Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Displaying Special Characters

Microsoft Windows (XP, NT, 2000, ME, 98) Users

If you are using IE 7 under Windows XP, or IE 6 under Windows XP, 2000, ME or 98, and your browser is not displaying the special characters, then we should first mention that some of these combinations are supposed to work! Microsoft's own web pages say that Windows XP, 2000, and ME all shipped with the font Lucida Sans Unicode, which has support for Unicode (the "Sans" is short for "sans serif"). XP also ships with Arial, Times, Times New Roman and Courier New fonts, all of which are supposed to support the Unicode named character entities we use in our documents. Try setting your browser Preferences to use one of these fonts. It is important to remember that not all of these fonts will support all the Unicode characters, so you may need to try different fonts for entries which have obscure characters. Note: we have had reports that IE is not able to access/display these fonts even though the fonts exist on the machine and IE has been explicitly set to use them (Tools → Internet Options → Fonts). However, we also have had reports that Netscape 7 on Windows 98 works fine with our pages. There is a link to previous versions of Netscape below.

Some things to do if special characters aren't displayed:

We should also note the following for Windows XP users. Our pages, and all other web pages, will look better if you set the following: Control Panel → Display → Appearance → Effects → Use the following method to smooth edges of screen fonts → ClearType.

Apple Mac OS X and Mac OS 9 Users

Mac OS X. The latest versions of Safari, Firefox, Camino, Netscape, Mozilla, and OmniWeb have all been tested successfully under Mac OS X. However, for the best results, you should set the font to Times or Lucida Grande, since these fonts seems to have the widest support for Unicode characters (including support for the Modifier Letters from Unicode Chart U0300.pdf) in Mac OS X. (Again, neither Times nor Lucida Grande supports a full set of Unicode characters, and you may need to switch your font from Lucida Grande to Times, or vice versa, on entries which have obscure characters.) We've also tested Opera with pretty good success (it fails to render only a few logical characters, namely, harr, rArr, and hArr). See also Alan Wood's Unicode Resources: Unicode fonts for Macintosh OS X computers.

Mac OS 9. Internet Explorer 5 on Mac OS 9 works surprisingly well if you set it to use the font Times New Roman. It has the ability to display most all of the special characters that are widely supported. We know of no way to configure Netscape 4.7 under Mac OS 9 so that it properly displays our pages and the Unicode characters which they use. There is reason to believe, however, that the unofficial build Mozilla 1.3.1 for Mac OS 9 will display our pages properly.

Linux, FreeBSD, Solaris, and other Unix OS Users

Firefox, Mozilla, Netscape, and Opera all provide reasonably good support for the special characters used in SEP entries, assuming you use the default font. However, we haven't test our pages with these systems as widely as we have the Windows and Mac platforms. So we cannot supply more specific information about what works best, i.e., what browser/font combination supports the widest range of Unicode characters.

A Note About the Special Characters in our Entries

We have tried to format our entries in XHTML so that they display properly in a wide range of web browsers. We have developed a web page of special characters which display correctly in a variety of current browsers. See

Widely Supported HTML 4 and Unicode Characters

But many of our entries use special symbols, such as logical, mathematical, and other symbols, which are not widely supported. Here is a list of such symbols:

Special Symbols Not Widely Supported

In the past, we used many more of the "low-resolution" screen shots of these characters and displayed the resulting graphics in the entry as small images, as we have done on the page cited immediately above. But, recently, after being convinced that there was wide support for Unicode characters among web browsers and operating systems, we starting replacing the low-resolution graphics with widely supported font-based Unicode characters. We are slowly but surely making all of our older entries compatible with the newer XHTML standard in the process. Indeed, we have now configured our publishing system so that our entries must parse as valid XHTML (i.e., be in compliance with the international standards set by the authoritative W3C organization) before they are published on the web. (We determine validity by sending our entries, pre-publication, to <> and fixing any errors reported when this engine tries to determine whether our documents are valid.)

Invariably, our best intentions are sometimes defeated by the technologies involved. If your browser is not properly displaying the named character entities in an entry (e.g., logical symbols, mathematical symbols, etc.), then we hope the above suggestions prove useful.