# Gottlob Frege

*First published Thu Sep 14, 1995; substantive revision Wed May 25, 2005*

Friedrich Ludwig Gottlob Frege (b. 1848, d. 1925) was
a German mathematician, logician, and philosopher who worked at the
University of Jena. Frege essentially reconceived the discipline of
logic by constructing a formal system which, in effect, constituted
the first ‘predicate calculus’. In this formal system,
Frege developed an analysis of quantified statements and formalized
the notion of a ‘proof’ in terms that are still accepted
today. Frege then demonstrated that one could use his system to
resolve theoretical mathematical statements in terms of simpler
logical and mathematical notions. One of the axioms that Frege later
added to his system, in the attempt to derive significant parts of
mathematics from logic, proved to be inconsistent. Nevertheless, his
definitions (of the *predecessor* relation and of the concept
of *natural number*) and methods (for deriving the axioms of
number theory) constituted a significant advance. To ground his views
about the relationship of logic and mathematics, Frege conceived a
comprehensive philosophy of language that many philosophers still find
insightful. However, his lifelong project, of showing that
mathematics was reducible to logic, was not successful.

- 1. Frege's Life
- 2. Frege's Logic and Philosophy of Mathematics
- 3. Frege's Philosophy of Language
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Frege's Life

- 1848, born November 8 in Wismar (Mecklenburg-Schwerin)
- 1869, entered the University of Jena
- 1871, entered the University of Göttingen
- 1873, awarded Ph.D. in Mathematics (Geometry), University of Göttingen
- 1874, earned a Habilitation in Mathematics, University of Jena
- 1874, became Privatdozent, University of Jena
- 1879, became Professor Extraordinarius, University of Jena
- 1896, became ordentlicher Honorarprofessor, University of Jena
- 1917, retired from the University of Jena
- 1925, died July 26 in Bad Kleinen (now in Mecklenburg-Vorpommern)

## 2. Frege's Logic and Philosophy of Mathematics

Frege founded the modern discipline of logic by developing a
superior method of formally representing the logic of thoughts and
inferences. He did this by developing: (a) a formal system which formed
the basis of modern logic, (b) an elegant analysis of complex sentences
and quantifier phrases that showed an underlying unity to certain
classes of inferences, (c) a deep understanding of *proof* and
*definition*, (d) a theory of extensions which, though seriously
flawed, offered an intriguing picture of the foundations of
mathematics, (e) an insightful analysis of statements about number
(i.e., of answers to the question ‘How many?’), (f)
definitions and proofs of some of the basic axioms of number theory
from a limited set of logically primitive concepts and axioms, and (g)
a conception of logic as a discipline which has some compelling
features. We discuss these developments in the following
subsections.

### 2.1 The Basis of Frege's Term Logic and Predicate Calculus

In an attempt to realize Leibniz's ideas for a language of thought
and a rational calculus, Frege developed a formal notation for
regimenting thought and reasoning. Though this notation was first
outlined in his *Begriffsschrift* (1879), the most mature
statement of Frege's system was in his 2-volume *Grundgesetze der
Arithmetik* (1893/1903). Frege's 1893/1903 system is best
characterized as a logic of terms which, with the help of a few
definitions, grounds the modern predicate calculus. A predicate
calculus is a formal system (a formal language and a method of proof)
in which one can represent valid inferences among predications, i.e.,
among statements in which properties are predicated of objects. Frege's
earlier 1879 system was more of a predicate calculus, and as such, was
the first of its kind.

In this subsection, we shall examine the most basic elements of Frege's 1893/1903 term logic and predicate calculus. These are the statements involving function applications and the simple predications which fall out as a special case.

#### 2.1.1 The Basis of Frege's Term Logic

In Frege's term logic, the complete expressions are all terms, i.e.,
denoting expressions. These include: (a) simple names of objects, like
‘2’ and ‘π’, (b) complex terms which denote
objects, like ‘2^{2}’ and ‘3 + 1’, and
(c) sentences (which are also complex terms). The complex terms in (b)
and (c) are formed with the help of ‘incomplete
expressions’ which signify functions, such as the unary squaring
function ‘( )^{2}’ and the binary addition
function ‘( )+( )’. In these functional
expressions, ‘( )’ is used as a placeholder for what
Frege called the *arguments* of the function; the placeholder
reveals that the expressions signifying function are, on Frege's view,
incomplete and stand in contrast to complete expressions such as those
in (a), (b), and (c). (Though Frege thought it inappropriate to call
the incomplete expressions that signify functions ‘names’,
we shall sometimes do so in what follows, though the reader should be
warned that Frege had reasons for not following this practice.) Thus, a
mathematical expression such as ‘2^{2}’ denotes the
result of applying the function ( )^{2} to the number 2 as
argument, namely, the number 4. Similarly, the expression ‘7 +
1’ denotes the result of applying the binary function
+(( ),( )) to the numbers 7 and 1 as arguments, in that
order.

Even the sentences of Frege's mature logical system are complex
terms; they are terms that denote *truth-values*. Frege
distinguished two truth-values, The True and The False, which he took
to be objects. The basic sentences of Frege's system are constructed
using the expression ‘( ) = ( )’, which
signifies a binary function that maps a pair of objects *x* and
*y* to The True if *x* is identical to *y* and
maps *x* and *y* to The False otherwise. A sentence such
as ‘2^{2} = 4’ therefore denotes the truth-value
The True, while the sentence ‘2^{2} = 6’ denotes
the truth-value The False.

An important class of these identity statements are statements of
the form ‘ƒ(*x*) = *y*’, where
ƒ( ) is any unary function (i.e., function of a single
variable), *x* is the argument of the function, and
ƒ(*x*) is the value that the function ƒ( ) has
for the argument *x*. There can also be identity statements
involving binary functions (i.e., functions of two variables), namely,
ƒ(*x*,*y*) = *z*. And so on, for functions of
more than two variables.

If we replace a complete name appearing in a sentence by a
placeholder, the result is an incomplete expression that signifies a
special kind of function which Frege called a *concept*.
*Concepts* are functions which map every argument to one of the
truth-values. Thus, ‘( )>2’ denotes the concept
*being greater than* 2, which maps every object greater than 2
to The True and maps every other object to The False. Similarly,
‘( )^{2} = 4’ denotes the concept *that
which when squared is identical to* 4. Frege would say that any
object that a concept maps to The True *falls under* the
concept. Thus, the number 2 falls under the concept *that which when
squared is identical to* 4. In what follows, we use lower-case
expressions like ƒ( ) to talk generally about functions, and
upper-case expressions like *F*( ) to talk more
specifically about those functions which are concepts.

Frege supposed that a mathematical claim such as ‘2 is
prime’ should be formally represented as
‘*P*(2)’. The verb phrase ‘is prime’ is
thereby analyzed as denoting the concept *P*( ) which maps
primes to The True and everything else to The False. Thus, a simple
*predication* like ‘2 is prime’ becomes analyzed in
Frege's system as a special case of functional application.

#### 2.1.2 The Predicate Calculus Within Frege's Term Logic

The preceding analysis of simple mathematical predications led Frege
to extend the applicability of this system to the representation of
non-mathematical thoughts and predications. This move formed the basis
of the modern predicate calculus. Frege analyzed a non-mathematical
predicate like ‘is happy’ as signifying a function of one
variable which maps its arguments to a truth-value. Thus, ‘is
happy’ denotes a concept which can be represented in the formal
system as ‘*H*( )’. *H*( ) maps
those arguments which are happy to The True, and maps everything else
to The False. The sentence ‘John is happy’
(‘*H*(*j*)’) is thereby analyzed as: the
object denoted by ‘John’ falls under the concept signified
by ‘( ) is happy’. Thus, a simple predication is
analyzed in terms of falling under a concept, which in turn, is
analyzed in terms of functions which map their arguments to truth
values. By contrast, in the modern predicate calculus, this last step
of analyzing predication in terms of functions is not assumed;
predication is seen as more fundamental than functional application.
The sentence ‘John is happy’ is formally represented as
‘*Hj*’, where this is a basic form of predication
(‘the object *j* instantiates or exemplifies the property
*H*’). In the modern predicate calculus, functional
application is analyzable in terms of predication, as we shall soon
see.

In Frege's analysis, the verb phrase ‘loves’ signifies a
binary function of two variables: *L*(( ),( )). This
function takes a pair of arguments *x* and *y* and maps
them to The True if *x* loves *y* and maps all other
pairs of arguments to The False. Although it is a descendent of Frege's
system, the modern predicate calculus analyzes *loves* as a
two-place relation (*Lxy*) rather than a function; some objects
stand in the relation and others do not. The difference between Frege's
understanding of predication and the one manifest by the modern
predicate calculus is simply this: in the modern predicate calculus,
relations are taken as basic, and functions are defined as a special
case of relation, namely, those relations *R* such that for any
objects *x*, *y*, and *z*, if *Rxy* and
*Rxz*, then *y=z*. By contrast, Frege took functions to
be more basic than relations. His logic is based on functional
application rather than predication, and so relations become analyzed
as a binary functions which map a pair of arguments to a truth-value.
Thus, a 3-place relation like *gives* would be analyzed in
Frege's logic as a function that maps arguments *x*, *y*,
and *z* to an appropriate truth-value depending on whether
*x* gives *y* to *z*; the 4-place relation
*buys* would be analyzed as a function that maps the arguments
*x*, *y*, *z*, and *u* to an appropriate
truth-value depending on whether *x* buys *y* from
*z* for amount *u*; etc.

### 2.2 Complex Statements and Generality

So far, we have been discussing Frege's analysis of ‘atomic’ statements. To complete the basic logical representation of thoughts, Frege added notation for representing more complex statements (such as negated and conditional statements) and statements of generality (those involving the expressions ‘every’ and ‘some’). Though we no longer use his notation for representing complex and general statements, it is important to see how the notation in Frege's term logic already contained all the expressive power of the modern predicate calculus.

There are four special functional expressions which are used in Frege's system to express complex and general statements:

Intuitive

SignificanceFunctional ExpressionThe Function It SignifiesStatement The function which maps The True to The True and maps all other objects to The False; this is used to indicate that the argument is a true statement that names The True. Negation The function which maps The True to The False and maps all other objects to The True Conditional The function which maps a pair of objects to The False if the first (i.e., the one named in the bottom branch) is The True and the second isn't The True, and maps all other pairs of objects to The True Generality The second-level function which maps a first-level concept F( ) to The True ifF( ) maps every object to The True; otherwise it mapsF( ) to The False.

The best way to understand this notation is by way of some tables, which show some specific examples of statements and how those are rendered in Frege’ notation and in the modern predicate calculus.

#### 2.2.1 Truth-functional Connectives

The first table shows how Frege's logic can express the truth-functional connectives such as not, if-then, and, or, and if-and-only-if.

ExampleFrege's NotationModern NotationJohn is happy HjIt is not the case that John is happy ¬ HjIf the sun is shining, then John is happy Ss→HjThe sun is shining and John is happy Ss&HjEither the sun is shining or John is happy SsHjThe sun is shining if and only if John is happy Ss≡Hj

As one can see, Frege didn't use the primitive connectives ‘and’, ‘or’, or ‘if and only if’, but always used canonical equivalent forms defined in terms of negations and conditionals. Note the last row of the table — when Frege wants to assert that two conditions are materially equivalent, he uses the identity sign, since this says that they denote the same truth-value. In the modern sentential calculus, the biconditional does something equivalent, for a statement of the form φ≡ψ is true whenever φ and ψ are both true or both false. The only difference is, in the modern sentential calculus φ and ψ are not construed as terms denoting truth-values, but rather as sentences having truth conditions (though, in the semantics of the sentential calculus, sentences are assigned truth-values as their ‘semantic value’, and they are considered true/false according to which truth-value serves as their semantic value).

#### 2.2.2 Quantified Statements

The table below compares statements of generality in Frege-style notation and in the modern predicate calculus. We say ‘Frege-style" notation because we are modifying Frege's notation a bit so as to simplify the presentation; we shall not use the special typeface (Gothic) that Frege used for variables in general statements, or observe some of the special conventions that he adopted, for reasons that would distract us from this introduction.

ExampleFrege-Style NotationModern NotationEverything is mortal ∀ xMxSomething is mortal ¬∀ x¬Mx

i.e., ∃xMxNothing is mortal ∀ x¬Mx

i.e., ¬∃xMxEvery person is mortal ∀ x(Px→Mx)Some person is mortal ¬∀ x(Px→ ¬Mx)

i.e., ∃x(Px&Mx)No person is mortal ∀ x(Px→ ¬Mx)

i.e., ¬∃x(Px&Mx)All and only persons are mortal ∀ x(Px≡Mx)

Note the last line. Here again, Frege uses the identity sign to help
state the material equivalence of two concepts. He can do this because
materially equivalent concepts *F* and *G* are such that
*F* maps an object *x* to The True whenever *G*
maps *x* to The True; i.e., for all arguments *x*,
*F* and *G* map *x* to the same truth-value.

In the modern predicate calculus, the symbols ‘∀’
(‘every’) and ‘∃’ (‘some’)
are called the ‘universal’ and ‘existential’
quantifier, respectively, and the variable ‘*x*’ in
the sentence ‘∀*xMx*’ is called a
‘quantified variable’, or ‘variable bound by the
quantifier’. We will follow this practice of calling statements
involving one of these quantifier phrases ‘quantified
statements’. As one can see from the table above, Frege didn't
use an existential quantifier. He was aware that a statement of the
form ‘∃*x*(…)’ could always be defined
as ‘¬∀*x*¬(…)’.

It is important to mention here that the predicate calculus
formulable in Frege's logic is a ‘second-order’ predicate
calculus. This means it allows quantification over functions as well as
quantification over objects; i.e., statements of the form ‘Every
function ƒ is such that …’ and ‘Some function
ƒ is such that …’ are allowed. Thus, the statement
‘objects *a* and *b* fall under the same
concepts’ would be written as follows in Frege-style
notation:

and in the modern second-order predicate calculus, we write this as:

∀F(Fa≡Fb)

Readers interested in learning more about Frege's notation can
consult Beaney (1997, Appendix 2), Furth (1967), and Reck &
Awodey (2004, 26–34). In what follows, however, we shall
continue to use the notation of the modern predicate calculus instead
of Frege-style notation. In particular, we adopt the following
conventions. (1) We shall often use ‘*Fx*’ instead
of ‘*F*(*x*)’ to represent the fact that
*x* falls under the concept *F*; we use
‘*Rxy*’ instead of
‘*R*(*x*,*y*)’ to represent the fact
that *x* stands in the relation *R* to *y*; etc.
(2) Instead of using expressions with placeholders, such as
‘( ) = ( )’ and
‘*P*( )’, to signify functions and concepts,
we shall simply use ‘=’ and ‘*P*’. (3)
When replace one of the complete names in a sentence by a variable,
the resulting expression will be called an *open sentence* or
an *open formula*. Thus, whereas ‘3<2’ is a
sentence, ‘3<*x*’ is an open sentence; and
whereas ‘*Hj*’ is a formal sentence that might be
used to represent ‘John is happy’, the expression
‘*Hx*’ is an open formula which might be rendered
‘*x* is happy’ in natural language. (4) Finally, we
shall on occasion employ the Greek symbol φ as a metavariable
ranging over formal sentences, which may or may not be open. Thus,
‘φ(*a*)’ will be used to indicate any sentence
(simple or complex) in which the name ‘*a*’
appears; ‘φ(*a*)’ is *not* to be
understood as Frege-notation for a function φ applied to argument
*a*. Similarly, ‘φ(*x*)’ will be used
to indicate an open sentence in which the variable *x* may or
may not be free, not a function of *x*.

#### 2.2.3 Frege's Logic of Quantification

Frege's functional analysis of predication coupled with his understanding of generality freed him from the limitations of the ‘subject-predicate’ analysis of ordinary language sentences that formed the basis of Aristotelian logic and it made it possible for him to develop a more general treatment of inferences involving ‘every’ and ‘some’. In traditional Aristotelian logic, the subject of a sentence and the direct object of a verb are not on a logical par. The rules governing the inferences between statements with different but related subject terms are different from the rules governing the inferences between statements with different but related verb complements. For example, in Aristotelian logic, the rule which permits the valid inference from ‘John loves Mary’ to ‘Something loves Mary’ is different from the rule which permits the valid inference from ‘John loves Mary’ to ‘John loves something’. The rule governing the first inference is a rule which applies only to subject terms whereas the rule governing the second inference governs reasoning within the predicate, and thus applies only to the transitive verb complements (i.e., direct objects). In Aristotelian logic, these inferences have nothing in common.

In Frege's logic, however, a single rule governs both the inference
from ‘John loves Mary’ to ‘Something loves
Mary’ and the inference from ‘John loves Mary’ to
‘John loves something’. That's because the subject John and
the direct object Mary are both considered on a logical par, as
arguments of the function *loves*. In effect, Frege saw no
logical difference between the subject ‘John’ and the
direct object ‘Mary’. What is logically important is that
‘loves’ denotes a function of 2 arguments. No matter
whether the quantified expression ‘something’ appears as
subject (‘Something loves Mary’) or within a predicate
(‘John loves something’), it is to be resolved in the same
way. In effect, Frege treated these quantified expressions as
variable-binding operators. The variable-binding operator ‘some
*x* is such that’ can bind the variable
‘*x*’ in the open sentence ‘*x* loves
Mary’ as well as the variable ‘*x*’ in the
open sentence ‘John loves *x*’. Thus, Frege analyzed
the above inferences in the following general way:

- John loves Mary. Therefore, some
*x*is such that*x*loves Mary. - John loves Mary. Therefore, some
*x*is such that John loves*x*.

Both inferences are instances of a single valid inference rule. To see this more clearly, here are the formal representations of the above informal arguments:

*Ljm*∴ ∃*x*(*Lxm*)*Ljm*∴ ∃*x*(*Ljx*)

The logical axiom which licenses both inferences has the form:

Ra_{1}…a_{i}…a_{n}→ ∃x(Ra_{1}…x…a_{n}),

where *R* is a relation that can take *n* arguments, and
*a*_{1},…,*a*_{n} are any
constants (names), for any *a*_{i} such that
1≤*i*≤*n*. This logical axiom tells us that from a
simple predication involving an *n*-place relation, one can
existentially generalize on any argument, and validly derive a
existential statement.

Indeed, this axiom can be made even more general. If
φ(*a*) is any statement (formula) in which a constant (name)
*a* appears, and φ(*x*) is the result of replacing
one or more occurrences of *a* by *x*, then the following
is a logical axiom:

φ(a) → ∃xφ(x)

The inferences which start with the premise ‘John loves
Mary’, displayed above, both appeal to this axiom for
justification. This axiom is actually derivable as a theorem from
Frege's Basic Law IIa (1893, §47). Basic Law IIa asserts
∀*x*φ(*x*) → φ(*a*), and the
above axiom for the existential quantifier can be derived from IIa
using the rules governing conditionals, negation, and the definition of
∃*x*(…) discussed above.

There is one other consequence of Frege's logic of quantification
that should be mentioned. Frege took claims of the form
∃*x*(…) to be existence claims. He suggested that
*existence* is not a concept under which objects fall but rather
a second-level concept under which first-level concepts fall. A concept
*F* falls under this second-level concept just in case
*F* maps at least one object to The True. So the claim
‘Martians don't exist’ is analyzed as an assertion about
the concept *martian*, namely, that nothing falls under it.
Frege therefore took *existence* to be that second-level concept
which maps a first-level concept *F* to The True just in case
∃*xFx* and maps all other concepts to The False. Many
philosophers have thought that this analysis validates Kant's view that
*existence* is not a (real) predicate.

### 2.3 Proof and Definition

#### 2.3.1 Proof

Frege's system (i.e., his term logic/predicate calculus) consisted of a language and an apparatus for proving statements. The latter consisted of a set of logical axioms (statements considered to be truths of logic) and a set of rules of inference that lay out the conditions under which certain statements of the language may be correctly inferred from others. Frege made a point of showing how every step in a proof of a proposition was justified either in terms of one of the axioms or in terms of one of the rules of inference or justified by a theorem or derived rule that had already been proved.

Thus, as part of his formal system, Frege developed a strict understanding of a ‘proof’. In essence, he defined a proof to be any finite sequence of statements such that each statement in the sequence either is an axiom or follows from previous members by a valid rule of inference. Thus, a proof of a theorem of logic, say φ, is therefore any finite sequence of statements (with φ the final statement in the sequence) such that each member of the sequence: (a) is one of the logical axioms of the formal system, or (b) follows from previous members of the sequence by a rule of inference. These are essentially the definitions that logicians still use today.

#### 2.3.2 Definition

Frege was extremely careful about the proper description and
definition of logical and mathematical concepts. He developed powerful
and insightful criticisms of mathematical work which did not meet his
standards for clarity. For example, he criticized mathematicians who
defined a variable to be a number that varies rather than an expression
of language which can vary as to which determinate number it refers to.
And he criticized those mathematicians who developed
‘piecemeal’ definitions or ‘creative’
definitions. In the *Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, II* (1903,
Sections 56-67) Frege criticized the practice of defining a concept on
a given range of objects and later redefining the concept on a wider,
more inclusive range of concepts. Frequently, this
‘piecemeal’ style of definition led to conflict, since the
redefined concept did not always reduce to the original concept when
one restricts the range to the original class of objects. In that same
work (1903, Sections 139-147), Frege criticized the mathematical
practise of introducing notation to name (unique) entities without
first proving that there exist (unique) such entities. He pointed out
that such ‘creative definitions’ were simply
unjustified.

### 2.4 Courses-of-Values, Extensions, and Proposed Mathematical Foundations

#### 2.4.1 Courses-of-Values and Extensions

Frege's ontology consisted of two fundamentally different types of entities, namely, functions and objects (1891, 1892b, 1904). Functions are in some sense ‘unsaturated’; i.e., they are the kind of thing which take objects as arguments and map those arguments to a value. This distinguishes them from objects. As we've seen, the domain of objects included two special objects, namely, the truth-values The True and The False.

In his work of 1893/1903, Frege attempted to expand the domain of
objects by systematically associating, with each function ƒ, an
object which he called *the course-of-values of* ƒ. The
course-of-values of a function is a record of the value of the function
for each argument. The principle Frege used to systematize
courses-of-values is Basic Law V (1893/§20;):

The course-of-values of the concept ƒ is identical to the course-of-values of the conceptgif and only if ƒ andgagree on the value of every argument (i.e., if and only if for every objectx, ƒ(x) =g(x)).

Frege used the following notation to denote the course-of-values of the function ƒ:

where the first occurrence of the Greek ε (with the smooth-breathing mark over it) is a ‘variable-binding operator’ which we might read as ‘the course-of-values of’. Using this notation, Frege formally represented Basic Law V in his system as:

Basic Law V

(Actually, Frege used an identity sign instead of the biconditional as the main connective of this principle, for reasons described above.)

Frege called the course-of-values of a concept *F* its
*extension*. The extension of a concept *F* records just
those objects which *F* maps to The True. Thus Basic Law V
applies equally well to the extensions of concepts. Let
‘φ(*x*)’ be an open sentence of any complexity
with the free variable *x* (the variable *x* may have
more than one occurrence in φ(*x*), but for simplicity,
assume it has only one occurrence). Then using the variable-binding
operator ε, Frege would use the expression
‘εφ(ε)’ (with a smooth-breathing mark
over the first epsilon and where the second epsilon replaces *x*
in φ(*x*)) to denote the extension of the concept φ.
Where ‘*n*’ is the name of an object, Frege could
define ‘object *n* is an element of the extension of the
concept φ’ in the following simple terms: ‘the concept
φ maps *n* to The True’ (i.e., φ(*n*)). For
example, the number 3 is an element of the extension of the concept
*odd number greater than 2* if and only if this concept maps 3
to The True.

Unfortunately, Basic Law V implies a contradiction, and this was
pointed out to Frege by Bertrand Russell just as the second volume of
the *Grundgesetze* was going to press. Russell recognized that
some extensions are elements of themselves and some are not; the
extension of the concept *extension* is an element of itself,
since that concept would map its own extension to The True. The
extension of the concept *spoon* is not an element of itself,
because that concept would map its own extension to The False (since
extensions aren't spoons). But now what about the concept *extension
which is not an element of itself*? Let *E* represent this
concept and let *e* name the extension of *E*. Is
*e* an element of itself? Well, *e* is an element of
itself if and only if *E* maps *e* to The True (by the
definition of ‘element of’ given at the end of the previous
paragraph, where *e* is the extension of the concept
*E*). But *E* maps *e* to The True if and only if
*e* is an extension which is not an element of itself, i.e., if
and only if *e* is not an element of itself. We have thus
reasoned that *e* is an element of itself if and only if it is
not, showing the incoherency in Frege's conception of an extension.

Further discussion of this problem can be found in the entry on Russell's Paradox, and a more complete explanation of how the paradox arises in Frege's system is presented in the entry on Frege's logic, theorem, and foundations for mathematics.

#### 2.4.2 Proposed Foundation for Mathematics

Before he became aware of Russell's paradox, Frege attempted to
construct a logical foundation for mathematics. Using the logical
system containing Basic Law V (1893/1903), he attempted to demonstrate
the truth of the philosophical thesis known as *logicism*, i.e.,
the idea not only that mathematical concepts can be defined in terms of
purely logical concepts but also that mathematical principles can be
derived from the laws of logic alone. But given that the crucial
definitions of mathematical concepts were stated in terms of
extensions, the inconsistency in Basic Law V undermined Frege's attempt
to establish the thesis of logicism. Few philosophers today believe
that mathematics can be reduced to logic in the way Frege had in mind.
Mathematical theories such as set theory seem to require some
non-logical concepts (such as set membership) which cannot be defined
in terms of logical concepts, at least when axiomatized by certain
powerful non-logical axioms (such as the proper axioms of
Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory). Despite the fact that a contradiction
invalidated a part of his system, the intricate theoretical web of
definitions and proofs developed in the *Grundgesetze*
nevertheless offered philosophical logicians an intriguing conceptual
framework. The ideas of
Bertrand Russell
and
Alfred North Whitehead
in
*Principia Mathematica*
owe
a huge debt to the work found in Frege's *Grundgesetze*.

Despite Frege's failure to provide a coherent systematization of the notion of an extension, we shall make use of the notion in what follows to explain Frege's theory of numbers and analysis of number statements. Though the discussion will involve the notion of an extension, we shall not require Basic Law V; thus, we can use our informal understanding of the notion. In addition, extensions can be rehabilitated in various ways, either axiomatically as in modern set theory (which appears to be consistent) or as in various consistent reconstructions of Frege's system.

### 2.5 The Analysis of Statements of Number

In what has come to be regarded as a seminal treatise, *Die
Grundlagen der Arithmetik* (1884), Frege began work on the idea of
deriving some of the basic principles of arithmetic from what he
thought were more fundamental logical principles and logical concepts.
Philosophers today still find that work insightful. The leading idea is
that a statement of number, such as ‘There are nine
planets’ and ‘There are two authors of *Principia
Mathematica*’, is really a statement about a concept. Frege
realized that one and the same physical phenomena could be
conceptualized in different ways, and that answers to the question
‘How many?’ only make sense once a concept *F* is
supplied. Thus, one and the same physical entity might be
conceptualized as consisting of 1 army, 5 divisions, 20 regiments, 100
companies, etc., and so the question ‘How many?’ only
becomes legitimate once one supplies the concept being counted, such as
*army*, *division*, *regiment*, or
*company* (1884, §46).

Using this insight, Frege took true statements like ‘There are
nine planets’ and ‘There are two authors of *Principia
Mathematica*’ to be higher-order claims about the concepts
*planet* and *author of Principia Mathematica*,
respectively. In the second case, the higher-order claim asserts that
the first-order concept *being an author of Principia
Mathematica* falls under the second-order concept *being a
concept under which two objects fall*. This sounds circular, since
it looks like we have analyzed

There are two authors ofPrincipia Mathematica,

which involves the concept *two*, as

The conceptbeing an author of Principia Mathematicafalls under the conceptbeing a concept under which two objects fall,

which also involves the concept *two*. But despite
appearances, there is no circularity, since Frege analyzes the
second-order concept *being a concept under which two objects
fall* without appealing to the concept *two*. He did this by
defining ‘*F* is a concept under which two objects
fall’, in purely logical terms, as any concept *F* that
satisfies the following condition:

There are distinct thingsxandythat fall under the conceptFand anything else that falls under the conceptFis identical to eitherxory.

In the notation of the modern predicate calculus, this is formalized as:

∃x∃y(x≠y&Fx&Fy& ∀z(Fz→z=xz=y))

Note that the concept *being an author of Principia
Mathematica* satisfies this condition, since there are distinct
objects *x* and *y*, namely, Bertrand Russell and Alfred
North Whitehead, who authored *Principia Mathematica* and who
are such that anything else authoring *Principia Mathematica* is
identical to one of them. In this way, Frege analyzed a statement of
number (‘there are two authors of *Principia
Mathematica*’) as higher-order logical statements about
concepts.

Frege then took his analysis one step further. He noticed that each
of the conditions in the following sequence of conditions defined a
class of ‘equinumerous’ concepts, where
‘*F*’ in each case is a variable ranging over
concepts:

Condition (0): Nothing falls under F

¬∃xFxCondition (1): Exactly one thing falls under F

∃x(Fx& ∀y(Fy→y=x))Condition (2): Exactly two things fall under F.

∃x∃y(x≠y&Fx&Fy& ∀z(Fz→z=xz=y))

Condition (3): Exactly three things fall under F.

∃x∃y∃z(x≠y&x≠z&y≠z&Fx&Fy&Fz& ∀w(Fw→w=xw=yw=z))

etc.

Notice that if concepts *P* and *Q* are both concepts
which satisfy one of these conditions, then there is a one-to-one
correspondence between the objects which fall under *P* and the
objects which fall under *Q*. That is, if any of the above
conditions accurately describes both *P* and *Q*, then
every object falling under *P* can be paired with a unique and
distinct object falling under *Q* and, under this pairing, every
object falling under *Q* gets paired with some unique and
distinct object falling under *P*. (By the logician's
understanding of the phrase ‘every’, this last claim even
applies to those concepts *P* and *Q* which satisfy
Condition (0).) Frege would call such *P* and *Q*
*equinumerous* concepts (1884, §72). Indeed, for each
condition defined above, the concepts that satisfy the condition are
all pairwise equinumerous to one another.

With this notion of equinumerosity, Frege defined ‘the number
of the concept *F*’ (or, more informally, ‘the
number of *F*s’) to be the extension or set of all
concepts that are equinumerous with *F* (1884, §68). For
example, the number of the concept *author of Principia
Mathematica* is the extension of all concepts that are equinumerous
to that concept. This number is therefore identified with the class of
all concepts under which two objects fall, as this is defined by
Condition (2) above. Frege specifically identified the number 0 as the
number of the concept *not being self-identical* (1884,
§74). It is a theorem of logic that nothing falls under this
concept. Thus, it is a concept that satisfies Condition (0) above.
Frege thereby identified the number 0 as the class of all concepts
under which nothing falls, since that is the class of concepts
equinumerous with the concept *not being self-identical*.
Essentially, Frege identified the number 1 as the class of all concepts
which satisfy Condition (1). And so forth. But though this defines a
sequence of entities which are numbers, this procedure doesn't actually
define the concept *natural number* (*finite number*).
Frege, however, had an even deeper idea about how to do this.

### 2.6 Natural Numbers

In order to define the concept of *natural number*, Frege
first defined, for every 2-place relation *R*, the general
concept ‘*x* is an ancestor of *y* in the
*R*-series’. This new relation is called ‘the
ancestral of the relation R’. The ancestral of the relation
*R* was first defined in Frege's *Begriffsschrift* (1879,
§26, Proposition 76; 1884, §79). The intuitive idea is easily
grasped if we consider the relation *x* is the father of
*y*. Suppose that *a* is the father of *b*, that
*b* is the father of *c*, and that *c* is the
father of *d*. Then Frege's definition of ‘*x* is
an ancestor of *y* in the fatherhood-series’ ensured that
*a* is an ancestor of *b*, *c*, and *d*,
that *b* is an ancestor of *c* and *d*, and that
*c* is an ancestor of *d*.

More generally, if given a series of facts of the form *aRb*,
*bRc*, *cRd*, and so on, Frege showed how to define the
relation *x is an ancestor of y in the R-series* (Frege referred
to this as: *y* follows *x* in the *R*-series). To
exploit this definition in the case of natural numbers, Frege had to
define both the relation *x precedes y* and the ancestral of
this relation, namely, *x is an ancestor of y in the
predecessor-series*. He first defined the relational concept *x
precedes y* as follows (1884, §76):

x precedes yiff there is a conceptFand an objectzsuch that:

zfalls underF,yis the (cardinal) number of the conceptF, andxis the (cardinal) number of the conceptobject other than z falling under F

In the notation of the second-order predicate calculus, augmented by
the functional notation ‘#*F*’ to denote the number
of *F*s and by the λ-notation
‘[λ*u* φ]’ to name the complex
concept *being a* u such that φ, Frege's definition
becomes:

Precedes(x,y) =_{df}∃F∃z(Fz&y=#F&x=#[λu Fu&u≠z])

To see the intuitive idea behind this definition, consider how the
definition is satisfied in the case of the number 1 preceding the
number 2: there is a concept *F* (e.g., let *F* =
*being an author of Principia Mathematica*) and an object
*z* (e.g., let *z* = Alfred North Whitehead) such
that:

- Whitehead falls under the concept
*author of Principia Mathematica*, *2*is the (cardinal) number of the concept*author of Principia Mathematica*, and*1*is the (cardinal) number of the concept*author of Principia Mathematica other than Whitehead*.

Note that the last conjunct is true because there is exactly 1
object (namely, Bertrand Russell) which falls under the concept
*object other than Whitehead which falls under the concept of being
an author of Principia Mathematica*.

Thus, Frege has a definition of *precedes* which applies to
the pairs <0,1>, <1,2>, <2,3>,…. Frege then
defined the ancestral of this relation, namely, *x is an ancestor of
y in the predecessor-series*. Though the exact definition will not
be given here, we note that it has the following consequence: if 10
precedes 11 and 11 precedes 12, it follows that 10 is an ancestor of 12
in the predecessor-series. Note, however, that although 10 is an
ancestor of 12, 10 does not precede 12, for the notion of
*precedes* is that of *strictly* precedes. Note also that
by defining the ancestral of the precedence relation, Frege had in
effect defined *x* < *y*.

Recall that Frege defined the number 0 as the number of the concept
*not being self-identical*, and that 0 thereby becomes
identified with the extension of all concepts which fail to be
exemplified. Using this definition, Frege defined (1884, §83):

x is a natural numberiff eitherx=0 or 0 is an ancestor ofxin the predecessor-series

In other words, a natural number is any member of the predecessor-series beginning with 0.

Using this definition as a basis, Frege later derived many important
theorems of number theory. Philosophers only recently appreciated the
importance of this work (C. Parsons 1965, Smiley 1981, Wright 1983, and
Boolos 1987, 1990, 1995). Wright 1983 in particular showed how the
Dedekind/Peano axioms for number might be derived from one of the
consistent principles that Frege discussed in 1884, now known as Hume's
Principle (‘The number of *F*s is equal to the number of
*G*s if and only if there is a one-to-one correspondence between
the *F*s and the *G*s’). It was recently shown by
R. Heck [1993] that, despite the logical inconsistency in the system of
Frege 1893/1903, Frege himself validly derived the the Dedekind/Peano
axioms from Hume's Principle. Although Frege used his inconsistent
axiom, Basic Law V, to establish Hume's Principle, once Hume's
Principle was established, the subsequent derivations of the
Dedekind/Peano axioms make no further essential appeals to Basic Law V.
Following the lead of George Boolos, philosophers today call the
derivation of the Dedekind/Peano Axioms from Hume's Principle
‘Frege's Theorem’. The proof of Frege's Theorem was a
*tour de force* which involved some of the most beautiful,
subtle, and complex logical reasoning that had ever been devised. For a
comprehensive introduction to the logic of Frege's Theorem, see the
entry
Frege's logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic.

### 2.7 Frege's Conception of Logic

Before receiving the famous letter from Bertrand Russell informing
him of the inconsistency in his system, Frege thought that he had shown
that arithmetic is reducible to the analytic truths of logic (i.e.,
statements which are true solely in virtue of the meanings of the
logical words appearing in those statements). It is recognized today,
however, that at best Frege showed that arithmetic is reducible to
second-order logic extended only by Hume's Principle. Some philosophers
think Hume's Principle is analytically true (i.e., true in virtue of
the very meanings of its words), while others resist the claim, and
there is an interesting debate on this issue in the literature.
However, for the purposes of this introductory essay, there are prior
questions on which it is more important to focus, concerning the nature
of Frege's logic, namely, ‘Did Frege's 1879 or 1893/1903 system
(excluding Basic Law V) contain any *extralogical*
resources?’, and ‘How did Frege's conception of logic
differ from that of his predecessors, and in particular, Kant's?’
For even if Frege had been right in thinking that arithmetic is
reducible to truths of logic, it is well known that Kant thought that
arithmetic consisted of synthetic (*a priori*) truths and that
it was *not* reducible to analytic logical truths. But, of
course, Frege's view and Kant's view contradict each other only if they
have the same conception of logic. Do they?

MacFarlane 2002 addresses this question, and points out that their conceptions differ in various ways:

… the resources Frege recognizes as logical far outstrip those of Kant's logic (Aristotelian term logic with a simple theory of disjunctive and hypothetical propositions added on). The most dramatic difference is that Frege's logic allows us to define concepts using nested quantifiers, while Kant's is limited to representing inclusion relations.

MacFarlane goes on to point out that Frege's logic also contains
higher-order quantifiers (i.e., quantifiers ranging over concepts), and
a logical functor for forming singular terms from open sentences (i.e.,
the expression ‘the extension of’ takes the open sentence
φ(*x*) to yield the singular term, ‘the extension of
the concept φ(*x*)’). MacFarlane notes that if we were
to try to express such resources in Kant's system, we would have to
appeal to non-logical constructions which make sense only with respect
to a faculty of ‘intuition’, that is, an extralogical
source which presents our minds with (sensible) phenomena about which
judgments can be formed. Frege denies Kant's dictum (A51/B75),
‘Without sensibility, no object would be given to us’,
claiming that 0 and 1 are objects but that they ‘can't be given
to us in sensation’ (1884, 101). (Frege's view is that our
understanding can grasp them as objects if their definitions can be
grounded in analytic propositions governing extensions of
concepts.)

The debate over which resources require an appeal to intuition and which do not is an important one, since Frege dedicated himself to the idea of eliminating appeals to intuition in the proofs of the basic propositions of arithmetic. Frege saw himself very much in the spirit of Bolzano (1817), who eliminated the appeal to intuition in the proof of the intermediate value theorem in the calculus by proving this theorem from the definition of continuity, which had recently been defined in terms of the definition of a limit (see Coffa 1991, 27). A Kantian might very well simply draw a graph of a continuous function which takes values above and below the origin, and thereby ‘demonstrate’ that such a function must cross the origin. But both Bolzano and Frege saw such appeals to intuition as potentially introducing logical gaps into proofs. There are good reasons to be suspicious about such appeals: (1) there are examples of functions which we can't graph or otherwise construct for presentation to our intuitive faculty—consider the function ƒ which maps rational numbers to 0 and irrational numbers to 1, or consider those functions which are everywhere continuous but nowhere differentiable; (2) once we take certain intuitive notions and formalize them in terms of explicit definitions, the formal definition might imply counterintuitive results; and (3) the rules of inference from statements to constructions and back are not always clear. Frege explicitly remarked upon the fact that he labored to avoid constructions and appeals to intuition in the proofs of basic propositions of arithmetic (1879, Preface/5, Part III/§23; 1884, § 62, 87; 1893, §0; and 1903, Appendix).

This brings us to one of the most important differences between the
Frege's logic and Kant's. Frege's second-order logic included a Rule of
Substitution (*Grundgesetze I*, 1893, §48, item 9), which
allows one to substitute complex open formulas into logical theorems to
produce new logical theorems. This rule is equivalent to a very
powerful existence condition governing concepts known as the
Comprehension Principle for Concepts. This principle asserts the
existence of a concept corresponding to every open formula of the form
φ(*x*) with free variable *x*, no matter how complex
φ is. From Kant's point of view, existence claims were thought to
be synthetic and in need of justification by the faculty of intuition.
So, although it was one of Frege's goals to avoid appeals to the
faculty of intuition, there is a real question as to whether his
system, which involves an inference rule equivalent to a principle
asserting the existence of a wide range of concepts, really is limited
in its scope to purely logical laws of an analytic nature.

One final important difference between Frege's conception of logic and Kant's concerns the question of whether logic has any content unique to itself. As MacFarlane 2002 points out, one of Kant's most central views about logic is that its axioms and theorems are purely formal in nature, i.e., abstracted from all semantic content and concerned only with the forms of judgments, which are applicable across all the physical and mathematical sciences (1781/1787, A55/B79, A56/B80, A70/B95). By contrast, Frege took logic to have its own unique subject matter, which included not only facts about concepts (concerning negation, subsumption, etc.), identity, etc. (Frege 1906, 428), but also facts about ancestrals of relations and natural numbers (1879, 1893). Logic is not purely formal, from Frege's point of view, but rather can provide substantive knowledge of objects and concepts.

Despite these fundamental differences in their conceptions of logic, Kant and Frege may have agreed that the most important defining characteristic of logic is its generality, i.e., the fact that it provides norms (rules, prescriptions) that are constitutive of thought. This rapprochement between Kant and Frege is developed in some detail in MacFarlane 2002. The reader will find there reasons for thinking that Kant and Frege may have shared enough of a common conception about logic for us to believe that equivocation doesn't undermine the apparent inconsistency between their views on the reducibility of arithmetic to logic. It is by no means settled as to how we should think of the relationship between arithmetic and logic, since logicians have not yet come to agreement about the proper conception of logic. Many modern logicians have a conception of logic that is yet different from both Kant and Frege. It is one which evolves out of the ideas that (1) certain concepts and laws remain invariant under permutations of the domain of quantification, and (2) that logic ought not to dictate the size of the domain of quantification. But this conception has not yet been articulated in a widely accepted way, and so elements common to Frege's and Kant's conception may yet play a role in our understanding of what logic is. (For an excellent discussion of Frege's conception of logic, see Goldfarb 2001.)

## 3. Frege's Philosophy of Language

While pursuing his investigations into mathematics and logic (and quite possibly, in order to ground those investigations), Frege was led to develop a philosophy of language. His philosophy of language has had just as much, if not more, impact than his contributions to logic and mathematics. Frege's seminal paper in this field ‘Über Sinn und Bedeutung’ (‘On Sense and Reference’, 1892a) is now a classic. In this paper, Frege considered two puzzles about language and noticed, in each case, that one cannot account for the meaningfulness or logical behavior of certain sentences simply on the basis of the denotations of the terms (names and descriptions) in the sentence. One puzzle concerned identity statements and the other concerned sentences with subordinate clauses such as propositional attitude reports. To solve these puzzles, Frege suggested that the terms of a language have both a sense and a denotation, i.e., that at least two semantic relations are required to explain the significance or meaning of the terms of a language. This idea has inspired research in the field for over a century.

### 3.1 Frege's Puzzles

#### 3.1.1 Frege's Puzzle About Identity Statements

Here are some examples of identity statements:

117+136 = 253.

The morning star is identical to the evening star.

Mark Twain is Samuel Clemens.

Bill is Debbie's father.

Frege believed that these statements all have the form
‘*a=b*’, where ‘*a*’ and
‘*b*’ are either names or descriptions that
*denote* individuals. He naturally assumed that a sentence of
the form ‘*a*=*b*’ is true if and only if
the object *a* just is (identical to) the object
*b*. For example, the sentence ‘117+136 = 253’ is
true if and only if the number 117+136 just is the number 253. And the
statement ‘Mark Twain is Samuel Clemens’ is true if and
only if the person Mark Twain just is the person Samuel Clemens.

But Frege noticed (1892) that this account of truth can't be all
there is to the meaning of identity statements. The statement
‘*a=a*’ has a cognitive significance (or meaning)
that must be different from the cognitive significance of
‘*a=b*’. We can learn that ‘Mark Twain=Mark
Twain’ is true simply by inspecting it; but we can't learn the
truth of ‘Mark Twain=Samuel Clemens’ simply by inspecting
it -- you have to examine the world to see whether the two persons are
the same. Similarly, whereas you can learn that ‘117+136 =
117+136’ and ‘the morning star is identical to the morning
star’ are true simply by inspection, you can't learn the truth of
‘117+136 = 253’ and ‘the morning star is identical to
the evening star’ simply by inspection. In the latter cases, you
have to do some arithmetical work or astronomical investigation to
learn the truth of these identity claims. Now the problem becomes
clear: the meaning of ‘*a=a*’ clearly differs from
the meaning of ‘*a=b*’, but given the account of the
truth described in the previous paragraph, these two identity
statements appear to have the same meaning whenever they are true! For
example, ‘Mark Twain=Mark Twain’ is true just in case: the
person Mark Twain is identical with the person Mark Twain. And
‘Mark Twain=Samuel Clemens’ is true just in case: the
person Mark Twain is identical with the person Samuel Clemens. But
given that Mark Twain just is Samuel Clemens, these two cases are the
same case, and that doesn't explain the difference in meaning between
the two identity sentences. And something similar applies to all the
other examples of identity statements having the forms
‘*a=a*’ and ‘*a=b*’.

So the puzzle Frege discovered is: how do we account for the
difference in cognitive significance between ‘*a=b*’
and ‘*a=a*’ when they are true?

#### 3.1.2 Frege's Puzzle About Propositional Attitude Reports

Frege is generally credited with identifying the following puzzle about propositional attitude reports, even though he didn't quite describe the puzzle in the terms used below. A propositional attitude is a psychological relation between a person and a proposition. Belief, desire, intention, discovery, knowledge, etc., are all psychological relationships between persons, on the one hand, and propositions, on the other. When we report the propositional attitudes of others, these reports all have a similar logical form:

xbelieves thatp

xdesires thatp

xintends thatp

xdiscovered thatp

xknows thatp

If we replace the variable ‘*x* ’ by the name of
a person and replace the variable ‘*p* ’ with a
sentence that describes the propositional object of their attitude, we
get specific attitude reports. So by replacing ‘*x*
’ by ‘John’ and ‘*p* ’ by
‘Mark Twain wrote *Huckleberry Finn*’ in the first
example, the result would be the following specific belief report:

John believes that Mark Twain wroteHuckleberry Finn.

To see the problem posed by the analysis of propositional attitude
reports, consider what appears to be a simple principle of reasoning,
namely, the Principle of Substitution. If a name, say *n*,
appears in a true sentence S, and the identity sentence *n=m* is
true, then the Principle of Substitution tells us that the substitution
of the name *m* for the name *n* in S does not affect the
truth of S. For example, let S be the true sentence ‘Mark Twain
was an author’, let *n* be the name ‘Mark
Twain’, and let *m* be the name ‘Samuel
Clemens’. Then since the identity sentence ‘Mark
Twain=Samuel Clemens’ is true, we can substitute ‘Samuel
Clemens’ for ‘Mark Twain’ without affecting the truth
of the sentence. And indeed, the resulting sentence ‘Samuel
Clemens was an author’ is true. In other words, the following
argument is valid:

Mark Twain was an author.

Mark Twain=Samuel Clemens.

Therefore, Samuel Clemens was an author.

Similarly, the following argument is valid.

4 > 3

4=8/2

Therefore, 8/2 > 3

In general, then, the Principle of Substitution seems to take the
following form, where S is a sentence, *n* and *m* are
names, and S(*n*) differs from S(*m*) only by the fact
that at least one occurrence of *m* replaces *n*:

From S(n) andn=m, infer S(m)

This principle seems to capture the idea that if we say something true about an object, then even if we change the name by which we refer to that object, we should still be saying something true about that object.

But Frege, in effect, noticed the following counterexample to the Principle of Substitution. Consider the following argument:

John believes that Mark Twain wroteHuckleberry Finn.

Mark Twain=Samuel Clemens.

Therefore, John believes that Samuel Clemens wroteHuckleberry Finn.

This argument is not valid. There are circumstances in which the
premises are true and the conclusion false. We have already described
such circumstances, namely, one in which John learns the name
‘Mark Twain’ by reading *Huckleberry Finn* but
learns the name ‘Samuel Clemens’ in the context of learning
about 19th century American authors (without learning that the name
‘Mark Twain’ was a pseudonym for Samuel Clemens). John may
*not* believe that Samuel Clemens wrote *Huckleberry
Finn*. The premises of the above argument, therefore, do not
logically entail the conclusion. So the Principle of Substitution
appears to break down in the context of propositional attitude reports.
The puzzle, then, is to say what causes the principle to fail in these
contexts. Why aren't we still saying something true about the man in
question if all we have done is changed the name by which we refer to
him?

### 3.2 Frege's Theory of Sense and Denotation

To explain these puzzles, Frege suggested that in addition to having a
denotation, names and descriptions also express a *sense*. The
sense of an expression accounts for its cognitive
significance—it is the way by which one conceives of the
denotation of the term. The expressions ‘4’ and
‘8/2’ have the same denotation but express different
senses, different ways of conceiving the same number. The descriptions
‘the morning star’ and ‘the evening star’
denote the same planet, namely Venus, but express different ways of
conceiving of Venus and so have different senses. The name
‘Pegasus’ and the description ‘the most powerful
Greek god’ both have a sense (and their senses are distinct),
but neither has a denotation. However, even though the names
‘Mark Twain’ and ‘Samuel Clemens’ denote the
same individual, they express different senses. Using the distinction
between sense and denotation, Frege can account for the difference in
cognitive significance between identity statements of the form
‘*a=a*’ and ‘*a=b*’. Since the
sense of ‘*a*’ differs from the sense of
‘*b*’, the components of the sense of
‘*a=a*’ and the sense of ‘*a=b*’
are different, guaranteeing that the sense of the whole expression
will be different in the two cases. Since the sense of an expression
accounts for its cognitive significance, Frege has an explanation of
the difference in cognitive significance between
‘*a=a*’ and ‘*a=b*’, and thus a
solution to the first puzzle.

Moreover, Frege proposed that when a term (name or description) follows a propositional attitude verb, it no longer denotes what it ordinarily denotes. Instead, Frege claims that in such contexts, a term denotes its ordinary sense. This explains why the Principle of Substitution fails for terms following the propositional attitude verbs in propositional attitude reports. The Principle asserts that truth is preserved when we substitute one name for another having the same denotation. But, according to Frege's theory, the names ‘Mark Twain’ and ‘Samuel Clemens’ denote different senses when they occur in the following sentences:

John believes that Mark Twain wroteHuckleberry Finn.

John believes that Samuel Clemens wroteHuckleberry Finn.

If they don't denote the same object, then there is no reason to think that substitution of one name for another would preserve truth.

Frege developed the theory of sense and denotation into a thoroughgoing philosophy of language. This philosophy can be explained, at least in outline, by considering a simple sentence such as ‘John loves Mary’. In Frege's view, the words ‘John’ and ‘Mary’ in this sentence are names, the expression ‘loves’ signifies a function, and, moreover, the sentence as a whole is a complex name. Each of these expressions has both a sense and a denotation. The sense and denotation of the names are basic; but sense and denotation of the sentence as a whole can be described in terms of the sense and denotation of the names and the way in which those words are arranged in the sentence alongside the expression ‘loves’. Let us refer to the denotation and sense of the words as follows:

d[j] refers to the denotation of the name ‘John’.

d[m] refers to the denotation of the name ‘Mary’.

d[L] refers to the denotation of the expression ‘loves’.

s[j] refers to the sense of the name ‘John’.

s[m] refers to the sense of the name ‘Mary’.

s[L] refers to the sense of the expression ‘loves’.

We now work toward a theoretical description of the denotation of
the sentence as a whole. On Frege's view, **d**[j] and
**d**[m] are the real individuals John and Mary,
respectively. **d**[L] is a function that maps
**d**[m] (i.e., Mary) to a function which serves as the
denotation of the predicate ‘loves Mary’. Let us refer to
that function as **d**[Lm]. Now the function
**d**[Lm] maps **d**[j] (i.e., John) to the
denotation of the sentence ‘John loves Mary’. Let us refer
to the denotation of the sentence as **d**[jLm]. Frege
identifies the denotation of a sentence as one of the two truth values.
Because **d**[Lm] maps objects to truth values, it is a
concept. Thus, **d**[jLm] is the truth value The True if
John falls under the concept **d**[Lm]; otherwise it is
the truth value The False. So, on Frege's view, the sentence
‘John loves Mary’ names a truth value.

The sentence ‘John loves Mary’ also expresses a sense.
Its sense may be described as follows. Although Frege doesn't appear to
have explicitly said so, his work suggests that **s**[L]
(the sense of the expression ‘loves’) is a function. This
function would map **s**[m] (the sense of the name
‘Mary’) to the sense of the predicate ‘loves
Mary’. Let us refer to the sense of ‘loves Mary’ as
**s**[Lm]. Now again, Frege's work seems to imply that we
should regard **s**[Lm] as a function which maps
**s**[j] (the sense of the name ‘John’) to the
sense of the whole sentence. Let us call the sense of the entire
sentence **s**[jLm]. Frege calls the sense of a sentence a
*thought*, and whereas there are only two truth values, he
supposes that there are an infinite number of thoughts.

With this description of language, Frege can give a general account
of the difference in the cognitive significance between identity
statements of the form ‘*a*=*a*’ and
‘*a*=*b*’. The cognitive significance is not
accounted for at the level of denotation. On Frege's view, the
sentences ‘4=8/2’ and ‘4=4’ both denote the
same truth value. The function ( )=( ) maps 4 and 8/2 to The
True, i.e., maps 4 and 4 to The True. So **d**[4=8/2] is
identical to **d**[4=4]; they are both The True. However,
the two sentences in question express different thoughts. That is
because **s**[4] is different from
**s**[8/2]. So the thought **s**[4=8/2] is
distinct from the thought **s**[4=4]. Similarly,
‘Mark Twain=Mark Twain’ and ‘Mark Twain=Samuel
Clemens’ denote the same truth value. However, given that
**s**[Mark Twain] is distinct from
**s**[Samuel Clemens], Frege would claim that the thought
**s**[Mark Twain=Mark Twain] is distinct from the thought
**s**[Mark Twain=Samuel Clemens].

Furthermore, recall that Frege proposed that terms following
propositional attitude verbs denote not their ordinary denotations but
rather the senses they ordinarily express. In fact, in the following
propositional attitude report, not only do the words ‘Mark
Twain’, ‘wrote’ and ‘*Huckleberry Finn*
’ denote their ordinary senses, but the entire sentence
‘Mark Twain wrote *Huckleberry Finn*’ also denotes
its ordinary sense (namely, a thought):

John believes that Mark Twain wroteHuckleberry Finn.

Frege, therefore, would analyze this attitude report as follows:
‘believes that’ denotes a function that maps the denotation
of the sentence ‘Mark Twain wrote *Huckleberry
Finn*’ to a concept. In this case, however, the denotation of
the sentence ‘Mark Twain wrote *Huckleberry Finn*’
is not a truth value but rather a thought. The thought it denotes is
different from the thought denoted by ‘Samuel Clemens wrote
*Huckleberry Finn*’ in the following propositional
attitude report:

John believes that Samuel Clemens wroteHuckleberry Finn.

Since the thought denoted by ‘Samuel Clemens wrote
*Huckleberry Finn*’ in this context differs from the
thought denoted by ‘Mark Twain wrote *Huckleberry
Finn*’ in the same context, the concept denoted by
‘believes that Mark Twain wrote *Huckleberry Finn*’
is a different concept from the one denoted by ‘believes that
Samuel Clemens wrote *Huckleberry Finn*’. One may
consistently suppose that the concept denoted by the former predicate
maps John to The True whereas the the concept denoted by the latter
predicate does not. Frege's analysis therefore preserves our intuition
that John can believe that Mark Twain wrote *Huckleberry Finn*
without believing that Samuel Clemens did. It also preserves the
Principle of Substitution---the fact that one cannot substitute
‘Samuel Clemens’ for ‘Mark Twain’ when these
names occur after propositional attitude verbs does not constitute
evidence against the Principle. For if Frege is right, names do not
have their usual denotation when they occur in these contexts.

## Bibliography

### A. Primary Sources

#### Chronological Catalog of Frege's Work

Supplementary Document in PDF (136 KB)

#### Works by Frege Cited in this Entry

1879 | Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete
Formelsprache des reinen Denkens, Halle a. S.: Louis Nebert.
Translated as Concept Script, a formal language of pure thought
modelled upon that of arithmetic, by S. Bauer-Mengelberg in J.
vanHeijenoort (ed.), From Frege to Gödel: A Source Book in
Mathematical Logic, 1879-1931, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University
Press, 1967. |

1884 | Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik: eine logisch-mathematische
Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl, Breslau: W. Koebner.
Translated as The Foundations of Arithmetic: A logico-mathematical
enquiry into the concept of number, by J.L. Austin, Oxford:
Blackwell, second revised edition, 1974. |

1891 | ‘Funktion und Begriff’, Vortrag, gehalten in der
Sitzung vom 9. Januar 1891 der Jenaischen Gesellschaft für Medizin
und Naturwissenschaft, Jena: Hermann Pohle. Translated as
‘Function and Concept’ by P. Geach in Translations from
the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege, P. Geach and M. Black
(eds. and trans.), Oxford: Blackwell, third edition, 1980. |

1892a | ‘Über Sinn und Bedeutung’, in Zeitschrift
für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik,
100: 25-50. Translated as ‘On Sense and
Reference’ by M. Black in Translations from the Philosophical
Writings of Gottlob Frege, P. Geach and M. Black (eds. and
trans.), Oxford: Blackwell, third edition, 1980. |

1892b | ‘Über Begriff und Gegenstand’, in
Vierteljahresschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie,
16: 192-205. Translated as ‘Concept and
Object’ by P. Geach in Translations from the Philosophical
Writings of Gottlob Frege, P. Geach and M. Black (eds. and
trans.), Oxford: Blackwell, third edition, 1980. |

1893 | Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, Jena: Verlag Hermann Pohle,
Band I. Partial translation as The Basic Laws of Arithmetic by
M. Furth, Berkeley: U. of California Press, 1964. |

1903 | Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, Jena: Verlag Hermann Pohle,
Band II. |

1904 | ‘Was ist eine Funktion?’, in Festschrift Ludwig
Boltzmann gewidmet zum sechzigsten Geburtstage, 20. Februar 1904,
S. Meyer (ed.), Leipzig: Barth, 1904, pp. 656-666. Translated as
‘What is a Function?’ by P. Geach in Translations from
the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege, P. Geach and M. Black
(eds. and trans.), Oxford: Blackwell, third edition, 1980. |

1906 | ‘Über die Grundlagen der Geometrie’ (Second
Series), Jahresbericht der Deutschen Mathematiker-Vereinigung
15, pp. 293-309 (Part I), 377-403 (Part II), 423-430
(Part III). Translation as ‘On the Foundations of Geometry
(Second Series)’ by E.-H. W. Kluge, in On the Foundatons of
Geometry and Formal Theories of Arthmetic, New Haven: Yale
University Press, 1971. |

### B. Secondary Sources

- Beaney, M., 1996,
*Frege: Making Sense*, London: Duckworth. - Beaney, M., 1997,
*The Frege Reader*, Oxford: Blackwell - Bell, D., 1979,
*Frege's Theory of Judgment*, Oxford: Clarendon. - Bolzano, B., 1817, ‘Rein analytischer Beweis des
Lehrsatzes’, in
*Early Mathematical Works (1781–1848)*, L. Novy (ed.), Institute of Czechoslovak and General History CSAS, Prague, 1981. - Boolos, G., 1986, ‘Saving Frege From Contradiction’,
*Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society*,**87**(1986/87): 137-151. - Boolos, G., 1987, ‘The Consistency of Frege's
*Foundations of Arithmetic*’, in J. Thomson (ed.),*On Being and Saying*, Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press, pp. 3-20. - Boolos, G., 1990, ‘The Standard of Equality of
Numbers’, in G. Boolos (ed.),
*Meaning and Method: Essays in Honor of Hilary Putnam*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 261-77. - Boolos, G., 1995, ‘Frege's Theorem and the Peano
Postulates’,
*The Bulletin of Symbolic Logic*1, 317-26. - Boolos, G., 1998,
*Logic, Logic, and Logic*, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. - Coffa, J.A., 1991,
*The Semantic Tradition from Kant to Carnap*, L. Wessels (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Currie, G., 1982,
*Frege: An Introduction to His Philosophy*, Brighton, Sussex: Harvester Press. - Demopoulos, W., (ed.), 1995,
*Frege's Philosophy of Mathematics*, Cambridge, MA: Harvard. - Dummett, M., 1973,
*Frege: Philosophy of Language*, London: Duckworth. - Dummett, M., 1981,
*The Interpretation of Frege's Philosophy*, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. - Dummett, M., 1991,
*Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics*, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. - Furth, M., 1967, ‘Editor's Introduction’, in G. Frege,
*The Basic Laws of Arithmetic*, M. Furth (translator and editor), Berkeley: University of California Press, pp. v-lvii - Goldfarb, W., 2001, ‘Frege's Conception of Logic’, in
J. Floyd and S. Shieh (eds.),
*Future Pasts: The Analytic Tradition in Twentieth-Century Philosophy*, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 25-41. - Haaparanta, L., and Hintikka, J., (eds.), 1986,
*Frege Synthesized*, Dordrecht: D. Reidel. - Heck, R., 1993, ‘The Development of Arithmetic in Frege's
*Grundgesetze der Arithmetik*’,*Journal of Symbolic Logic*,**58**/2 (June): 579-601. - Hodges, W., 2001, ‘Formal Features of
Compositionality’,
*Journal of Logic, Language and Information*, 10: 7-28. - Kant, I., 1781,
*Kritik der reinen Vernunft*, Riga: Johann Friedrich Hartknoch, 1st edition (A), 1781; 2nd edition (B), 1787. Translated as*Critique of Pure Reason*by P. Guyer and A. Wood, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998. - Klemke, E. D. (ed.), 1968,
*Essays on Frege*, Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press. - MacFarlane, J., 2002, ‘Frege, Kant, and the Logic in
Logicism’,
*Philosophical Review*, 111/1 (January): 25-66. - Parsons, C., 1965, ‘Frege's Theory of Number’, in M.
Black (ed.),
*Philosophy in America*, Ithaca: Cornell, 180-203. - Parsons, T., 1981, ‘Frege's Hierarchies of Indirect Senses
and the Paradox of Analysis’,
*Midwest Studies in Philosophy: VI*, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 37-57. - Parsons, T., 1987, ‘On the Consistency of the First-Order
Portion of Frege's Logical System’,
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*,**28**/1 (January): 161-168. - Parsons, T., 1982, ‘Fregean Theories of Fictional
Objects’,
*Topoi*,**1**: 81-87. - Pelletier, F.J., 2001, ‘Did Frege Believe Frege's
Principle’,
*Journal of Logic, Language, and Information*,**10**/1: 87-114. - Perry, J., 1977, ‘Frege on Demonstratives’,
*Philosophical Review*,**86**(1977): 474-497. - Reck, E., and Awodey, S. (trans./eds.), 2004,
*Frege's Lectures on Logic: Carnap's Student Notes, 1910-1914*, Chicago and La Salle, IL: Open Court. - Resnik, M., 1980,
*Frege and the Philosophy of Mathematics*, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press. - Ricketts, T., 1997, ‘Truth-Values and Courses-of-Value in
Frege's
*Grundgesetze*’, in*Early Analytic Philosophy*, W. Tait (ed.), Chicago: Open Court, pp. 187-211. - Ricketts, T., 1986, ‘Logic and Truth in Frege’,
*Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society*, Supplementary Volume 70, pp. 121-140. - Ricketts, T., forthcoming,
*Cambridge Companion to Frege*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Salmon, N., 1986,
*Frege's Puzzle*, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. - Schirn, M., (ed.), 1996,
*Frege: Importance and Legacy*, Berlin: de Gruyter. - Sluga, H., 1980,
*Gottlob Frege*, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul. - Sluga, H. (ed.), 1993,
*The Philosophy of Frege*, New York: Garland, four volumes. - Smiley, T., 1981, ‘Frege and Russell’,
*Epistemologica*4: 53-8. - Wright, C., 1983,
*Frege's Conception of Numbers as Objects*, Aberdeen: Aberdeen University Press.

## Other Internet Resources

- Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, (528 KB PDF file), original German text (maintained by Alain Blachair, Académie de Nancy-Metz)
- MacTutor History of Mathematics Archive
- Metaphysics Research Lab Web Page on Frege
- Frege, Gottlob,
by
Kevin Klement (U. Massachusetts/Amherst), in the
*Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy*. - Begriffsschrift in LaTeX, documentation for installing and using begriff.sty, a LaTeX package for typesetting Frege's concept script in LaTeX.

## Related Entries

Frege, Gottlob: logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic | logic: classical | logic: intensional | logicism | mathematics, philosophy of | neologicism |*Principia Mathematica*| quantification | reference | Russell, Bertrand | Russell's paradox | sense/reference distinction

### Acknowledgments

I would like to thank Kai Wehmeier, whose careful eye as a logician and Frege scholar caught several passages where I had bent the truth past the breaking point. Also, I'd like to thank to Emily Bender, who pointed out that I hadn't observed the distinction between relative and subordinate clauses in discussing Frege's analysis of belief reports.