966, 19). The satisfaction is more immediate, then, than the causal-mechanistic model would imply. And it is much broader than the causal-mechanistic model implies as well: there is no direct aesthetic analogue to the matched pointers in the case of a larger and deeper form of aesthetic gratification. Wittgenstein does, of course, allow that there are very narrow, isolated circumstances within a work where we do indeed have such empirical pre-specifiable conditions for satisfaction (e.g. where in a piece we see that we wanted to hear a minor ninth, and not a minor seventh, chord). But, contrary to the empirical-causal account, these will not add up, exhaustively or without remainder, to the experience of aesthetic satisfaction. The problem, to which Wittgenstein repeatedly returns in these lectures, is with the kind of answer we want to aesthetic puzzlement as expressed in a question like “Why do these bars give me such a peculiar impression?” (Wittgenstein 1966, 20) In such cases, statistical results regarding percentages of subjects who report this peculiar impression rather than another one in precisely these harmonic, rhythmic, and melodic circumstances are not so much impossible as just beside the point; the kind of question we have here is not met by such methods. “The sort of explanation one is looking for when one is puzzled by an aesthetic impression is not a causal explanation, not one corroborated by experience or by statistics as to how people react…. This is not what one means or what one is driving at by an investigation into aesthetics” (Wittgenstein 1966, 21). It is all too easy to falsify, under the influence of explanatory models misappropriated from science, the many and varied kinds of things that happen when, aesthetically speaking, everything seems to click or fall into place.

2.3 The Charm of Reduction

In the next passages of Wittgenstein's lectures he turns to a fairly detailed examination of the distinct charm, for some, of psycho-analytic explanation, and he interweaves this with the distinction between scientific-causal explanation of an action versus motive-based (or personally-generated) explanations of that action. It is easy, but mistaken, to read these passages as simply subject-switching anticipations of his lectures on Freud to follow. His fundamental interest here lies with the powerful charm, a kind of conceptual magnetism, of reductive explanations that promise a brief, compact, and propositionally-encapsulated account of what some much larger field of thought or action “really” is. (He cites the example of boiling Redpath, one of his auditors, down to ashes, etc., and then saying “This is all Redpath really is”, adding the remark “Saying this might have a certain charm, but would be misleading to say the least” (Wittgenstein 1966, 24). “To say the least” indeed: the example is striking precisely because one can feel the attraction of an encapsulating and simplifying reduction of the bewildering and monumental complexity of a human being, while at the same time feeling, as a human being, that any such reduction to a few physical elements would hardly capture the essence of a person. This, he observes, is an explanation of the “This is only really this” form. Reductive causal explanations function in just the same way in aesthetics, and this links directly to the problems in philosophical methodology that he adumbrated in the Blue and Brown Books (1958a, 17–19), particularly where he discusses what he there calls “craving for generality” and the attendant “contemptuous attitude toward the particular case”. If the paradigm of the sciences (which themselves, as he observes in passing, carry an imprimatur of epistemic prestige and the image of incontrovertibility) is Newtonian mechanics, and we then implant that model under our subsequent thinking about psychology, we will almost immediately arrive at an idea of a science of the mind, where that science would progress through the gradual accumulation of psychological laws. (This would constitute, as he memorably puts it, a “mechanics of the soul” [Wittgenstein 1966, 29]). We then dream of a psychological science of aesthetics, where—although “we'd not thereby have solved what we feel to be aesthetic puzzlement” (Wittgenstein 1966, 29)—we may find ourselves able to predict (borrowing the criterion of predictive power from science) what effect a given line of poetry, or a given musical phrase, may have on a certain person whose reaction patterns we have studied. But aesthetic puzzlement, again, is of a different kind, and—here he takes a major step forward, from the critical, to the constructive, phase of his lectures. He writes, “What we really want, to solve aesthetic puzzlements, is certain comparisons—grouping together of certain cases” (Wittgenstein 1966, 29). Such a method, such an approach, would never so much as occur to us were we to remain both dazzled by the misappropriated model of mechanics and contemptuous of the particular case.

3. The Comparative Approach

Comparison, and the intricate process of grouping together certain cases—where such comparative juxtaposition usually casts certain significant features of the work or works in question in higher relief, where it leads to the emergence of an organizational gestalt,[6] where it shows the evolution of a style, or where it shows what is strikingly original about a work, among many other things—also focuses our attention on the particular case in another way. In leading our scrutiny to critically and interpretatively relevant particularities, it leads us away from the aesthetically blinding presumption that it is the effect, brought about by the “cause” of that particular work, that matters (so that any minuet that gives a certain feeling or awakens certain images would do as well as any other).

3.1 Critical Reasoning

These foregoing matters together lead to what is to my mind central to Wittgenstein's thoughts on aesthetics. In observing that on one hearing of a minuet we may get a lot out of it and on the next hearing nothing, he is showing how easy it can be to take conceptual missteps in our aesthetic thought from which it can prove difficult to recover. From such a difference, against how we can all too easily model the matter, it does not follow that what we get out of the minuet is independent of the minuet. That would constitute an imposition of a Cartesian dualism between the two ontologies of mind and matter, but in its aesthetic guise. And that would lead in turn to theories of aesthetic content of a mental kind, where the materials of the art form (materials we would then call “external” materials) only serve to carry the real, internal or non-physical content. Criticism would thus be a process of arguing inferentially from outward evidence back to inward content; creation would be a process of finding outward correlates or carriers for that prior inward content; and artistic intention would be articulated as a full mental pre-conception of the contingently finished (or “externalized”, as we would then call it) work. It is no accident that Wittgenstein immediately moves to the analogy to language and our all-too-easy misconception of linguistic meaning, where we make “the mistake of thinking that the meaning or thought is just an accompaniment of the word, and the word doesn't matter” (Wittgenstein 1966, 25). This indeed would prove sufficient to motivate contempt for the particular case in aesthetic considerations, by misleadingly modeling a dualistic vision of art upon an equally misleading dualistic model of language (Hagberg 1995). “The sense of a proposition”, he says, “is very similar to the business of an appreciation of art” (Wittgenstein 1966, 29). This might also be called a subtractive model, and Wittgenstein captures this perfectly with a question: “A man may sing a song with expression and without expression. Then why not leave out the song—could you have the expression then?” (Wittgenstein 1966, 32 editorial note and footnote) Such a model corresponds, again, to mind-matter Cartesian dualism, which is a conceptual template that also, as we have just seen above, manifests itself in the philosophy of language where we would picture the thought as an inner event and the external word or sign to which it is arbitrarily attached as that inner event's outward corresponding physicalization. It is no surprise that, in this lecture, he turns directly to false and imprisoning pictures of this dualism in linguistic meaning, and then back to the aesthetic case. When we contemplate the expression of a drawn face, it is deeply misleading—or deeply misled, if the dualistic picture of language stands behind this template-conforming thought—to ask for the expression to be given without the face. “The expression”—now linking this discussion back to the previous causal considerations—“is not an effect of the face”. The template of cause-and-effect, and of a dualism of material and expressive content (on the subtractive model), and the construal of the material work of art as a means to the production of a separately-identifiable intangible, experiential end, are all out of place here. All of the examples Wittgenstein gives throughout these lectures combat these pictures, each in their own way.

But then Wittgenstein's examples also work in concert: they together argue against a form of aesthetic reductionism that would pretend that our reactions to aesthetic objects are isolable, that they can be isolated as variables within a controlled experiment, that they can be hermetically sealed as the experienced effects of isolatable causes. He discusses our aesthetic reactions to subtle differences between differently drawn faces, and our equally subtle reactions to the height or design of a door (he is known to have had the ceiling in an entire room of the house in Vienna he designed for his sister moved only a few inches when the builders failed to realize his plan with sufficient exactitude). The enormous subtlety, and the enormous complexity, of these reactions, are a part of—and as complicated as—our natural history. He gives as an example the error, or the crudeness, of someone responding to a complaint concerning the depiction of a human smile (specifically, that the smile did not seem genuine), with the reply that, after all, the lips are only parted one one-thousandths of an inch too much: such differences, however small in measure, in truth matter enormously.

3.2 Seeing Connections

Beneath Wittgenstein's examples, as developed throughout these lectures, lies another interest (which presses its way to the surface and becomes explicit on occasion): he is eager to show the significance of making connections in our perception and understanding of art works—connections between the style of a poet and that of a composer (e.g. Keller and Brahms), between one musical theme and another, between one expressive facial depiction and another, between one period of an artist's work and another. Such connections—we might, reviving a term from first-generation Wittgensteinians, refer to the kind of work undertaken to identify and articulate such connections as “connective analysis”—are, for Wittgenstein, at the heart of aesthetic experience and aesthetic contemplation. And they again are of the kind that reductive causal explanation would systematically miss. In attempting to describe someone's feelings, could we do better than to imitate the way the person actually said the phrase we found emotionally revelatory, Wittgenstein pointedly asks? The disorientation we would feel in trying to describe the person's feeling with subtlety and precision without any possibility of imitating his precise expressive utterance—“the way he said it” – shows how very far the dualistic or subtractive conceptual template is from our human experience, our natural history.

Connections, of the kind alluded to here—a web of variously-activated relations between the particular aspect of the work to which we are presently attending and other aspects, other parts of the work, or other works, groups of works, or other artists, genres, styles, or other human experiences in all their particularity—may include what we call associations awakened by the work, but connections are not reducible to them only (and certainly not to undisciplined, random, highly subjective, or free associations).[7] The impossibility of the simplifying subtractive template emerges here as well: “Suppose [someone says]: ‘Associations are what matter—change it slightly and it no longer has the same associations’. But can you separate the associations from the picture, and have the same thing?” The answer is clearly, again like the case of the singing with and then without expression above, negative: “You can't say: ‘That's just as good as the other: it gives me the same associations’” (Wittgenstein 1966, 34). Here again, Wittgenstein shows the great gulf that separates what we actually do with, what we actually say about, works of art, and how we would speak of them if the conceptual pictures and templates with which he has been doing battle were correct. To extend one of Wittgenstein's examples, we would very much doubt the aesthetic discernment, and indeed the sympathetic imagination and the human connectedness, of a person who said of two poems (each of which reminded him of death) that either will do as well as the other to a bereaved friend, that they would do the same thing (where this is uttered in a manner dismissive of nuance, or as though it is being said of two detergents). Poetry, Wittgenstein is showing, does not play that kind of role in our lives, as the nature and character of our critical verbal interactions about it indicate. And he ascends, momentarily, to a remark that characterizes his underlying philosophical methodology (or one dimension of it) in the philosophy of language that is being put to use here within the context of his lectures on aesthetics: “If someone talks bosh, imagine the case in which it is not bosh. The moment you imagine it, you see at once it is not like that in our case” (Wittgenstein 1966, 34). The gulf that separates what we should say if the generalizing templates were accurate from what we in actual particularized cases do say could further call into question not only the applicability or accuracy, but indeed the very intelligibility, of the language used to express those templates, those explanatory pictures. Wittgenstein leaves that more aggressive, and ultimately more clarifying and conceptually liberating, critique for his work on language and mind in Philosophical Investigations (1958) and other writings, but one can see from these lectures alone how such an aggressive critique might be undertaken.

3.3 The Attitude Toward the Work of Art

Near the end of his lectures Wittgenstein turns to the question of the attitude we take toward the work of art. He employs the case of seeing the very slight change (of the kind mentioned above) in the depiction of a smile within a picture of a monk looking at a vision of the Virgin Mary. Where the slight and subtle change of line yields a transformation of the smile of the monk from a kindly to an ironic one, our attitude in viewing might similarly change from one in which for some we are almost in prayer to one that would for some be blasphemous, where we are almost leering. He then gives voice to his imagined reductive interlocutor, who says, “Well there you are. It is all in the attitude” (Wittgenstein 1966, 35), where we would then focus, to the exclusion of all of the rest of the intricate, layered, and complex human dimensions of our reactions to works, solely on an analysis of the attitude of the spectator and the isolable causal elements in the work that determine it. But that, again, is only to give voice to a reductive impulse, and in the brief ensuing discussion he shows, once again, that in some cases, an attitude of this kind may emerge as particularly salient. But in other cases, not. And he shows, here intertwining a number of his themes from these lectures, that the very idea of “a description of an attitude” is itself no simple thing. Full-blooded human beings, and not stimulus-response-governed automata, have aesthetic experience, and that experience is as complex a part of our natural history as any other.

Wittgenstein ends the lectures discussing a simple heading: “the craving for simplicity” (Wittgenstein 1966, 36). To such a mind, he says, if an explanation is complicated, it is disagreeable for that very reason. A certain kind of mind will insist on seeking out the single, unitary essence of the matter, where—much like Russell's atomistic search for the essence of the logic of language beneath what he regarded as its misleadingly and distractingly variegated surface—the reductive impulse would be given free reign. Wittgenstein's early work in the Tractatus (1961) followed in that vein. But in these lectures, given in 1938, we see a mind well into a transition away from those simplifying templates, those conceptual pictures. Here, examples themselves do a good deal of philosophical work, and their significance is that they give, rather than merely illustrate, the philosophical point at hand. He said, earlier in the lectures, that he is trying to teach a new way of thinking about aesthetics (and indeed about philosophy itself).

4. Conclusion

The subject, as he said in his opening line, is very big and entirely misunderstood. It is very big in its scope—in the reach of the aesthetic dimension throughout human life.

But we can now, at the end of his lectures, see that it is a big subject in other senses too: aesthetics is conceptually expansive in its important linkages to the philosophy of language, to the philosophy of mind, to ethics, and to other areas of philosophy, and it resists encapsulation into a single, unifying problem. It is a multi-faceted, multi-aspected human cultural phenomenon where connections, of diverging kinds, are more in play than causal relations. The form of explanation we find truly satisfying will thus strikingly diverge from the form of explanation in science – the models of explanation in Naturwissenschaften are misapplied in Geisteswissenschaften, and the viewing of the latter through the lens of the former will yield reduction, exclusion, and ultimately distortion. The humanities are thus, for Wittgenstein, in this sense autonomous.

All of this, along with the impoverishing and blinding superimposition of conceptual models, templates, and pictures onto the extraordinarily rich world of aesthetic engagement, also now, at the end of his lectures, gives content to what Wittgenstein meant at the beginning with the words “entirely misunderstood”. For now, at this stage of Wittgenstein's development, where the complexity-accepting stance of the later Philosophical Investigations (1958) and other work is unearthing and uprooting the philosophical presuppositions of the simplification-seeking earlier work, examples themselves have priority as indispensable instruments in the struggle to free ourselves of misconception in the aesthetic realm. And these examples, given due and detailed attention, will exhibit a context-sensitive particularity that makes generalized pronouncements hovering high above the ground of that detail look otiose, inattentive, or, more bluntly, just a plain falsification of experience. What remains is not, then—and this is an idea Wittgenstein's auditors must themselves have struggled with in those rooms in Cambridge, as many still do today—another theory built upon now stronger foundations, but rather a clear view of our multiform aesthetic practices. Wittgenstein, in his mature, later work, did not generate a theory of language, of mind, or of mathematics. He generated, rather, a vast body of work perhaps united only in its therapeutic and intricately labored search for conceptual clarification. One sees the same philosophical aspiration driving his foray into aesthetics.


Wittgenstein's Work: Primary Sources

Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Wittgenstein, Ludwig