# Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic

*First published Wed Jun 10, 1998; substantive revision Fri Apr 13, 2007*

Frege formulated two distinguished formal systems and used these
systems in his attempt both to express certain basic concepts of
mathematics precisely and to derive certain mathematical laws from the
laws of logic. In his *Begriffsschrift* of 1879, he developed a
second-order predicate calculus and used it both to define interesting
mathematical concepts and to state and prove mathematically interesting
propositions. However, in his *Grundgesetze der Arithmetik* of
1893/1903, Frege added (as an axiom) what he thought was a
distinguished logical proposition (Basic Law V) and tried to derive the
fundamental theorems of various mathematical (number) systems from this
proposition. Unfortunately, not only did Basic Law V fail to be a
logical proposition, but the resulting system proved to be
inconsistent, for it was subject to Russell's Paradox.

Although the inconsistency in Frege's *Grundgesetze* is
widely known, it is not very well known that a deep theoretical
accomplishment can be extracted from his work. The
*Grundgesetze* contains all the essential steps of a valid proof
(in second-order logic) of the fundamental propositions of arithmetic
from a single consistent principle. This consistent principle, known in
the literature as "Hume's Principle", asserts that for any concepts
*F* and *G*, the number of *F*-things is equal to
the number *G*-things if and only if there is a one-to-one
correspondence between the *F*-things and the *G*-things.
In the *Grundgesetze*, Frege used Basic Law V to derive Hume's
Principle, but the derivations of the fundamental propositions of
arithmetic from Hume's Principle do not essentially require Basic Law
V. So by setting aside the derivation of Hume's Principle from the
inconsistent Basic Law V and focusing on Frege's proofs of the basic
propositions of arithmetic, his theoretical accomplishment emerges much
more clearly, for his work shows us how to prove the Dedekind/Peano
axioms for number theory from Hume's Principle in second-order logic.
This achievement, which involves some remarkably subtle chains of
definitions and logical reasoning, has become known as Frege's Theorem.
[See Boolos (1990), p. 268.]

The principal goals of this essay are: (1) to review in some detail the essential features of Frege's logical systems, (2) to work through the derivations involved in Frege's Theorem, and (3) to frame the most important philosophical questions that arise in connection with this theorem. In addition, we hope to prepare students of Frege to read his original work (in translation) and to prepare the reader to understand a number of excellent articles in the secondary literature on Frege's work.

To accomplish these goals, we presuppose only a familiarity with the first-order predicate calculus. We show how to extend this language and logic to include the most salient features of Frege's second-order predicate calculus, his theory of concepts, and his theory of extensions. Our discussion will be largely based upon material drawn from Frege's three principal published works:

*Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens*, Halle a. S.: Louis Nebert, 1879; translation by S. Bauer Mengelberg as*Concept Notation: A formula language of pure thought, modelled upon that of arithmetic*, in J. van Heijenoort,*From Frege to Gödel: A Sourcebook in Mathematical Logic, 1879-1931*, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press*Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik: eine logisch-mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl*, Breslau: w. Koebner, 1884; translated by J. L. Austin as*The Foundations of Arithmetic: A Logic-Mathematical Enquiry into the Concept of Number*, Oxford: Blackwell, second revised edition, 1974.*Grundgesetze der Arithmetik*, Band I/II, Jena: Verlag Herman Pohle, 1893/1903; partial translation by M. Furth as*The Basic Laws of Arithmetic*, Berkeley: U. California Press, 1964. Volumes I/II)

**Begr**,

**Gl**and

**Gg I**/

**II**, respectively. Those readers already familiar with parts of Frege's texts may wish to skip the discussion of that material.

- 1. Frege's Predicate Calculus and Theory of Concepts
- 2. Frege's Theory of Extensions: Basic Law V
- 3. Frege's Analysis of Cardinal Numbers
- 4. Frege's Analysis of Predecessor, Ancestrals, and the Natural Numbers
- 5. Frege's Theorem
- 6. Philosophical Questions Surrounding Frege's Theorem
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Frege's Predicate Calculus and Theory of Concepts

In this section, we describe the language and logic of Frege's predicate calculus. We explain his function-argument analysis of atomic sentences and his definition of concepts in terms of functions, give examples of his ‘concept script’, and discuss the Rule of Substitution in his logic. We also show how Frege's Rule of Substitution corresponds to a comprehension principle for concepts in second-order logic, and we introduce and explain λ-notation to help us distinguish open formulas and complex names of concepts. Readers who are already familiar with these ideas may wish to skip ahead to Section 2.

### 1.1 The Language

In **Begr**, Frege invented the predicate calculus. It
will soon become clear that the language and logic of his predicate
calculus are ‘second-order’. The language included not only
the variables *x*,*y*,*z*, … ,
which range over *objects*, but also included the variables
ƒ,*g*,*h*, … , which range over
*functions*. Frege rigidly distinguished objects from functions
and so we may think of these variables as ranging over separate,
mutually exclusive domains. Frege took functional application
‘ƒ(*x*)’ as the principal operation for forming
complex names of objects in his language. The expression
‘ƒ(*x*)’ denotes the object to which the
function ƒ maps the object *x*. Frege called the object
*x* the ‘argument’ of the function ƒ and called
ƒ(*x*) the ‘value’ of the function. Since Frege
also recognized two special objects he called *truth-values*
(The True and The False), he defined a *concept* to be any
function that always maps its arguments to truth-values. For example,
whereas ‘*x*^{2} +3’ and
‘father-of(*x*)’ denote ordinary functions, the
expressions ‘Happy(*x*)’ and ‘*x* >
5’ denote concepts. The former denotes a concept which maps any
object that is happy to The True and all other objects to The False;
the latter denotes a concept that maps any object that is greater than
5 to The True and all other objects to The False. Given that concepts
like *being happy* and *being greater than* 5 map their
arguments to truth values, the atomic sentences of Frege's language,
such as ‘Happy(*b*)’ and ‘*4* >
5’, become *names* of truth-values.

In what follows, we use the symbols
*F*,*G*, … as variables ranging over
concepts and we often write ‘*Fx*’ (instead of
‘*F*(*x*)’) to express the claim that concept
*F* maps *x* to The True. When this claim is true, Frege
would say that *x* *falls under* the concept
*F*.

When ƒ is a function of two arguments *x* and *y*
and ƒ always maps its pair of arguments to a truth value, Frege
would say that ƒ is a relation. We shall use the expression
‘*Rxy*’ (or sometimes
‘*R*(*x*,*y*)’) to assert that the
relation *R* maps *x* and *y* (in that order) to
The True. In what follows, we shall sometimes write the symbol that
denotes a mathematical relation in the usual ‘infix’
notation; for example, ‘>’ denotes the greater-than
relation in the expression ‘*x* >
*y*’.

Now that we have explained Frege's analysis of the atomic statements
‘*Fx*’ and ‘*Rxy*’ familiar to
modern students of logic, we turn next to the more complex statements
of his language. Frege developed his own graphical notation for
asserting complex statements involving negations, conditionals, and
universal quantification. If we ignore the fact that Frege used Gothic
letters as variables of quantification, certain letters as bound
variables in names of courses-of-values, and certain other letters as
placeholders in the names of functions, then Frege's notation for the
logical notions ‘not’, ‘if-then’,
‘every’ and ‘some’ can be described in the
following
table:

So, for example, whereas a modern logician would symbolize the claim ‘All

Logical NotionModern NotationFrege-Style NotationIt is not the case that Fx¬ FxIf FxthenGyFx→GyEvery xis such thatFx∀ xFxSome xis such thatFx¬∀ x¬Fx, i.e., ∃xFxEvery Fis such thatFa∀ F FaSome Fis such thatFa¬∀ F¬Fa, i.e., ∃F Fa

*A*s are

*B*s’ as:

∀Frege would symbolize this claim as follows:x(Ax→Bx)

However, since Frege's notation was never adopted as a standard, we shall instead use the more familiar modern notation in the remainder of this essay. [See Beaney (1997, Appendix 2), Furth (1967), and Reck & Awodey (2004, 26–34) for a more detailed introduction to Frege's notation.] We shall assume that the reader is familiar with the fact that negations (‘¬φ’) and conditionals (‘φ → ψ’) can be used to define the other molecular formulas such as conjunctions (‘φ & ψ’), disjunctions (‘φ v ψ’), and biconditionals (‘φ ≡ ψ’). Moreover, it is important to mention that Frege took identity statements of the form ‘

*x*=

*y*’ as primitive in his language. Whereas ‘2

^{2}= 4’ names The True, ‘2

^{2}= 3’ names The False. The statement form ‘ƒ(

*x*) =

*y*’ plays an important role in Frege's axioms and definitions. Note finally that since Frege allowed quantification over both objects and functions, the language of his predicate calculus becomes ‘second-order’.

### 1.2 The Logic

Frege's logic consisted of basic axioms and rules of inference that governed the permissible inferences within his system. His axioms included familiar axioms of propositional logic, second-order predicate logic, and the logic of identity. For example, where φ and ψ are any formulas and ‘*a*’ is any object term and ‘

*P*’ is any concept term, then the following were among the basic laws of Frege's system:

- φ → (ψ → φ)
- (∀
*xPx*) →*Pa* - (∀
*F Fa*) →*Pa* *a = b*→ ∀*F*(*Fa*≡*Fb*)

**Gg I**, §47; however, the above laws are first introduced in

**Gg I**, §§18, 20, 25, and 20, respectively.] We shall simplify our discussion in what follows by assuming that the usual axioms of the modern second-order predicate calculus apply to Frege's system. These are essentially the same as the axioms for the first-order predicate calculus, except for the addition of laws for the second-order quantifiers ∀

*F*and ∃

*F*which correspond to the laws governing the first-order quantifiers ∀

*x*and ∃

*x*.

Although these axioms of Frege's logic are familiar to us, the rules of inference in Frege's system are not as familiar. The reason is that the rules govern not only his graphical notation for molecular and quantified formulas, but also his special purpose symbols, such as certain lowercase letters used as placeholders, certain Gothic letters and letters used as bound variables, and various other signs of his system we have not yet mentioned. Since these will play no role in the discussion that follows, we shall again simplify our discussion by assuming that the usual rules of the modern second-order predicate calculus apply to Frege's system. Again, these are essentially the same as the rules for the first-order predicate calculus, except for the addition of new rules for the second-order quantifiers that correspond to the generalization and instantiation rules (i.e., introduction and elimination rules) for the first-order quantifiers.

### 1.3 The Rule of Substitution

There is, however, one distinguished rule of Frege's system that will play an important role in what follows, namely, his Rule of Substitution. For the purposes of this discussion, we may initially formulate the rule in the following somewhat simplified manner:To see this rule in action, first consider the following theorem of (Frege's) second-order predicate logic:Rule of Substitution(Simplified Version):

In any statement of the form …Fx… (in which the variableFis free) which is derivable as a theorem of logic, we may substitute any open formula φ(x) (with the free variablex) for all the occurrences of the atomic formulaFxin …Fx… .

(A) ∀Now Frege's Rule of Substitution not only allows us to substitute the atomic formula ‘x(Fx≡Fx).

*Ox*’ (which might represent the claim ‘

*x is odd*’) for the formula

*Fx*to derive the true statement ∀

*x*(

*Ox*≡

*Ox*), but also allows us to substitute complex formulas with a free variable

*x*for ‘

*Fx*’. So, for example, we are allowed substitute the formula ‘

*Ox*&

*x*> 5’ (‘

*x*is odd and

*x*is greater than 5’) for ‘

*Fx*’ in (A) to derive the following from (A):

(B) ∀Inferences such as this will be valid no matter what complex formula withx(Ox&x> 5 ≡Ox&x> 5)

*x*free we substitute for

*Fx*in our universal claim (A). This is what justifies Frege's Rule of Substitution.

In what follows, we will assume that the Rule of Substitution can be
generalized to relations, so that we can uniformly replace the formula
*Rxy* (in a theorem of logic with *R* free) by a complex
formula φ(*x*,*y*) (in which both *x* and
*y* are free).

### 1.4 The Theory of Concepts

The Rule of Substitution has rather powerful consequences. It implies that there exists a concept corresponding to every open formula with a free variable*x*. To see that this is a consequence of the rule, note that it follows from (A) by existential generalization that:

∃Frege's Rule of Substitution now allows us to substitute any formula with free variableG∀x(Gx≡Fx)

*x*for

*Fx*. In other words, every instance of the following Comprehension Principle for Concepts is derivable in Frege's system:

Similarly, from the theorem of logic:Comprehension Principle for Concepts:

∃G∀x(Gx≡ φ(x)),

where φ(x) is any formula which hasxfree and which has no freeGs.

∀one can generalize and then use the Rule of Substitution to derive the following Comprehension Principle for Relations:x∀y(Rxy≡Rxy)

Although Frege didn't explicitly formulate these Comprehension Principles, they constitute a very important generalization about his system that reveals its underlying theory of concepts and relations. We can see these principles at work if we return to the example used above. The following is an instance of the Comprehension Principle for Concepts and so constitutes a theorem of Frege's system:Comprehension Principle for Relations:

∃R∀x∀y(Rxy≡ φ(x,y)),

where φ(x,y) is any formula withxandyfree and which has no freeRs.

∃This asserts: there exists a conceptG∀x(Gx≡Ox&x> 5)

*G*such that for every object

*x*,

*x*falls under

*G*if and only if

*x*is odd and greater than 5. We can see, therefore, that Frege's Rule of Substitution essentially treats an open formula like ‘

*Ox*&

*x*> 5’ as if it were a name of a complex concept. Similarly, the following is an instance of the Comprehension Principle for Relations:

∃This asserts the existence of a relation that objectsR∀x∀y(Rxy≡Ox&x> y)

*x*and

*y*bear to one another just in case the complex condition

*Ox*&

*x*>

*y*holds.

Logicians nowadays typically distinguish the open formula
φ(*x*) from the corresponding name of a concept. They use
the notation [λ*x* *Ox* & *x* > 5]
as the name of the concept *being an object x such that x is odd and
x is greater than* 5 (or, more naturally, ‘being odd and
greater than 5’). The term-forming operator λ*x*
(‘being an *x* such that’) combines with a formula
φ(*x*) in which *x* is free to produce
[λ*x* φ(*x*)]. The λ-expression is a
name of the concept expressed by the formula. This notation can be
extended for relational concepts. The expression:

[λxyOx&x>y]

names the 2-place relation *being an x and y such that x is odd and
greater than y*. So we will use expressions of the more general
form [λ*x**y* φ(*x*,*y*)] in
what follows. [The reader should note, however, that we are taking
λ-expressions to be complete expressions that denote concepts.
But Frege didn't use this notation. By contrast, he thought that
predicative expressions such as ‘( ) is happy’ are
incomplete expressions and that the concepts they denoted were
*unsaturated*. We shall not discuss Frege's reasons for this in
this entry; see his essay “Concept and Object”.

This λ-notation is governed by the following simple logical
principle known as λ-Conversion. Let φ(*x*) be any
formula in which the variable *x* is free, and let
φ(*y*/*x*) be the result of substituting the variable
*y* for *x* everywhere in φ(*x*). Then the
principle of λ-Conversion is:

λ-This asserts that an objectConversion:

∀y([λxφ(x)]y≡ φ(y/x))

*y*falls under the concept [λ

*x*φ(

*x*)] if and only if φ(

*y*/

*x*) holds. So, using our example, the following is an instance of λ-conversion:

∀This asserts that an objecty([λxOx&x> 5]y≡Oy&y> 5)

*y*falls under the concept

*being odd and greater than*5 if and only if

*y*is odd and greater than 5. Note that when the variable

*y*is instantiated to some object term, the resulting instance of λ-Conversion is a biconditional. Some logicians call the rule of inference derived from the right-to-left direction of such biconditionals ‘λ-Abstraction’. For example, the inference from

toO6 & 6 > 5

[λis justified by λ-Abstraction.xOx&x> 5]6

The principle of λ-Conversion can be generalized, so that it covers relations as well:

∀The reader should construct an instance of this principle using our example [λz∀w([λxyφ(x,y)]zw≡ φ(z/x,w/y))

*x*

*y*

*Ox*&

*x*> y].

To reiterate, then, Frege's Rule of Substitution allows us to
instantiate φ(*x*) for the free variable *F* in
theorems of logic as if φ(*x*) were a λ-expression
and constituted a name of a concept. In what follows, we shall make use
of this λ-notation. Indeed, λ-notation is required if we
are to give a more precise formulation of the Rule of Substitution; the
precise formulation of the rule for concepts is:

(The formulation for relations is similar.) Moreover, the principle of λ-Conversion simplifies the strict proof of the equivalence of Frege's Rule of Substitution and the Comprehension Principle for Concepts. As it turns out, not only does Frege's Rule of Substitution imply the Comprehension Principle for Concepts, but the converse also holds: the Comprehension Principle for Concepts implies the Rule of Substitution. [For a proof sketch, see Boolos (1985) pp. 161-162. Note that instead of [λRule of Substitution:

The λ-expression [λxφ(x)] may be uniformly substituted for the occurrences of the variableFin any theorem of logic containingFfree.

*x*φ(

*x*)], Boolos uses the notation {

*a*:

*Aa*}; elsewhere, in (1987) for example, Boolos uses the notation [

*x*:

*A*(

*x*)] to denote concepts.]

It is important to appreciate that the system we have just
described, i.e., Frege's system of second-order logic and the theory of
(relational) concepts that he developed in **Begr**, is
consistent. (It is only later in **Gg**, when Frege added
Basic Law V to this consistent basis, that the resulting system became
inconsistent.) Its underlying comprehension principle for concepts
ensures that the domain of concepts is very rich. Each concept has a
negation, every pair of concepts has a conjunction, every pair of
concepts has a disjunction, etc. The reader should be able to write
down instances of the comprehension principle which demonstrate these
claims. In Part III of **Begr**, Frege applied his system
to the ‘theory of sequences’ (we call these
‘*R*-series’ below). It is here that Frege presents
his celebrated definition of the ‘ancestral’ of a relation
and first proves the generalized analogues of the principle of
mathematical induction, as well as various structural properties of the
ancestral. We shall postpone further discussion of this work until
§§4 and 5, where we reproduce Frege's definition of the
ancestral of a relation and show how Frege incorporated this definition
into the proof of mathematical induction, respectively.

## 2. Frege's Theory of Extensions: Basic Law V

[Note: This section is included to give an historical understanding of Frege's system. It is not required for understanding the proof of Frege's Theorem.]
The principle that undermined Frege's system (Basic Law V) was one
that attempted to systematize the notions ‘course-of-values of a
function’ and ‘extension of a concept’. The
course-of-values of a function ƒ is something like a set of
ordered pairs that records the value ƒ(*x*) for every
argument *x*. For example, the course-of-values of the function
*father of x* records, among other things, that Bill Clinton is
the value of the function when Chelsea Clinton is the argument. The
course-of-values for the function *x*^{2} records, among
other things, that the number 4 is the value when the number 2 is the
argument, that 9 is the value when 3 is the argument, etc. The
extension of a concept is something like the set of all objects that
fall under the concept. For example, the extension of the concept *x
is a positive even integer less than 8* is something like the set
consisting of the numbers 2, 4, and 6 (strictly speaking, the extension
of this concept records The True as the value when 2, 4 and 6 are
supplied as argument, and records that The False is the value when
anything else is supplied as argument). Since concepts are just
functions from objects to truth values, the extension of a concept is
simply the course-of-values which records which objects that concept
maps to The True.

### 2.1 Notation for Courses-of-Values of Functions

Frege introduces notation for courses-of-values in**Gg I**, §9. He switched to the lower case Greek letters epsilon and alpha when writing the names of courses-of-values and extensions. He used something like the notation

and

to designate the course-of-values of the functions ƒ and

*g*, respectively. In this notation, the symbols and bind the object variables epsilon and alpha, respectively, and the resulting expression denotes a course-of-values.

Here is a pair of examples of Frege's notation for courses-of-values
and the second are examples of extensions. This pair of examples comes
from **Gg I**, §9. Frege uses the expression:

to denote the course-of-values of the function represented by the open formula:

He also uses:x^{2}−x

to denote the course-of-values of the function represented by the open formula:

Frege then notes that:x· (x− 1)

∀always has the same truth value as the following:x[x^{2}−x=x· (x− 1)]

This equivalence will become embodied in Basic Law V. The reader should now be in a position to see how the following formulation of Basic Law V corresponds to Frege's formulation in

**Gg I**, §20:

This principle asserts: the course-of-values of the function ƒ is identical to the course-of-values of the functionBasic Law V:

*g*if and only if ƒ and

*g*map every object to the same value. [Actually, Frege uses an identity sign instead of the biconditional sign as the main connective of the principle. The reason he could do this is that, in his system, when two sentences are materially equivalent, they

*name*the same truth value.] We shall soon explain why this principle is inconsistent.

### 2.2 Notation for Extensions of Concepts

In what follows, we shall alter Frege's notation just a bit, to reflect the fact that we are using a more traditional predicate calculus, rather than a term logic such as Frege's. In the special case where ƒ is the concept*F*, we use the simple notation ε

*F*to designate the extension of the concept

*F*. Note that λ-expressions [λ

*x*φ(

*x*)] can be instances of the variable

*F*, and so ε[λ

*x*φ(

*x*)] is well-formed and designates the extension of the concept [λ

*x*φ(

*x*)]. Thus, we do not use ε as an operator which binds object-variables, but rather as a functional operator on concept terms (i.e., on concept names or concept variables). When the operator is prefixed to a concept name, the resulting expression is a name of an object, and in particular, a name of the extension of the concept denoted. When the operator is prefixed to a concept variable, the resulting expression is a variable ranging over extensions. (Of course, these stipulations will be undermined by the inconsistency in Basic Law V, but it will do no harm now to assume that the stipulations are in effect, at least until the inconsistency in Basic Law V is explained.)

Here is an example of our notation involving a pair of complex
concepts. Consider the concept *that which when added to* 4
*equals* 5, or using λ-notation, the following
concept:

[λWe use the following notation to denote the extension of this concept:xx+4=5]

ε[λNow consider the conceptxx+4=5]

*that which when added to*2

^{2}

*equals*5 (i.e., [λ

*x*

*x*+2

^{2}=5]). We use the following notation to denote the extension of this concept:

ε[λNote that it seems natural to identify these two extensions whenever all and only the objects that fall under the first concept fall under the second.xx+2^{2}=5]

From these examples, it should be clear that when φ(*x*)
is any formula in which the variable *x* is free, we may write
ε[λ*x* φ(*x*)] to designate the
extension of the concept [λ*x* φ(*x*)].
Those readers already familiar with the ‘λ-calculus’
should remember that
ε[λ*x* φ(*x*)] denotes an object,
that [λ*x* φ(*x*)] denotes a concept, and
that Frege rigorously distinguished objects and concepts and supposed
them to constitute mutually exclusive domains.

### 2.3 Membership in an Extension

If we remember that the extension of a concept is something like the set of objects that fall under the concept, then we could replace Frege's talk of ‘extensions’ by talk of ‘sets’ and use the following ‘set notation’ to refer to the set of objects that when added to 4 yield 5 and the set of objects that when added to 2^{2}yield 5, respectively:

{In what follows, we sometimes render Frege's notation in this more modern notation.x|x+ 4 = 5}{

x|x+ 2^{2}= 5}

Frege took advantage of his second-order language to *define*
what it is for an object to be a member of an extension. Although Frege
used the notation *x* ∩ *y* to designate
the membership relation, we shall follow the more usual practice of
using *x* ∈ *y*. (Readers should check
that their web browsers are correctly displaying the difference between
the membership sign ∈ and the epsilon operator ε.) Thus,
the following captures the main features of Frege's definition of
membership in **Gg I**, §34:

In other words,x∈y=_{df}∃G(y=εG&Gx)

*x*is an element of

*y*just in case

*x*falls under a concept of which

*y*is the extension. For example, given this definition, one can prove that John is a member of the extension of the concept

*being happy*(formally:

*j*∈ εH) from the premise that John falls under the concept

*being happy*(‘

*Hj*’). Here is a simple proof:

Some readers may wish to examine a somewhat more complex example, in which the above definition of membership is used to prove that 1 ∈ ε[λ

1. HjPremise 2. ε H= εH= Introduction 3. ε H= εH&Hjfrom 1,2, by & Introduction 4. ∃ G(εH= εG&Gj)from 3, by Existential Introduction 5. j∈ εHfrom 4, by definition of ∈

*x*

*x*+2

^{2}=5] given the premise that 1+2

^{2}=5. (A More Complex Example)

### 2.4 Basic Law V for Concepts

Basic Law V has the following special case, when the functions
ƒ and *g* are the concepts *F* and *G*:

[Here, again, Frege used an identity sign in place of the biconditional signs.] In this special case, Basic Law V asserts: the extension of the conceptBasic Law V(Special Case):

εF= εG≡ ∀x(Fx≡Gx)

*F*is identical to the extension of the concept

*G*if and only if all and only the objects that fall under

*F*fall under

*G*(i.e., if and only if the concepts

*F*and

*G*are materially equivalent). In more modern guise, Frege's Basic Law V asserts that the set of

*F*s is identical to the set of

*G*s if and only if

*F*and

*G*are materially equivalent:

{x|Fx} = {y|Gy} ≡ ∀z(Fz≡Gz)

The example discussed above can now be seen as an instance of Basic Law V:

ε[λThis simply asserts that the extension of the conceptyy+4=5] = ε[λyy+2^{2}=5] ≡ ∀x([λyy+4=5]x≡ [λyy+2^{2}=5]x)

*that which added to*4

*yields*5 is identical to the extension of the concept

*that which added to*2

^{2}

*yields*5 if and only if all and only the objects that when added to 4 yield 5 are objects that when added to 2

^{2}yield 5.

Basic Law V has an important corollary, namely, that every concept has an extension:

Corollary to Basic Law V:

∀G∃x(x= εG)

To see that this is a consequence of Basic Law V, note that when we
instantiate the variable *G* to *F* in Basic Law V, we
can establish:

εF= εF≡ ∀x(Fx≡Fx)

Since the right side of this instance of Law V can be derived by logic
alone, it follows that ε*F* = ε*F*. But,
then, by existential generalization, it follows that:

∃x(x= εF)

But now the *Corollary* follows by universal generalization on
the concept variable *F*.

Basic Law V has other important corollaries as well. These are the Law
of Extensions and the Principle of Extensionality. The Law of
Extensions (cf. **Gg I**, §55, Theorem 1) asserts
that an object is a member of the extension of a concept if and only
if it falls under that concept:

Basic Law V also correctly implies the Principle of Extensionality. This principle asserts that if two extensions have the same members, they are identical. If we define ‘Law of Extensions:

∀F∀x(x∈ εF≡Fx)

*Extension*(

*x*)’ as ‘∃

*F*(

*x*=ε

*F*)’ then we may formally represent and derive the principle of extensionality as follows:

Despite these deceptive successes of Basic Law V, the fact is that it can't be consistently added to Frege's system. In the following subsections, we shall show how Basic Law V proves to be inconsistent with the rest of Frege's second-order logic and theory of concepts. The proofs depend essentially on the second-order character of Frege's system and on the second-order definition of the membership relation. Frege was made aware of the inconsistency by Bertrand Russell, who sent him a letter formulating ‘Russell's Paradox’ just as the second volume ofPrinciple of Extensionality:

Extension(x) &Extension(y) → [∀z(z∈x≡z∈y) →x=y]

**Gg**was going to press. Frege quickly added an Appendix to the second volume, describing two distinct ways of deriving a contradiction from Basic Law V. The first establishes the contradiction directly, without any special definitions. The second deploys the membership relation and more closely follows Russell's Paradox. We will examine both derivations of the contradiction in what follows.

Both derivations of the contradiction appeal to the *Corollary*
to Basic Law V. The combination of Frege's Rule of Substitution (which
ensures that there is a concept corresponding to every formula with
free variable *x*) and Basic Law V and its Corollary (which
ensure that each concept has an extension that behaves in a certain
way), turns out to be a volatile mix.

### 2.5 First Derivation of the Contradiction

In the Appendix to**Gg II**, Frege shows that a contradiction can be derived once we formulate the concept

*being the extension of a concept which you don't fall under*. The following open formula expresses this concept:

∃From the Comprehension Principle for Concepts (or Frege's Rule of Substitution), we know that there exists a concept corresponding to this formula and we may use the following λ-expression to name it:F(x=εF& ¬Fx)

[λNow by thex∃F(x=εF& ¬Fx)]

*Corollary*to Basic Law V, the extension of this concept exists and can be designated as follows:

ε[λIt can now be proved that this extension falls under the concept [λx∃F(x=εF& ¬Fx)]

*x*∃

*F*(

*x*=ε

*F*& ¬

*Fx*)] if and only if it does not.

(First Derivation of the Contradiction.)

### 2.6 Second Derivation of the Contradiction

Frege next (in the Appendix to**Gg II**) explained how Basic Law V implies the Naive Comprehension Axiom for extensions or sets, which Russell's Paradox shows to be inconsistent. From the Law of Extensions (which was derived from Basic Law V above), one can establish the Naive Comprehension Axiom for extensions in three simple steps. First we instantiate the Law of Extensions to the free variable

*F*, to yield:

∀Then by generalizing on the extension εx(x∈ εF≡Fx)

*F*, it follows that:

∃Now at this point, we may universally generalize on the variabley∀x(x∈y≡Fx)

*F*to get the following second-order Naive Comprehension Axiom for extensions, which asserts that for every concept

*F*, there is an extension which has as members all and only the objects that fall under

*F*:

Alternatively, instead of generalizing, we could have appealed to Frege's Rule of Substitution to show that all of the instances of the following Naive Comprehension Schema for extensions are derivable in Frege's system:Naive Comprehension Axiom for Extensions:

∀F∃y∀x(x∈y≡Fx)

This asserts that for any formula φ(Naive Comprehension Schema for Extensions:

∃y∀x(x∈y≡ φ(x)), where φ(x) is any formula in whichxis free and which contains no free occurrences ofy

*x*) defining a condition on objects, there is an extension which has as members all and only the objects that meet the condition.

Both the Naive Comprehension Axiom and the Naive Comprehension
Schema immediately give rise to Russell's Paradox in the context of
Frege's logic. In the case of the axiom, the contradiction follows by
instantiating the quantified variable *F* to the concept
[λ*z* ¬(*z* ∈ *z*)]. In the case
of the schema, the contradiction follows by taking φ(*x*) to
be ¬(*x* ∈ *x*), as follows:

∃In either case, the proof of the contradiction goes through. The derivation of the contradiction from the above instance of the schema is particularly easy. For suppose the objecty∀x(x∈y≡ ¬(x∈x))

*b*is such a

*y*. Then:

∀But we can now instantiate the universal claim to the objectx(x∈b≡ ¬(x∈x))

*b*to yield the following contradiction:

(See the entry on Russell's Paradox.)b∈b≡ ¬(b∈b)

### 2.7 How the Paradox is Engendered

Philosophers have diagnosed the inconsistency in Frege's system in various ways, and it is safe to say that the matter is still somewhat controversial. In this subsection, we discuss only the basic elements of the problem. Most philosophers and logicians agree that the reason Frege's second-order logic and theory of extensions is inconsistent is that they jointly require the impossible situation in which the domain of concepts has to be strictly larger than the domain of extensions while at the same time the domain of extensions has to be as large as the domain of concepts. This impossible situation is strikingly analogous to the impossible situation set up in the proof by*reductio*of Cantor's Theorem (Cantor's Theorem asserts that if

*A*is any set, and

*B*is the power set of

*A*(i.e.,

*B*is the set of all subsets of

*A*), then

*B*has more members than

*A*; the proof by reductio shows that it is impossible for there to be a function from

*A*

*onto*

*B*).

To analyze the inconsistency in Frege's system in more detail, it is
important to discuss the conditions under which concepts are to be
identified. Although Frege did not believe that statements of the form
‘*F* = *G*’ were meaningful, it is evident
from the study of **Gg** that the material equivalence of
concepts *F* and *G* serves as the proxy identity
conditions of *F* and *G*. So, whenever it is
*not* the case that all and only the objects that fall under
*F* fall under *G*, *F* and *G* are
distinct concepts.

With this in mind, we can see how the paradox is engendered. Recall
first that the *Corollary* to Basic Law V reveals that Basic Law
V correlates each concept with an extension. Each direction of Basic
Law V requires that this correlation have certain properties. We shall
see, for example, that the right-to-left direction of Basic Law V
(i.e., Va) requires that no concept gets correlated with two distinct
extensions. [Frege uses the label ‘Va’ to designate the
right-to-left direction of Basic Law V. See, for example, **Gg
I**, §52. However, many commentators use ‘Va’
to designate the left-to-right direction. We shall follow Frege's use,
since that will make sense of his Appendix to **Gg II**,
in which he discusses the paradoxes.] Va asserts:

If we think in terms of its contraposition and remember the identity conditions for concepts, Va in effect asserts that whenever extensions differ, the concepts with which they are correlated differ. This means that the correlation between concepts and extensions that Basic Law V sets up must be a function—no concept gets correlated with two distinct extensions (though for all Va tells us, distinct concepts might get correlated with the same extension). Frege noted (in the Appendix toBasic Law Va:

∀x(Fx≡Gx) → εF= εG

**Gg II**) that this direction of Basic Law V doesn't seem problematic.

However, the left-to-right direction of Basic Law V (i.e., Vb) is more serious. Vb asserts:

If we consider the contrapositive of this and remember the identity conditions for concepts, then Vb, in effect, asserts that whenever the conceptsBasic Law Vb:

εF= εG→ ∀x(Fx≡Gx)

*F*and

*G*differ, the extensions of

*F*and

*G*differ. So, the correlation that Basic Law V sets up between concepts and extensions will have to be one-to-one; i.e., it correlates distinct concepts with distinct extensions. Since every concept is correlated with some extension, there have to be at least as many extensions as there are concepts.

But the problem is that Frege's system *as a whole* requires
that there be *more* concepts than extensions. The requirement
that there be more concepts than extensions is imposed jointly by the
Comprehension Principle for Concepts *and* the new significance
this principle takes on in the presence of Basic Law V. The
Comprehension Principle for Concepts asserts the existence of a
concept for every condition on objects expressible in the
language. Now although it may seem that this principle, in and of
itself, forces the domain of concepts to be larger than the domain of
objects, it is a model-theoretic fact that there are models of
second-order logic with the Comprehension Principle for Concepts (but
without Basic Law V) in which the domain of concepts is not
larger than the domain of
objects.^{[1]}
However, the Comprehension
Principle for Concepts takes on new significance when Basic Law V is
added to Frege's system. The synergism of the Comprehension Principle
for Concepts and Basic Law V force the domain of concepts to be larger
than the domain of objects (and so larger than the domain of
extensions). However, as we saw in the last paragraph, Vb requires that
there be at least as many extensions as there are concepts.

Thus, Frege's second-order logic and theory of extensions together required the impossible situation in which the domain of concepts has to be strictly larger than the domain of extensions while at the same time the domain of extensions has to be as large as the domain of concepts.

Recently, there has been a lot of interest in discovering ways of
repairing Frege's system. The traditional view is that one must either
restrict Basic Law V or restrict the Comprehension Principle for
Concepts. Recently, Boolos (1986, 1993) developed one of the more
interesting suggestions for revising Basic Law V without abandoning
second-order logic and its comprehension principle for concepts. On
the other hand, there have been many suggestions for restricting the
Comprehension Principle for Concepts. The most severe of these is to
abandon second-order logic (and the Comprehension Principle for
Concepts) altogether. Schroeder-Heister (1987) conjectured that the
first-order portion of Frege's system (i.e., the system which results
by adding Basic Law V to the first-order predicate calculus) was
consistent and this was proved by T. Parsons (1987) and Burgess
(1998).^{[2]}
Heck (1996) and Wehmeier (1999) consider less drastic moves. They
investigate systems of second-order logic which have been extended by
Basic Law V but in which the Comprehension Principle for Concepts is
restricted in some way. See also Anderson & Zalta (2004) and
Antonelli & May (2005) for different approaches to repairing
Frege's system.

We will not discuss the above research further in the present entry,
for it is not clear which of their alternatives, or others, would have
been acceptable to Frege. Instead, we focus on the theoretical
accomplishment revealed by Frege's work in **Gg**.

Despite the failure of Basic Law V, Frege validly proved a rather
deep fact about the natural numbers, namely, that the Dedekind/Peano
axioms for number theory could be derived in second-order logic with
the help of a single additional principle. The principle in question is
known as Hume's Principle (discussed below). Although both C. Parsons
(1965) and Wright (1983) had recently noted that Hume's Principle was
powerful enough for the derivation of the Dedekind/Peano axioms, Heck
(1993) showed that although Frege did use Basic Law V to derive Hume's
principle, his (Frege's) subsequent derivations of the Dedekind/Peano
axioms of number theory from Hume's Principle never made an
*essential* appeal to Basic Law V. Since Hume's Principle just
by itself is consistent with second-order logic, this means that Frege
validly derived the basic laws of number theory. It will be the task of
the next few sections to explain Frege's accomplishments in this
regard. We will do this in two stages. In §3 we study Frege's
attempt to derive Hume's Principle from Basic Law V by analyzing
cardinal numbers as extensions. Then, we put this aside in
§§4 and 5 to examine how Frege was able to derive the
Dedekind/Peano axioms of number theory from Hume's Principle alone.

## 3. Frege's Analysis of Cardinal Numbers

Cardinal numbers are the numbers that can be used to answer the question ‘How many?’, and Frege discovered that such numbers bear an interesting relationship to the natural numbers. Frege's insights concerning this relationship trace back to his work in**Gl**, in which the notion of an extension played very little role. The seminal idea of

**Gl**, §46, was the observation that a statement of number (e.g., "There are nine planets") is an assertion about a concept. To explain this idea, Frege noted that one and the same external phenomenon can be counted in different ways; for example, a certain external phenomenon could be counted as one army, 5 divisions, 25 regiments, 120 companies, 400 platoons, or 4000 people. Each different way of counting this phenomenon corresponds to the manner of its conception. The question "How many are there?" is only properly formulated as the question "How many

*F*s are there?" where a concept

*F*is supplied. On Frege's view, the statements of number which answer such questions (e.g., "There are

*n*

*F*s") tell us something about the concept involved. For example, the statement "There are nine planets in the solar system" tells us that the ordinary,

*first-level*concept

*planet in the solar system*falls under the

*second-level*numerical concept

*concept under which nine objects fall*.

Frege then moves from this realization, in which statements of numbers
are analyzed as predicating second-level numerical concepts of
first-level concepts, to develop an account of the cardinal and
natural numbers as ‘self-subsistent’ objects. He
introduces a ‘cardinality operator’ on concepts, namely,
‘the number belonging to the concept *F*’, which
will designate the cardinal number which numbers the objects falling
under *F*. In what follows, we say this more simply as
‘the number of *F*s’ and use the simple notation
‘#*F*’. (Note that the operator # behaves like
ε operator — when it is prefixed to a name of a concept
(or prefixed to a concept variable), the resulting expression denotes
an object (or ranges over objects).) Frege offers both an implicit
and an explicit definition of this operator in
**Gl**. Both of these definitions require a preliminary
definition of when two concepts *F* and *G* are in
one-to-one correspondence or ‘equinumerous’. After
developing the definition of equinumerosity, we then discuss Frege's
implicit and explicit definition of the number of *F*s.

### 3.1 Equinumerosity

In order to state the definition of equinumerosity, we shall employ the well-known logical notion ‘there exists a unique*x*such that φ(

*x*)’. To say that there exists a unique

*x*such that φ(

*x*) is to say: there is some

*x*such that φ(

*x*) and anything

*y*which is such that φ(

*y*/

*x*) is identical to

*x*. In what follows, we use the notation ‘∃!

*x*φ(

*x*)’ to abbreviate this notion of unique existence, and we define it formally as follows:

∃!Now, in terms of this logical notion of unique existence, we can state Frege's definition of equinumerosity (xφ(x) =_{df}∃x[φ(x) & ∀y(φ(y/x) →y=x)]

**Gl**, §71, 72) as follows:

If we let ‘FandGareequinumerous(or,FandGare inone-to-one correspondence) just in case there is a relationRsuch that: (1) every object falling underFisR-related to a unique object falling underG, and (2) every object falling underGis such that there is a unique object falling underFwhich isR-related to it.

*F*≈

*G*’ stand for equinumerosity, then the definition of this notion can be rendered formally as follows:

To see that Frege's definition of equinumerosity works correctly, consider the following two examples. In the first example, we have two concepts that are equinumerous:F≈G=_{df}

∃R[∀x(Fx→ ∃!y(Gy&Rxy)) & ∀x(Gx→ ∃!y(Fy&Ryx))]

Although there are several different relations

Figure 1

*R*which would demonstrate the equinumerosity of

*F*and

*G*the particular relation used in Figure 1 is:

It is a simple exercise to show thatR_{1}= [λxy(x=a&y=f) v (x=b&y=g) v (x=c&y=e)]

*R*

_{1}, as defined, is a ‘witness’ to the equinumerosity of

*F*and

*G*(according to the definition).

In the second example, we have two concepts that are not equinumerous:

In this example, no relation

Figure 2

*R*can satisfy the definition of equinumerosity.

Clearly, then, the concepts *F* and *G* will be
equinumerous whenever the number of objects falling under *F* is
identical to the number of objects falling under *G*. This fact
will be codified by Hume's Principle. Before moving ahead to the
discussion of this principle, the reader should convince him- or
herself of the following four facts: (1) that the material equivalence
of two concepts implies their equinumerosity, (2) that equinumerosity
is reflexive, (3) that equinumerosity is symmetric, and (4) that
equinumerosity is transitive. In formal terms, the following facts are
provable:

The proofs of these facts, in each case, require the identification of a relation that is a witness to the relevant equinumerosity claim. In some cases, it is easy to identify the relation in question. In other cases, the reader should be able to ‘construct’ such relations (using λ-notation) by considering the examples described above. Facts (2) – (4) establish that equinumerosity is an ‘equivalence relation’ which divides up the domain of concepts into ‘equivalence classes’ of equinumerous concepts. Material equivalence is also an equivalence relation which divides up the domain of concepts into equivalence classes of materially equivalent concepts.Facts About Equinumerosity:

1. ∀x(Fx≡Gx) →F≈G

2.F≈F

3.F≈G→G≈F

4.F≈G&G≈H→F≈H

### 3.2 Contextual Definition of ‘The Number of *F*s’: Hume's Principle

Frege contextually defined ‘the number of *F*s’ in terms of the principle now known as Hume's Principle:

^{[3]}

Using our notation ‘#Hume's Principle:

The number ofFs is identical to the number ofGs if and only ifFandGare equinumerous.

*F*’ to abbreviate ‘the number of

*F*s’, we may formalize Hume's Principle as follows:

This contextual definition governing cardinal numbers is the basic principle upon which Frege forged his development of the theory of natural numbers.Hume's Principle:

#F= #G≡F≈G

^{[4]}In

**Gl**, Frege sketched the derivations of the basic laws of number theory from Hume's Principle; these sketches were developed into more rigorous proofs in

**Gg I**. We will examine these derivations in the following sections.

Once Frege had a contextual definition of #*F*, he then
defined a cardinal number as any object which is the number of some
concept:

This definition appears inx is a cardinal number=_{df}∃F(x= #F)

**Gl**, §72.

Notice that Hume's Principle bears an obvious formal resemblance to
Basic Law V. Both are biconditionals asserting the equivalence of an
identity among singular terms (the left-side condition) with an
equivalence relation on concepts (the right-side condition). Indeed,
both correlate concepts with certain objects. In the case of Hume's
Principle, each concept *F* is correlated with #*F*.
However, whereas Basic Law V problematically asserts that the
correlation between concepts and extensions is one-to-one, Hume's
Principle only asserts that the correlation between concepts and
numbers is many-to-one. Hume's Principle often correlates distinct
concepts with the same number. For example, the distinct concepts
*author of Principia Mathematica* (‘[λ*x*
*Axp*]’) and *number between* 1 *and* 4
(‘[λ*x* 1 < *x* < 4]’) are
equinumerous (both both have two objects falling under them). So
#[λ*x* *Axp*] = #[λ*x* 1 <
*x* < 4]. Thus, Hume's Principle, unlike Basic Law V, does
not require that the domain of numbers be as large as the domain of
concepts. Indeed, Hume's Principle has recently been proved consistent
with second-order logic. This was shown independently by Burgess
(1984) and Hazen (1985).

### 3.3 Explicit Definition of ‘The Number of *F*s’

[Note: The remaining two subsections are not strictly necessary for
understanding the proof of Frege's Theorem. They are included here for
those who wish to have a more complete understanding of what Frege in
fact attempted to do. They presuppose the material in §2. Readers
interested in just the positive aspects of Frege's accomplishments
should skip directly to §4.]
Before we examine the powerful consequences that Frege derived from
Hume's Principle, it is worth digressing to describe his failed attempt
to explicitly define ‘#*F*’ and to derive Hume's
Principle from Basic Law V. The idea behind this attempt was the
realization that if given any concept *F*, the notion of
equinumerosity can be used to define the second-level concept *being
a concept G that is equinumerous to F* (‘*G* ≈
*F*’). Frege found a way to collect all of the concepts
equinumerous to a given concept *F* into a single extension. In
**Gl**, he informally took this to be an extension
consisting of first-order concepts. In that work, he defined informally
(§68):

the number ofIn terms of the example used at the end of the previous subsection, this definition identifies the number of the conceptFs =_{df}

the extension of the second-level concept:being a first-level concept equinumerous to F

*author of Principia Mathematica*as the extension consisting of all and only those first-level concepts that are equinumerous to this concept; this extension has both [λ

*x*

*Axp*] and [λ

*x*1 < x < 4] as members. Frege in fact identifies the cardinal number 2 with this extension, for it contains all and only those concepts under which two objects fall. Similarly, Frege identifies the cardinal number 0 with the extension consisting of all those first-level concepts under which no object falls; this extension would include such concepts as

*unicorn*,

*centaur*,

*prime number between*3

*and*5, etc. Frege's insight here inspired Russell to develop a somewhat similar definition in his work, and it is now common to see references to the so-called "Frege-Russell definition of the cardinal numbers" as classes of equinumerous concepts or sets.

^{[5]}Of course, this explicit definition of ‘the number of

*F*s’ stands or falls with a coherent conception of ‘extension’. We know that Basic Law V does not offer such a coherent conception.

### 3.4 Derivation of Hume's Principle

Frege's derivation of Hume's Principle was invalidated by the fact that it appeals to the inconsistent Basic Law V. Nevertheless, it is instructive to consider why Frege thought the derivation was valid. In**Gl**, §73, Frege sketches an informal proof of the right-to-left direction of Hume's Principle using the above explicit definition of the number of

*F*s. The derivation appeals to the fact that a concept

*G*is a member of the extension of the second-level concept

*concept equinumerous to F*if and only if

*G*is equinumerous to

*F*. In other words, the proof relies on a kind of higher-order version of the Law of Extensions (described above), the ordinary version of which we know to be a consequence of Basic Law V.

^{[6]}Here is a reconstruction of Frege's proof in

**Gl**, §73, extended so as to cover both directions of Hume's Principle.

Frege's Derivation of Hume's Principle in theHowever, in the development ofGrundlagen

**Gg**, Fregean extensions do

*not*contain concepts as members but rather objects. So Frege had to find another way to express the explicit definition described in the previous subsection. His technique was to let extensions go proxy for their corresponding concepts. Since a full explanation of this technique and the proof of Hume's Principle in

**Gg**would constitute a digression for the present exposition, we shall describe the details for interested readers on a separate page:

Frege's ‘Derivation’ of Hume's Principle in theAs noted on several occasions, the inconsistency in Basic Law V invalidated Frege's derivation of Hume's Principle. But Hume's Principle, in and of itself, is a powerful and consistent principle.Grundgesetze

## 4. Frege's Analysis of Predecessor, Ancestrals, and the Natural Numbers

In what follows, we shall suppose that Hume's Principle has replaced Basic Law V in Frege's second-order system. This requires that we replace the operator "the course of values of the function*f*" (and "the extension of concept

*F*") with the primitive operator "the number of Fs". As we have mentioned, Frege made the insightful discovery that the basic laws of number theory could be derived from Hume's Principle alone. This is Frege's Theorem. In this section, we introduce the definitions required for the proof of Frege's Theorem. In the next section, we go through the proof. In the final section, we conclude with a discussion of the philosophical questions that arise when we consider Hume's Principle as a replacement for Basic Law V.

The insight behind Frege's analysis of the natural numbers was the realization that one can define the finite cardinal numbers in terms of the following concepts:

CNote that starting with C_{0}= [λxx≠x]

C_{1}= [λxx= #C_{0}]

C_{2}= [λxx= #C_{0}vx= #C_{1}]

C_{3}= [λxx= #C_{0}vx= #C_{1}vx= #C_{2}]

etc.

_{1}, each concept C

_{k}has the following property: all and only the numbers of concepts preceding C

_{k}in the sequence fall under C

_{k}. So, for example, the concepts preceding C

_{3}are C

_{0}, C

_{1}, and C

_{2}. Accordingly, all and only the following numbers fall under C

_{3}: #C

_{0}, #C

_{1}, and #C

_{2}.

Frege noticed that these concepts can be used, respectively, to define the the finite cardinal numbers, as follows:

0 = #CThis insight, however, was only the first step in Frege's plan. He realized that though this seems to define a sequence of numbers with which we can identify the natural numbers, we have not as yet defined the concept ‘natural number’ so that it applies to all and only the cardinal numbers defined in the second sequence. Such a concept is required if we are to prove_{0}

1 = #C_{1}

2 = #C_{2}

etc.

*as theorems*the following axioms of Dedekind/Peano number theory:

Moreover, Frege recognized the need to employ the Principle of Induction in the proof that every number has a successor. One cannot prove the claim thatDedekind/Peano Axioms for Number Theory:

- 0 is a natural number.
- 0 is not the successor of any natural number.
- No two natural numbers have the same successor.
- If both (a) 0 falls under
F, and (b) for any two natural numbersnandmsuch thatmis the successor ofn, the fact thatnfalls underFimplies thatmfalls underF, then every natural number falls underF. (Principle of Induction)- Every natural number has a successor.

*every number has a successor*simply by producing the sequence of expressions for cardinal numbers (e.g., the second of the two sequences described above). All such a sequence demonstrates is that for every expression listed in the sequence, one can define an expression of the appropriate form to follow it in the sequence. This is

*not*the same as proving that

*every natural number*has a successor.

### 4.1 Predecessor

To accomplish these further goals, Frege proceeded by defining the concept*x*(

*immediately*)

*precedes y*as follows (

**Gl**, §76, and

**Gg I**, §43):

In formal terms, the definition takes the following form:x(immediately)precedesyif and only if there is a conceptFand an objectwsuch that: (a)wfalls underF, (b)yis the number ofFs, and (c)xis the number of the conceptobject falling under F other than w

Even though we can't as yet assume that we have defined the natural numbers 1 and 2, we can use them intuitively to show that the definition properly predicts thatPrecedes(x,y) =_{df}

∃F∃w(Fw& y = #F&x= #[λzFz&z≠w])

*Precedes*(1,2) if given certain facts about the numbers of certain concepts. Let the expression ‘[λ

*z*

*Azp*]’ denote the concept

*author of Principia Mathematica*. Only Bertrand Russell (‘

*r*’) and Alfred Whitehead fall under this concept. Let the expression ‘[λ

*z*

*Azp*&

*z*≠

*r*]’ denote the concept

*author of Principia Mathematica other than Russell*.

^{[7]}Then the following may, for the purposes of this example, be taken as facts:

- Russell falls under the concept
*author of Principia Mathematica*, i.e.,

[λ*z**Azp*]*r* - 2 is the number of the concept
*author of Principia Mathematica*, i.e.,

2 = #[λ*z**Azp*] - 1 is the number of the concept
*author of Principia Mathematica other than Russell*, i.e.,

1 = #[λ*z**Azp*&*z*≠*r*]

*Precedes*(1,2).

### 4.2 The Ancestral of Relation *R*

Frege next defines the relational concept *x is an ancestor of y in the R-series*. This new relation is called ‘the ancestral of the relation

*R*’ and we henceforth designate this relation as

*R**. Frege first defined the ancestral of relation

*R*in

**Begr**(Part III, Proposition 76), though the word ‘ancestral’ comes to us from Russell and Whitehead. Frege's term for the ancestral is "

*x*comes before

*y*in the

*R*-series"; alternatively, "

*y*follows

*x*in the

*R*-series". (See also

**Gl**, §79 and

**Gg I**, §45.) The intuitive idea is easily grasped if we consider the relation

*x*is the father of

*y*. Suppose that

*a*is the father of

*b*, that

*b*is the father of

*c*, and that

*c*is the father of

*d*. Then ‘

*x*is an ancestor of

*y*in the fatherhood-series’ is defined so that

*a*is an ancestor of

*b*,

*c*, and

*d*, that

*b*is an ancestor of

*c*and

*d*, and that

*c*is an ancestor of

*d*.

Frege's definition of the ancestral of *R* requires a
preliminary definition:

In formal terms:the concept F is hereditary in the R-seriesif and only if any pair ofR-related objectsxandyare such thatyfalls underFwheneverxfalls underF

Intuitively, the idea is thatHer(F,R) =_{abbr}∀x∀y(Rxy→ (Fx→Fy))

*F*is hereditary in the

*R*-series if

*F*is always ‘passed’ from

*x*to

*y*whenever

*x*and

*y*are a pair of

*R*-related objects. (We warn the reader here that the notation ‘

*Her*(

*F*,

*R*)’ is merely an abbreviation of a much longer statement. It is

*not*a formula of our language having the form ‘

*R*(

*x*,

*y*)’. In what follows, we sometimes introduce other such abbreviations.)

Frege's definition of the ancestral of *R* can now be stated
as follows:

In other words,x comes before y in the R-series=_{df}yfalls under all thoseR-hereditary conceptsFunder which falls every object to whichxisR-related

*y*follows

*x*in the

*R*-series whenever

*y*falls under every hereditary concept

*F*which

*x*‘passes on’ to all of its immediate descendants. In formal terms:

For example, Clinton's father stands in relationR*(x,y) =_{df}∀F[∀z(Rxz→Fz) &Her(F,R) →Fy]

*father* of*(i.e.,

*forefather*) to Chelsea because she falls under every hereditary concept that Clinton and his brother inherited from Clinton's father. However, Clinton's brother is not one of Chelsea's forefathers, since he fails to be her father, her grandfather, or any of the other links in the chain of fathers from which Chelsea descended.

It is important to grasp the differences between a relation
*R* and its ancestral *R**. *Rxy* implies
*R**(*x*,*y*) (e.g., if Clinton is a father of
Chelsea, then Clinton is a forefather of Chelsea), but the converse
doesn't hold (Clinton's father is a father* of Chelsea, but he is not a
father of Chelsea). Indeed, a grasp of the definition of *R**
should leave one able to prove the following easy consequences, many of
which correspond to theorems in **Begr** and
**Gg**:^{[8]}

**Facts About R***:

*Rxy*→*R**(*x*,*y*)- ¬∀R∀
*x*∀*y*(*R**(*x*,*y*) →*Rxy*) - [
*R**(*x*,*y*) & ∀*z*(*Rxz*→*Fz*) &*Her*(*F*,*R*)] →*Fy*^{[9]} - ∃
*x**R**(*x*,*y*) → ∃*x Rxy* - [
*Fx*&*R**(*x*,*y*) &*Her*(*F*,*R*)] →*Fy* *Rxy*&*R**(*y*,*z*) →*R**(*x*,*z*)*R**(*x*,*y*) &*R**(*y*,*z*) →*R**(*x*,*z*)

*R*is taken to be the relation

*precedes*. Appealing to our intuitive grasp of the numbers, we can say that it is an instance of Fact (1) that if 10 precedes 12, then 10 precedes* 12; and that it is an instance of Fact (2) that 10's preceding* 12 does not imply that 10 precedes 12. An instance of Fact (7) is that precedes* is transitive. When we restrict ourselves to the natural numbers, it is intuitive to think of the difference between precedes and precedes* as the difference between

*immediately precedes*and

*less-than*.

### 4.3 The Weak Ancestral of *R*

Given the notion of the ancestral of relation *R*, Frege then defines its weak ancestral, which he termed "

*y is a member of the R-series beginning with x*" (cf.

**Begr**, Part III, Proposition 99;

**Gl**, §81, and

**Gg I**, §46):

In formal terms:y is a member of the R-series beginning with xif and only if eitherxbears the ancestral ofRtoyorx=y

We note here that Frege would also readR^{+}(x,y) =_{df}R*(x,y) vx=y

*R*

^{+}(

*x*,

*y*) as:

*x*is a member of the

*R*-series ending with

*y*! Logicians call

*R*

^{+}the ‘weak-ancestral’ of

*R*because it is a weakened version of

*R**. When

*R*is

*precedes*, we can intuitively regard its weak ancestral,

*precedes*

^{+}, as the relation

*less-than-or-equal-to*on the natural numbers.

The general definition of the weak ancestral of *R* yields
the following facts, many of which correspond to theorems in
**Gg**:^{[10]}

**Facts About
R^{+}**:

*Rxy*→*R*^{+}(*x*,*y*)*Rxy*&*R*^{+}(*y*,*z*) →*R**(*x*,*z*)*R*^{+}(*x*,*y*) &*Ryz*→*R**(*x*,*z*)*R**(*x*,*y*) &*Ryz*→*R*^{+}(*x*,*z*)*R*^{+}(*x*,*x*) (Reflexivity)*R**(*x*,*y*) → ∃*z*[*R*^{+}(*x*,*z*) &*Rzy*] (Proof of Fact 6 Concerning the Weak Ancestral)- [
*Fx*&*R*^{+}(*x*,*y*) &*Her*(*F*,*R*)] →*Fy* *R**(*x*,*y*) &*Rzy*&*R*is 1-1 →*R*^{+}(*x*,*z*)^{[11]}

### 4.4 The Concept *Natural Number*

Frege's definition of *natural number*requires one more preliminary definition. It may be recalled that Frege identified the number 0 as the (cardinal) number of the concept

*being non-self-identical*. That is:

0 =Since the logic of identity guarantees that no object fails to be self-identical, nothing falls under the concept_{df}#[λxx≠x]

*being non-self-identical*. Had one of Frege's explicit definitions of the cardinal numbers worked as he had intended, the number 0 would, in effect, be identified with the extension of all (extensions of) concepts under which nothing falls. However, for the present purposes, we may note that 0 is defined in terms of the primitive notion ‘the number of

*F*s’ and a particular complex concept the existence of which is guaranteed in Frege's theory of concepts and second-order logic with identity. It is straightforward to prove the following Lemma Concerning Zero from this definition of 0:

Note that the proof appeals to Hume's Principle and facts about equinumerosity.Lemma Concerning Zero:

#F= 0 ≡ ¬∃xFx

Frege's definition of the concept *natural number* can now be
stated in terms of the weak-ancestral of Predecessor:

This definition appears inx is a natural numberif and only ifxis a member of the predecessor-series beginning with 0

**Gl**, §83, and

**Gg I**, §46 as the definition of ‘finite number’. Indeed, the natural numbers are precisely the finite cardinals. In formal terms, Frege's definition becomes:

In what follows, we shall sometimes use the variablesNx=_{df}Precedes^{+}(0,x)

*m*,

*n*, and

*o*to range over the natural numbers.

## 5. Frege's Theorem

Frege's Theorem is that the five Dedekind/Peano axioms for number
theory can be derived from Hume's Principle in second-order logic. In
this section, we reconstruct the proof of this theorem which can be
extracted from Frege's work using the definitions and theorems
assembled so far. Some of the steps in this proof can be found in
**Gl**. (See the Appendix to Boolos (1990) for a
reconstruction.) Our reconstruction follows Frege's **Gg**
in spirit and in most details, but we have tried to simplify the
presentation in several places. For a more strict description of
Frege's **Gg** proof, the reader is referred to Heck
(1993). The following should help prepare the reader for Heck's
excellent essay.

### 5.1 Zero is a Number

The following is an immediate consequence of the definition of*natural number*:

It seems that Frege never actually identified this fact explicitly inTheorem 1:

N0

Proof: It is a simple consequence of the definition of ‘weak ancestral’ thatR^{+}is reflexive (see Fact 4 aboutR^{+}in our subsection on the Weak Ancestral in §4). SoPrecedes^{+}(0,0). Hence, by the definition of number, 0 is a number.

**Gl**or labeled this fact as a numbered Theorem in

**Gg I**. It is possible that he thought it was too obvious to mention.

### 5.2 Zero Isn't the Successor of Any Number

It is also a simple consequence of the foregoing that 0 doesn't succeed any number. This can be represented formally as follows:SeeTheorem 2:

¬∃x(Nx&Precedes(x,0))

Proof: Assume, forreductio, that some object, sayb, is such thatPrecedes(b,0). Then, by the definition of predecessor, it follows that there is a concept, sayQand an object, sayc, such thatQc& 0=#Q&b=#[λzQz&z≠c]. But by the Lemma Concerning Zero (above), 0=#Qimplies ¬∃xQx, which contradicts the fact thatQc. So nothing precedes 0. Since nothing precedes 0, no natural number precedes 0.

**Gl**, §78, Item (6); and

**Gg I**, §109, Theorem 126.

### 5.3 No Two Numbers Have the Same Successor

The fact that no two numbers have the same successor is somewhat more difficult to prove (cf.**Gl**, §78, Item (5);

**Gg I**, §95, Theorem 89). We may formulate this theorem as follows, with

*m*,

*n*, and

*o*as restricted variables ranging over the natural numbers:

In other words, this theorem asserts that predecessor is a one-to-one relation on the natural numbers. To prove this theorem, it suffices to prove that predecessor is a one-to-one relation full stop. One can prove that predecessor is one-to-one from Hume's Principle, with the help of the following Equinumerosity Lemma, the proof of which is rather long and involved. The Equinumerosity Lemma asserts that whenTheorem 3:

∀m∀n∀o[Precedes(m,o) &Precedes(n,o) →m=n]

*F*and

*G*are equinumerous,

*x*falls under

*F*, and

*y*falls under

*G*, then the concept

*object falling under F other than x*is equinumerous to the concept

*object falling under G other than y*. The picture is something like this:

In terms of Figure 3, the Equinumerosity Lemma tells us that if there is a relation

Figure 3

*R*which is a witness to the equinumerosity of

*F*and

*G*, then there is a relation

*R*′ which is a witness to the equinumerosity of the concepts that result when you restrict

*F*and

*G*to the objects other than

*x*and

*y*, respectively.

To help us formalize the Equinumerosity Lemma, let
*F*^{−x} abbreviate the concept
[λ*z* *Fz* & *z*≠*x*] and let
*G*^{−y} abbreviate the concept
[λ*z* *Gz* & *z*≠*y*]. Then
we have:

Now we can prove that Predecessor is a one-to-one relation from this Lemma and Hume's Principle (cf.Equinumerosity Lemma:

F≈G&Fx&Gy→F^{−x}≈G^{−y}

**Gg I**, §108):

So, if Predecessor is a one-to-one relation, it is a one-to-one relation on the natural numbers. Therefore, no two numbers have the same successor. This completes the proof of Theorem 3.Predecessor is One-to-One:

∀x∀y∀z[Precedes(x,z) &Precedes(y,z) →x=y]

Proof: Assume that bothaandbare precedessors ofc. By the definition of predecessor, we know that there are concepts and objectsP,Q,d, ande, such that:But if both

Pd&c= #P&a= #P^{−d}Qe&c= #Q&b= #Q^{−e}c= #Pandc= #Q, then #P= #Q. So, by Hume's Principle,P≈Q. So, by the Equinumerosity Lemma, it follows thatP^{−d}≈Q^{−e}. If so, then by Hume's Principle, #P^{−d}= #Q^{−e}. But then,a=b.

It is important to mention here that not only is Predecessor a one-to-one relation, it is also a function:

This fact can be proved with the help of a kind of converse to the Equinumerosity Lemma:Predecessor is a Function:

∀x∀y∀z[Precedes(x,y) &Precedes(x,z) →y=z]

We leave the proof of the Equinumerosity Lemma ‘Converse’ and the proof that Predecessor is a function as exercises for the reader. The fact that Predecessor is a function will play a part in the proof that every number has a successor.Equinumerosity Lemma ‘Converse’:

F^{−x}≈G^{−y}&Fx&Gy→F≈G

### 5.4 The Principle of Mathematical Induction

Let us say that a concept*F*is

*hereditary on the natural numbers*just in case every ‘adjacent’ pair of numbers

*n*and

*m*(

*n*preceding

*m*) is such that

*m*falls under

*F*whenever

*n*falls under

*F*, i.e.,

Then we may state the Principle of Mathematical Induction as follows: if (a) 0 falls underHerOn(F,N) =_{abbr}∀n∀m[Precedes(n,m) → (Fn→Fm)]

*F*and (b)

*F*is hereditary on the natural numbers, then every natural number falls under

*F*. In formal terms:

Frege actually proves the Principle of Mathematical Induction from a more general principle that governs anyTheorem 4:Principle of Mathematical Induction:

F0 &HerOn(F,N) → ∀n Fn

*R*-series whatsoever. We will call the latter the General Principle of Induction. It asserts that whenever

*a*falls under

*F*, and

*F*is hereditary on the

*R*-series beginning with

*a*, then every member of that

*R*-series falls under

*F*. We can formalize the General Principle of Induction with the help of a more strict understanding of ‘hereditary on the

*R*-series beginning with

*a*’. Here is a definition:

In other words,HerOn(F,^{a}R^{+}) =_{abbr}∀x∀y[R^{+}(a,x) &R^{+}(a,y) &Rxy→ (Fx→Fy)]

*F*is hereditary on the members of the

*R*-series beginning with

*a*just in case every adjacent pair

*x*and

*y*in this series (with

*x*bearing

*R*to

*y*) is such that

*y*falls under

*F*whenever

*x*falls under

*F*. Now given this definition, we can reformulate the General Principle of Induction more strictly as:

This is a version of Frege's Theorem 152 inGeneral Principle of Induction:

[Fa&HerOn(F,^{a}R^{+})] → ∀x[R^{+}(a,x) →Fx]

**Gg I**, §117.

Frege's proves this claim by making an insightful appeal to his Rule
of Substitution. We may sketch the proof strategy as follows. Assume
that the antecedent of the General Principle of Induction holds for an
arbitrarily chosen concept, say *P*. That is, assume:

Now to show ∀Pa&HerOn(P,^{a}R^{+})

*x*(

*R*

^{+}(

*a*,

*x*) →

*Px*), pick an arbitrary object, say

*b*, and further assume

*R*

^{+}(

*a*,

*b*). We then simply have to show

*Pb*. Frege does this by using the Rule of Substitution on Fact (7) about

*R*

^{+}(in our subsection on the Weak Ancestral in §4). Recall that Fact (7) is:

[This is a theorem of logic containing the free variablesFx&R^{+}(x,y) &Her(F,R)] →Fy

*x*,

*y*, and

*F*. Frege instantiates

*x*and

*y*to

*a*and

*b*, respectively. He then, as we might put it, instantiates

*F*to the concept [λ

*z*

*R*

^{+}(

*a*,

*z*) &

*Pz*] and applies λ-Conversion. (This is where Frege used his Rule of Substitution.) The concept being instantiated for

*F*is the concept

*member of the R-series beginning with a and which falls under P*. The result of instantiating the free variables in Fact (7) and then applying λ-Conversion yields a rather long conditional, with numerous conjuncts in the antecedent and the claim that

*Pb*in the consequent. Thus, if the antecedent can be established, the proof is done. However, for those following along with pencil and paper, all of the conjuncts to this conditional are things we already know, with the exception of the claim that [λ

*z*

*R*

^{+}(

*a*,

*z*) &

*Pz*] is hereditary on

*R*. However, this claim can be established straightforwardly from things we know to be true (and, in particular, from facts contained in the antecedent of the Principle we are trying to prove, which we assumed as part of our conditional proof). The reader is encouraged to complete the proof as an exercise. For those who would like to check their work, we give the complete Proof of the General Principle of Induction here.

Proof of the General Principle of Induction

Now to derive Principle of Mathematical Induction from the General
Principle of Induction, we formulate the instance of the latter in
which *a* is 0 and *R* is *Precedes*:

[When we expand the defined notation forF0 &HerOn(F,^{0}Precedes^{+})] → ∀x[Precedes^{+}(0,x) →Fx]

*HerOn*, substitute the notation

*N*

*x*and

*N*

*y*for

*Precedes*

^{+}(0,

*x*) and

*Precedes*

^{+}(0,

*y*), respectively, and then employ our restricted quantifiers ∀

*n*(…

*n*…) and ∀

*m*(…

*m*…) for the claims of the form ∀

*y*(

*N*

*y*→ …

*y*…) and ∀

*x*(

*N*

*x*→ …

*x*…), respectively, the result is the Principle of Mathematical Induction (in which the notation

*HerOn*(

*F*,

*N*) has been eliminated in terms of its definiens).

### 5.5 Every Number Has a Successor

Frege uses the Principle of Mathematical Induction to prove that every number has a successor in the natural numbers. We may formulate the theorem as follows:To understand Frege's strategy for proving this theorem, recall that the weak ancestral of the Predecessor relation, i.e.,Theorem 5:

∀x[Nx→ ∃y(Ny&Precedes(x,y))]

*Precedes*

^{+}(

*x*,

*y*), can be read as:

*x*is a member of the predecessor-series ending with

*y*. Frege then considers the concept

*member of the predecessor-series ending with n*, i.e., [λ

*z*

*Precedes*

^{+}(

*z*,

*n*)], where

*n*is a natural number. Frege then shows, by induction, that every natural number

*n*precedes the number of the concept

*member of the predecessor-series ending with n*. That is, Frege proves that every number has a successor by proving the following Lemma on Successors by induction:

This asserts that every numberLemma on Successors:

∀nPrecedes(n, #[λzPrecedes^{+}(z,n)])

*n*precedes the number of numbers in the predecessor series ending with

*n*. Frege can establish Theorem 5 by proving the Lemma on Successors and by showing that the successor of a natural number is itself a natural number.

To see an intuitive picture of why the Lemma on Successors gives us
what we want, we may temporarily regard Precedes^{+} as the
relation ≤. (One can prove that Precedes^{+} has the
properties that ≤ has on the natural numbers.) Although we haven't
yet defined the natural numbers following 0, the following intuitive
sequence is driving Frege's strategy:

0 precedes #[λFor example, the third member of this sequence is true because there are 3 natural numbers (0, 1, and 2) that are less than or equal to 2; so the number 2 precedes the number of numbers less than or equal to 2. Frege's strategy is to show that the general claim, thatzz≤ 0]

1 precedes #[λzz≤ 1]

2 precedes #[λzz≤ 2]

etc.

*n*precedes the number of numbers less than or equal to

*n*, holds for every natural number. So, given this intuitive understanding of the Lemma on Successors, Frege has a good strategy for proving that every number has a successor. (For the remainder of this subsection, the reader may wish to continue to think of Precedes

^{+}in terms of ≤.)

Now to prove the Lemma on Successors by induction, we need to
reconfigure this Lemma to a form which can be used as the consequent of
the Principle of Induction; i.e., we need something of the form
∀*n Fn*. We can get the Lemma on Successors into this
form by ‘abstracting out’ a concept from the Lemma using
the right-to-left direction of λ-Conversion to produce the
following equivalent statement of the Lemma:

∀The concept ‘abstracted out’ is the following:n[λyPrecedes(y, #[λzPrecedes^{+}(z,y)])]n

[λThis is the concept:yPrecedes(y, #[λzPrecedes^{+}(z,y)])]

*being an object y which precedes the number of the concept: member of the predecessor series ending in y*. Let us abbreviate the λ-expression that denotes this concept as ‘

*Q*’. Then Frege's strategy is to instantiate the variable

*F*in the Principle of Induction (using his Rule of Substitution) to

*Q*. The result is therefore something that we may take as having been proved:

Since the consequent is the Lemma on Successors, Frege can prove this Lemma by proving both that 0 falls underQ0 &HerOn(Q,N) → ∀n Qn

*Q*(cf.

**Gg I**, Theorem 154) and that

*Q*is hereditary on the natural numbers (cf.

**Gg I**, Theorem 150):

Proof that 0 falls underGiven this proof of the Lemma on Successors, Theorem 5 is not far away. The Lemma on Successors shows that every number precedes some cardinal number of the formQ

*#F*. We still have to show that such successor cardinals are natural numbers. That is, it still remains to be shown that if a number

*n*precedes something

*y*, then

*y*is a natural number:

Theorem 5 now follows from the Lemma on Successors and the fact that successors of natural numbers are natural numbers. With the proof of Theorem 5, we have completed the proof of Frege's Theorem. Before we turn to the last section of this entry, it is worth mentioning the mathematical significance of this theorem.Successors of Natural Numbers are Natural Numbers:

∀n∀y(Precedes(n,y) →Ny)

Proof: Suppose thatPrecedes(n,a). Then, by definition, sincenis a natural number,Precedes^{+}(0,n). So by Fact (3) aboutR^{+}(in the subsection on the Weak Ancestral in §4), it follows thatPrecedes*(0,a), and so by the definition ofPrecedes^{+}, it follows thatPrecedes^{+}(0,a); i.e.,ais a natural number.

### 5.6 Arithmetic

From Frege's Theorem, one can derive arithmetic. It is an immediate consequence of the functionality of Predecessor that every number has a unique successor. That means we can define the successor function:We may then define the sequence of natural numbers succeeding 0 as follows:n′ =_{df}thexsuch thatPrecedes(n,x)

1 = 0′Moreover, the recursive definition of addition can now be given:

2 = 1′

3 = 2′

etc.

We may also officially define:n+ 0 =n

n+m′ = (n+m)′

These definitions constitute the foundations of arithmetic. Frege has insightfully isolated a group of basic laws in which they may be grounded. (Readers interested in how these results are affected when Hume's Principle is combined withn<m=_{df}Precedes*(n,m)

n≤m=_{df}Precedes^{+}(n,m)

*predicative*second-order logic should consult Linnebo (2004).)

## 6. Philosophical Questions Surrounding Frege's Theorem

Frege's Theorem is an elegant derivation of the basic laws of arithmetic which can be carried out independently of the portion of Frege's system which led to inconsistency. Frege himself never identified "Frege's Theorem" as a "result". In**Gg**, he attempted to derive Hume's Principle and the Dedekind-Peano axioms from Basic Law V, but once the contradiction became known to him, he never officially retreated to the ‘fall-back’ position of claiming that the proof of the Dedekind-Peano axioms from Hume's Principle alone constituted an important result. One of several reasons why he didn't adopt this fall-back position is that he didn't regard Hume's Principle as a sufficiently general principle — he didn't believe it was strong enough, from an epistemological point of view, to help us answer the question, "How are numbers given to us?". We discuss the reasons for his attitude, among other things, in what follows.

A discussion of the philosophical questions surrounding Frege's
Theorem should begin with some statement of how Frege conceived of his
own project when writing **Begr**, **Gl**,
and **Gg**. It seems clear that epistemological
considerations in part motivated Frege's work on the foundations of
mathematics. It is well documented that Frege had the following goal,
namely, to explain our knowledge of the basic laws of arithmetic by
giving an answer to the question "How are numbers ‘given’
to us?" which makes no appeal to the faculty of intuition. If Frege
could show that the basic laws of number theory are derivable from
analytic truths of logic, then he could argue that we need only appeal
to the faculty of understanding (as opposed to some faculty of
intuition) to explain our knowledge of the truths of arithmetic.
Frege's goal then stands in contrast to the Kantian view of the exact
mathematical sciences, according to which general principles of
reasoning must be supplemented by a faculty of intuition if we are to
achieve mathematical knowledge. The Kantian model here is that of
geometry; Kant thought that our intuitions of figures and constructions
played an essential role in the demonstrations of geometrical theorems.
(In Frege's own time, the achievements of Frege's contemporaries Pasch,
Pieri and Hilbert showed that such intuitions were not essential.)

### 6.1 Frege's Goals and Strategy in His Own Words

Frege's strategy then was to show that no appeal to intuition is required for the derivation of the theorems of number theory. This in turn required that he show that the latter are derivable using only rules of inference, axioms, and definitions that are purely analytic principles of logic. This view has become known as ‘Logicism’. Here is what Frege says:[Begr, Preface, p. 5:]

To prevent anything intuitive from penetrating here unnoticed, I had to bend every effort to keep the chain of inferences free of gaps.

[from the Bauer-Mengelberg translation in van Heijenoort (1967)]

[Begr, Part III, §23:]

Through the present example, moreover, we see how pure thought, irrespective of any content given by the senses or even by an intuitiona priori, can, solely from the content that results from its own constitution, bring forth judgements that at first sight appear to be possible only on the basis of some intuition. … The propositions about sequences [R-series] in what follows far surpass in generality all those that can be derived from any intuition of sequences.

[from the Bauer-Mengelberg translation in van Heijenoort (1967)]

[Gl, §62:]

How, then, are numbers to be given to us, if we cannot have any ideas or intuitions of them? Since it is only in the context of a proposition that words have any meaning, our problem becomes this: To define the sense of a proposition in which a number word occurs.

[from the Austin translation in Frege (1974)]

[Gl, §87:]

I hope I may claim in the present work to have made it probable that the laws of arithmetic are analytic judgements and consequently a priori. Arithmetic thus becomes simply a development of logic, and every proposition of arithmetic a law of logic, albeit a derivative one.

[from the Austin translation in Frege (1974)]

[Gg I, §0:]

In myGrundlagen der Arithmetik, I sought to make it plausible that arithmetic is a branch of logic and need not borrow any ground of proof whatever from either experience or intuition. In the present book, this shall be confirmed, by the derivation of the simplest laws of Numbers by logical means alone.

[from the Furth translation in Frege (1967)]

[Gg II, Appendix:]

The prime problem of arithmetic is the question, In what way are we to conceive logical objects, in particular, numbers? By what means are we justified in recognizing numbers as objects? Even if this problem is not solved to the degree I thought it was when I wrote this volume, still I do not doubt that the way to the solution has been found.

[from the Furth translation in Frege (1967)]

### 6.2 The Basic Problem for Frege's Strategy

The basic problem for Frege's strategy, however, is that for his logicist project to succeed, his system must at some point include (either as an axiom or theorem) statements that explicitly assert the existence of certain kinds of abstract entities and it is not obvious how to justify the claim that we know such explicit existential statements. Given our description of his system, it should be clear that Frege's logical system includes existence claims for the following entities:- concepts (more generally, functions)
- extensions (more generally, courses-of-value or value-ranges)
- truth-values
- numbers

### 6.3 The Existence of Concepts

Boolos (1985) was the first to note that the Rule of Substitution causes a problem of this kind for Frege's program, since it is equivalent to a quite liberal existential claim, namely, the Comprehension Principle for Concepts. Boolos suggests a defense for Frege with respect to this particular aspect of his logic, namely, to reinterpret (by paraphrasing) the second-order quantifiers so as to avoid commitment to concepts. (See Boolos (1985) for the details.) Boolos's suggestion, however, is one which would require Frege to abandon his realist theory of concepts. Moreover, although Boolos' suggestion might lead us to an epistemological justification of the Comprehension Principle for Concepts, it doesn't do the same for the Comprehension Principle for Relations, for his reinterpretation of the quantifiers works only for the ‘monadic’ quantifiers (i.e., those ranging over concepts having one argument) and thus doesn't offer a paraphrase for quantification over relational concepts.Another problem for a strategy of the type suggested by Boolos is that if the second-order quantifiers are interpreted so that they do not range over a separate domain of entities, then there is nothing appropriate to serve as the denotations of λ-expressions. Although Frege wouldn't quite put it this way, we have seen that his system treats open formulas with free object variables as if they denoted concepts. Although Frege doesn't use λ-notation, the use of such notation seems to be the most logically perspicuous way of reconstructing his work. The use of such notation faces the same epistemological puzzles that Frege's Rule of Substitution faces.

To see why, note that the Principle of λ-Conversion:

∀seems to be an analytic truth of logic. It says this:y([λxφ(x)]y≡ φ(y/x))

An objectOne might argue that this is true in virtue of the very meaning of the λ-expression, the meaning of ≡, and the meaning of the statement formyexemplifies the complex propertybeing an x such thatφ(x) if and only ifyis anxsuch that φ

*Fx*. However, λ-Conversion also implies the Comprehension Principle for Concepts, for the latter follows from the former by existential generalization:

∃The point here is that the fact that an existential claim is derivable casts at least some doubt on the purely analytic status of λ-Conversion. The question of how we obtain knowledge of such principles is still an open question in philosophy. It is an important question to address, since Frege's most insightful definitions are cast using quantifiers ranging over concepts and relations (e.g., the ancestrals of a relation) and it would be useful to have a philosophical explanation of how such entities and the principles which govern them become known to us. In contemporary philosophy, this question is still poignant, since many philosophers do accept thatF∀y(Fy≡ φ(y/x))

*properties*and

*relations*of various sorts exist. These entities are the contemporary analogues of Frege's concepts.

### 6.4 The Existence of Extensions

We have also seen (§2) that the Corollary to Basic Law V implies the existence of extensions. The question for Frege's project, then, is why should we accept as a law of logic a statement that implies the existence of individuals? Frege did conceive of Basic Law V as a law of logic:[Moreover, he thought that an appeal to extensions would answer one of the questions that motivated his work:Gg I, Preface, p. 3:]

A dispute can arise, so far as I can see, only with regard to my Basic Law concerning courses-of-values (V)… I hold that it is a law of pure logic.

[from the Furth translation in Frege (1967)]

[Now it is unclear why Frege thought that he could answer the question posed here with the reply "We apprehend numbers as extensions of concepts". He seems to think we can answer the obvious next question "How do we apprehend extensions?" by saying "by way of Basic Law V". His idea here seems to be that since Basic Law V is supposed to be purely analytic or true in virtue of the meanings of its terms, we apprehend a pair of extensions whenever we truly judge that conceptsLetter to Russell, July 28, 1902:]

I myself was long reluctant to recognize ranges of values and hence classes [sets]; but I saw no other possibility of placing arithmetic on a logical foundation. But the question is, How do we apprehend logical objects? And I have found no other answer to it than this, We apprehend them as extensions of concepts, or more generally, as ranges of values of functions.

[from the Kaal translation in Frege (1980)]

*F*and

*G*are materially equivalent. Some philosophers argue that Frege would have been correct to argue in just this way (had Basic Law V been consistent). They argue that Basic Law V (or consistent principles having the same logical form) justifies

*reference*to the entities described in the left-side condition by grounding such reference in the

*truth*of the right-side condition.

^{[12]}

But this, of course, raises an obvious problem. To justify reference
to extensions, we must first justify the claim that those extensions
exist. It is not clear that the claim that concepts are materially
equivalent can justify such an existence claim. But given Frege's view
that Basic Law V is analytic, it seems that he must hold that the
right-side condition implies the corresponding left-side condition as a
matter of
meaning.^{[13]}

This view, however, runs up against the following argument. Suppose the right hand condition implies the left-side condition as a matter of meaning. That is, suppose that (R) implies (L) as a matter of meaning:

(R) ∀Now note that (L) itself can be analyzed, from a logical point of view. The expression ‘ εx(Fx≡Gx)(L) ε

F= εG

*F*’ is a definite description (‘the extension of

*F*’) and so, using Russell's theory of descriptions, (L) can be logically analyzed as the claim:

There is an objectThat is, for some defined or primitive notionxand an objectysuch that:

(1)xis a unique extension ofF,

(2)yis a unique extension ofG, and

(3)x=y.

*Extension*(

*x*,

*F*) (‘

*x*is an extension of

*F*’), (L) implies the analysis (D) as a matter of meaning:

(D) ∃But if (R) implies (L) as a matter of meaning, and (L) implies (D) as a matter of meaning, then (R) implies (D) as a matter of meaning. This seems doubtful. The material equivalence ofx∃y[Extension(x,F) & ∀z(Extension(z,F) →z=x) &

Extension(y,G) & ∀z(Extension(z,G) →z=y) &

x=y]

*F*and

*G*does not imply the existence claim (D) as a matter of meaning, whatever notion of meaning is involved. [This argument attempts to show why Va (i.e., the right-to-left direction of Basic Law V) is not analytic. Below, it will be adapted to show that the right-to-left direction of Hume's Principle is not analytic. See Boolos (1997, 307 - 309), for reasons why Vb and the left-to-right direction of Hume's Principle are not analytic.]

The moral to be drawn here is that the modern Fregean must attempt
to explain our knowledge of existence claims for abstract objects such
as extensions *head on*, and not try to justify them indirectly,
by attempting to justify claims that imply such existence claims. Even
if we follow Frege in conceiving of extensions as ‘logical
objects’, the question remains as to how the very claims that
such objects exist can be true on logical or analytic grounds alone. We
might agree that there must be logical objects of some sort if logic is
to have a subject matter, but if Frege is to achieve his goal of
showing that our knowledge of arithmetic is free of intuition, then the
logical knowledge with which he identifies arithmetical knowledge must
be either be *purely* analytic or shown otherwise to be free of
intuition. We'll return to this theme in the final subsection.

### 6.5 The Existence of Numbers and Truth-Values: The Julius Caesar Problem

Given that the proof of Frege's Theorem makes no appeal to Basic Law V, some philosophers have argued Frege's best strategy for achieving his goal is to replace Basic Law V with Hume's Principle and argue that Hume's Principle is an analytic principle of logic.^{[14]}However, we have just seen one reason why such a strategy does not suffice. The claim that Hume's Principle is an analytic principle of logic is subject to the same problem just posed for Basic Law V. The equinumerosity of

*F*and

*G*does not, as a matter of meaning, imply (identity claims that entail) the existence of numbers. When we analyze "#

*F*= #

*G*" in the same way that we analyzed "ε

*F*= ε

*G*" (i.e., by analyzing away the operator # or definite description "the number of

*F*s" in terms of existence and uniqueness claims), it becomes clear that the equinumerosity of

*F*and

*G*does not, as a matter of meaning, imply the result of the analysis.

Moreover, Frege had his own reasons for not replacing Basic Law V
with Hume's Principle. One reason was that he thought Hume's Principle
offered no answer to the epistemological question, ‘How do we
grasp or apprehend logical objects, such as the numbers?’. But
Frege had another reason for not substituting Hume's Principle for
Basic Law V, namely, that Hume's Principle would be subject to
‘the Julius Caesar problem’. Frege first raises this
problem in connection with an inductive definition of ‘*n*
= #*F*’ that he tries out in **Gl**,
§55. Concerning this definition, Frege says:

[Frege raises this same concern again for a contextual definition that gives a ‘criterion of identity’ for the objects being defined. InGl, §55:]

… but we can never — to take a crude example — decide by means of our definitions whether any concept has the number Julius Caesar belonging to it, or whether that conqueror of Gaul is a number or is not.

[from the Austin translation in Frege (1974)]

**Gl**§66, Frege considers the following contextual definition of ‘the direction of line

*x*’:

The direction of lineWith regard to this definition, Frege says:a= the direction of linebif and only ifais parallel tob.

[Now trouble for Hume's Principle begins to arise when we recognize that it is a contextual definition that has the same logical form as this definition for directions. It is central to Frege's view that the numbers areGl, §66:]

It will not, for instance, decide for us whether England is the same as the direction of the Earth's axis— if I may be forgiven an example which looks nonsensical. Naturally no one is going to confuse England with the direction of the Earth's axis; but that is no thanks to our definition of direction.

[from the Austin translation in Frege (1974)]

*objects*, and so he believes that it is incumbent upon him to say

*which*objects they are. But the ‘Julius Caesar problem’ is that Hume's Principle, if considered as the sole principle offering identity conditions for numbers, doesn't describe the conditions under which an arbitrary object, say Julius Caesar, is or is not to be identified with the number of planets. That is, Hume's Principle doesn't define the condition ‘#

*F*=

*x*’, for arbitrary

*x*. It only offers identity conditions when

*x*is an object we know to be a cardinal number (for then

*x*=#

*G*, for some

*G*, and Hume's Principle tells us when #

*F*=#

*G*).

In **Gl**, Frege solves the problem by giving his
explicit definition of numbers in terms of extensions. (We described
this in §4 above.) Unfortunately, this is only a stopgap measure,
for when Frege later systematizes extensions in **Gg**,
Basic Law V has the same logical form as Hume's Principle and the above
contextual definition of directions. Frege is aware that the Julius
Caesar problem affects Basic Law V, though. In **Gg I**,
§10, Frege appears to raise the Julius Caesar problem for
extensions of concepts. With respect to Basic Law V, he says
(remembering that for Frege, ε binds object variables and not
concept variables):

[In other words, Basic Law V does not tell us the conditions under which an arbitrarily chosen objectGg I, §10:]

…this by no means fixes completely the denotation of a name like ‘ἐΦ(ε)’. We have only a means of always recognizing a course-of-values if it is designated by a name like ‘ἐΦ(ε)’, by which it is already recognizable as a course-of-values. But, we can neither decide, so far, whether an object is a course-of-values that is not given us as such …

[from the Furth translation in Frege (1967)]

*x*may be identified with some given extension, such as ε

*F*.

Until recently, it was thought that Frege solved this problem in
§10 by restricting the universal quantifier ∀*x* of
his **Gg** system so that it ranges only over extensions.
If Frege could have successfully restricted this quantifier to
extensions, then when the question arises, is (arbitrarily chosen)
object *x* is identical with ε*F*, one could
answer that *x* has to be the extension of some concept, say
*G* and that Basic Law V would then tell you the conditions
under which *x* is identical to ε*F*. On this
interpretation of §10, Frege is alleged to have restricted the
quantifiers when he identified the two truth values (The True and The
False) with the two extensions that contain just these objects as
members, respectively. By doing this, it was thought that all of the
objects in the range of his quantifier ∀*x* in
**Gg** become extensions which have been identified as
such, for the truth values were the only two objects of his system that
had not been introduced as extensions or courses of value.

However, recent work by Wehmeier (1999) suggests that, in §10,
Frege was not attempting to restrict the quantifiers of his system to
extensions (nor, more generally, to courses-of-values). The extensive
footnote to §10 indicates that Frege considered, but did not hold
much hope of, identifying every object in the domain with the extension
consisting of just that
object.^{[15]}
But, more importantly, Frege later considers cases (in
**Gg**, Sections 34 and 35) which seem to presuppose that
the domain contains objects which aren't extensions. (In these
sections, Frege considers what happens to the definition of
‘*x* is a member of *y*’ when *y* is
not an
extension.)^{[16]}

Even if Frege somehow could have successfully restricted the
quantifiers of **Gg** to avoid the Julius Caesar problem,
he would no longer have been able to extend his system to include names
of ordinary non-logical objects. For if he were to attempt to do so,
the question, "Under what conditions is ε*F* identical
with Julius Caesar?", would then be legitimate but have no answer. That
means his logical system could not be used for the analysis of ordinary
language. But it was just the analysis of ordinary language that led
Frege to his insight that a statement of number is an assertion about a
concept.

### 6.6 Final Observations

Even when we replace the inconsistent Basic Law V with the powerful Hume's Principle, Frege's work still leaves two questions unanswered: (1) How do we know that numbers exist?, and (2) How do we precisely specify which objects they are? The first question arises because Hume's Principle doesn't seem to be a purely analytic truth of logic; by what faculty do we come to know (the truth of) the existential claim that numbers exist if neither Hume's Principle nor this existential claim is analytically true? The second question arises because Frege's work offers no general condition under which we can identify an arbitrarily chosen object*x*with a given number such as the number of planets; how then can Frege claim to have precisely specified which objects the numbers are within the domain of all logical and non-logical objects? So questions about the very existence and identity of numbers still plague Frege's work.

These two questions arise because of a limitation in the logical
form of these Fregean biconditional principles such as Hume's Principle
and Basic Law V. These contextual definitions attempt to do two jobs
which modern logicians now typically accomplish with separate
principles. A properly reformulated theory of ‘logical’
objects should have: (1) a separate *non-logical* comprehension
principle which explicitly asserts the existence of *logical
objects*, and (2) a separate identity principle which asserts the
conditions under which *logical objects* are identical. The
latter should specify identity conditions for logical objects in terms
of their most salient characteristic, one which distinguishes them from
other objects. Such an identity principle would then be more specific
than the global identity principle for all objects (Leibniz's Law)
which asserts that if objects *x* and *y* fall under the
same concepts, they are identical.

By way of example, consider modern set theory. Zermelo set theory
(Z) has a distinctive *non-logical* comprehension principle for
sets:

Z has a separate identity principle:Subset Axiom of Z:

∀x[Set(x) → ∃y[Set(y) & ∀z(z∈y≡z∈x& φ(z))]],

where φ(z) is any formula in which the variablezis free and which has no free variablesy

Note that the second principle offers identity conditions in terms of the most salient features of sets, namely, the fact that they, unlike other objects, have members. The identity conditions for objects whichIdentity Principle for Sets:

Set(x) &Set(y) → [∀z(z∈x≡z∈y) →x=y]

*aren't*sets, then, can be the standard principle that identifies objects whenever they fall under the same concepts. This leads us naturally to a very general principle of identity for any objects whatever:

Now, if something is given to usGeneral Principle of Identity:

x=y=_{df}[Set(x) &Set(y) & ∀z(z∈x≡z∈y)] v

[¬Set(x) & ¬Set(y) & ∀F(Fx≡Fy)]

*as a set*and we ask whether it is identical with an arbitrarily chosen object

*x*, this specifies a clear condition that settles the matter. The only questions that remain for the theory Z concern its existence principle: Do we know that the comprehension principle is true, and if so, how? The question of existence is thus laid bare. We do not approach it by attempting to justify a principle that implies the existence of sets via definite descriptions which we don't yet know to be well-defined.

In his classic essays (1987) and (1986), Boolos appears to recommend
this very procedure of using separate existence and identity
principles. In those essays, he eschews the primitive mathematical
relation of set membership and suggests that Frege formulate his theory
of numbers (‘Frege Arithmetic’) by using a single
*nonlogical* comprehension axiom which employs a special
instantiation relation that holds between a concept *G* and an
object *x* whenever, intuitively, *x* is an extension
consisting solely of concepts and *G* is a concept
‘in’ *x*. He calls this nonlogical axiom
‘Numbers’ and uses the notation
‘*G*η*x*’ to signify that *G* is
in *x*:

[See Boolos (1987), p. 5; and (1986), p. 140.] This principle asserts that for any conceptNumbers:

∀F∃!x∀G(Gηx≡G≈F)

*F*, there is a unique object which contains in it all and only those concepts

*G*which are equinumerous to

*F*. Boolos then makes two observations: (1) that Frege can then define #

*F*as "the unique object

*x*such that for all concepts

*G*,

*G*is in

*x*iff

*G*is equinumerous to

*F*", and (2) that Hume's Principle is derivable from Numbers. [See Boolos (1986), p. 140.] Given these observations, we know from our work in §§4 and 5 above that Numbers suffices for the derivation of the basic laws of arithmetic.

Since Boolos calls this principle ‘Numbers’, it is no
stretch to suppose that he would accept the following explicit
reformulation (in which ‘*Number*(*x*)’ is an
undefined, primitive notion):

Though Boolos doesn't explicitly formulate an identity principle to complement Numbers, it seems clear that the following principle would offer identity conditions in terms of the most distinctive feature of numbers:Numbers:

∀F∃!x[Number(x) & ∀G(Gηx≡G≈F)]

It is then straightforward to formulate a general principle of identity, as we did in the case of the set theory Z:Identity Principle for Numbers:

Number(x) &Number(y) → [∀G(Gηx≡Gηy) →x=y]

This formulation of Frege Arithmetic, in terms of Numbers and the General Principle of Identity, puts the Julius Caesar problem (described above) into better perspective; the condition ‘#General Principle of Identity:

x=y=_{df}[Number(x) &Number(y) & ∀F(Fηx≡Fηy)] v

[¬Number(x) & ¬Number(y) & ∀F(Fx≡Fy)]

*F*=

*x*’ is defined for arbitrary concepts

*F*and objects

*x*. It openly faces the epistemological questions head-on: Do we know that Numbers is true, and if so, how? This is where philosophers need to concentrate their energies. [For a reconstruction of Frege Arithmetic with a more general version of the special instantiation relation η, see Zalta (1999).]

By replacing Fregean biconditionals such as Hume's Principle with explicit existence and identity principles, we reduce two problems to one and and isolate the real problem for Fregean foundations of arithmetic, namely, the problem of giving an epistemological justification of existence claims (e.g., Numbers) for abstract objects of a certain kind. For anything like Frege's program to succeed, it must at some point explicitly assert (as an axiom or theorem) the existence of (logical) objects of some kind. Those explicit existence claims should be the focus of attention, for they are the point at which logic and metaphysics dovetail. The theory of logical objects, if carried out without any mathematical primitives, should simply be acknowledged as a nonlogical metaphysical theory, not a piece of logic. A proper epistemology for such a theory should offer some epistemological justification of the explicit existence claims that serve as the basic axioms of the theory. That is the moral to be drawn from Frege's work.

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## Other Internet Resources

- Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, original German text (maintained by Alain Blachair, Académie de Nancy-Metz)
- Begriffsschrift in LaTeX, documentation for installing and using begriff.sty, a LaTeX package for typesetting Frege's concept script in LaTeX.

## Related Entries

Frege, Gottlob |*Principia Mathematica*| Russell, Bertrand | Russell's paradox

### Acknowledgments

I was motivated to write the present entry after reading an early
draft of an essay by William Demopoulos. (The draft was eventually
published as Demopoulos and Clark 2005.) Demopoulos kindly allowed me
to quote certain passages from that early draft in the footnotes to
the present entry. I am also indebted to Roberto Torretti, who
carefully read this piece and identified numerous infelicities; to
Franz Fritsche, who noticed a quantifier transposition error in Fact 2
about the strong ancestral, to Seyed N. Mousavian, who noticed some
typographical errors in some formulas; to Xu Mingming, who noticed
that Fact 8 about the Weak Ancestral (Section 4, subsection "The Weak
Ancestral of *R*") was missing an important condition (namely,
that *R* must be 1-1); and to Paul Pietroski, who noticed an
infelicity in the first statement of the principle of induction in
Section 4. Finally, I am indebted to Kai Wehmeier, who reminded me
that, strictly speaking, the result of replacing Basic Law V by Hume's
Principle in Frege's system does not result in a subsystem of the
original until we replace the primitive notion "the course of values
of the function ƒ" with the primitive notion "the number of
*F*s".