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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Giovanni Battista Vico was born in Naples, Italy, June 23 1688, to a bookseller and daughter of a carriage maker. He received his formal education at local grammar schools, from various Jesuit tutors, and at the University of Naples from which he graduated in 1694 as Doctor of Civil and Canon Law. As he reports in his autobiography (Vita di Giambattista Vico), however, Vico considered himself as "teacher of himself," a habit he developed under the direction of his father, after a fall at the age of 7 caused a three year absence from school. Vico reports that "as a result of this mischance he grew up with a melancholy and irritable temperament such as belongs to men of ingenuity and depth" (Vita, 111). Vico left Naples in 1686 for Vitolla where, with occasional returns to his home city, he remained for the next nine years as tutor to the sons of Domenica Rocca. Vico returned to Rome in 1695 and four years later married Teresa Caterina Destito with whom he had eight children, three of whom died. With the exception of his favorite and younger son, Gennaro, his surviving children were a source of great disappointment to him. Vico lived in great poverty and suffered bouts of ill-health, and failed in his life-long ambition of succeeding to the chair of Jurisprudence at the University of Naples, having to settle instead for a lower and poorly paid professorship in Rhetoric. He retained this position until 1741 at which time he was succeeded by his son Gennaro. Vico died in Naples on January 22-23, 1744, aged 76.
In his own time Vico's work was largely neglected and generally misunderstood-he describes himself living as a "stranger" and "quite unknown" in his native city (Vita, 134)-and it was not until the nineteenth century that his thought began to make a significant impression on the philosophical world. However, Vico's thought never suffered from complete obscurity and its influence can be discerned in various traditions of European thought from the mid-eighteenth century onwards. In Italy, Vico's impact on aesthetic and literary criticism is evident in the writings of Francesco De Sanctis and Benedetto Croce, and in jurisprudence, economics, and political theory, his influence can be traced from Antonio Genovesi (one of Vico's own pupils), Ferdinando Galiani, and Gaetano Filangieri. In Germany, Vico's ideas were known to Johann-George Hamman and, via his disciple J.G. von Herder, to Johann Wolfgang von Goethe and Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi. Vico's ideas were sufficiently familiar to Friedrich August Wolf to inspire his article "G.B. Vico on Homer." In France, Vico's thought was likely known to Charles de Secondat, baron de Montesquieu, and Jean-Jacques Rousseau, and some have seen his influence in the writings of Denis Diderot, Etienne Bonnot, abbé de Condillac, and Joseph Marie, comte de Maistre. In Great Britain, although Vichean themes are intimated in the philosophical writings of the Empiricists and thinkers of the Scottish Enlightenment, there is no direct evidence that they knew of his writings. The earliest known disseminator of Vico's views in the English-speaking world is Samuel Taylor Coleridge, who was responsible for much of the interest in Vico in the second half of the nineteenth century.
Vico's ideas reached a wider audience with a German translation of
The New Science by W.E. Weber which appeared in 1822, and,
more significantly, through a French version by Jules Michelet in 1824
which was reissued in 1835. Michelet's translation was widely read and
was responsible for a new appreciation of Vico's work in France.
Subsequently, Vico's views impacted the work of Wilhelm Dilthey, Karl
Marx, R.G. Collingwood, and James Joyce, who used The New
Science to structure Finnegans Wake. Twentieth century
scholarship has established illuminating comparisons with the
tradition of Hegelian idealism, and taken up the relationship between
Vico's thought and that of philosophers in the western tradition and
beyond, including Plato, Aristotle, Ibn Khaldun, Thomas Hobbes,
Benedict de Spinoza, David Hume, Immanuel Kant, and Friedrich
Nietzsche. Comparisons and connections have also been drawn between
Vichean themes and the work of various modern and contemporary
thinkers, inter alia W.B. Yeats, Friedrich Froebel, Max
Horkheimer, Walter Benjamin, Martin Heidegger, Hans-Georg Gadamer,
Jürgen Habermas, Paul Ricoeur, Jean-Francois Lyotard, and
Alisdair MacIntyre. As a review of recent and current literature
demonstrates, an appreciation of Vico's thought has spread far beyond
philosophy, and his ideas have been taken up by scholars within a
range of contemporary disciplines, including anthropology, cultural
theory, education, hermeneutics, history, literary criticism,
psychology, and sociology. Thus despite obscure beginnings, Vico is
now widely regarded as a highly original thinker who anticipated
central currents in later philosophy and the human sciences.
Although these early writings are increasingly studied as significant works in their right, they have generally been regarded as important for tracing the development of various themes and ideas which Vico came to refine and express fully in his major and influential work, The New Science. In De nostri temporis studiorum ratione, for example, Vico takes up the theme of modernity and raises the question of "which study method is finer or better, ours or the Ancients?" and illustrates "by examples the advantages and drawbacks of the respective methods." Vico observes that the Moderns are equipped with the "instruments" of "philosophical ‘critique’" and "analytic geometry" (especially in the form of Cartesian logic) (DN, 7-9), and that these open realms of natural scientific inquiry (chemistry, pharmacology, astronomy, geographical exploration, and mechanics) and artistic production (realism in poetry, oratory, and sculpture) which were unknown and unavailable to the Ancients (DN, 11-12). Although these bring significant benefits, Vico argues, modern education suffers unnecessarily from ignoring the ars topica (art of topics) which encourage the use of imagination and memory in organizing speech into eloquent persuasion. The result, Vico argues, is an undue attention to the "geometrical method" modeled on the discipline of physics (DN, 21ff.), and an emphasis on abstract philosophical criticism over poetry. This undermines the importance of exposition, persuasion, and pleasure in learning; it "benumbs...[the] imagination and stupefies...[the] memory" (DN, 42), both of which are central to learning, complex reasoning, and the discovery of truth. Combining the methods of both Ancients and Moderns, Vico argues that education should aim ideally at cultivating the "total life of the body politic" (DN, 36): students "should be taught the totality of the sciences and arts, and their intellectual powers should be developed to the full" so that they "would become exact in science, clever in practical matters, fluent in eloquence, imaginative in understanding poetry or painting, and strong in memorizing what they have learned in their legal studies" (DN, 19).
This defense of humanistic education is expanded in the Orations, directed "to the flower and stock of well-born young manhood," where Vico makes a case for modern humanistic education and focuses on a certain kind of "practical wisdom" or prudentia which the human mind, with the appropriate discipline and diligence, is able to attain. This theme is continued in De Antiquissima, where Vico traces the consequences of his insight that language can be treated as a source of historical knowledge. Many words of the Latin language, Vico observes, appear to be "derived from some inward learning rather than from the vernacular usage of the people." Treated as a repository of the past, Latin might be investigated as a way of "seek[ing] out the ancient wisdom of the Italians from the very wisdom of their words."(DA, 40).
In the course of pursuing this task, Vico also develops two central themes of his mature philosophy: the outlines of a philosophical system in contrast to the then dominant philosophy of Descartes already criticized in De nostri temporis studiorum ratione, and his statement of the principle that verum et factum convertuntur, that "the true and the made are...convertible," or that "the true is precisely what is made" (verum esse ipsum factum). Vico emphasizes that science should be conceived as the "genus or mode by which a thing is made" so that human science in general is a matter of dissecting the "anatomy of nature's works" (DA, 48), albeit through the "vice" of human beings that they are limited to "abstraction" as opposed to the power of "construction" which is found in God alone (DA, 50-52). Given that "the norm of the truth is to have made it" (DA, 52), Vico reasons, Descartes' famous first principle that clear and distinct ideas are the source of truth must be rejected: "For the mind does not make itself as it gets to know itself," Vico observes, "and since it does not make itself, it does not know the genus or mode by which it makes itself" (DA, 52). Thus the truths of morality, natural science, and mathematics do not require "metaphysical justification" as the Cartesians held, but demand an analysis of the causes-the "activity"-through which things are made (DA, 64).
Vico's Vita di Giambattista Vico is of particular interest,
not only as a source of insight into the influences on his
intellectual development, but as one of the earliest and most
sophisticated examples of philosophical autobiography. Vico composed
the work in response (and indeed the only response) to a proposal
published by Count Gian Artico di Porcía to Italian scholars to
write their biographies for the edification of students. Referring to
himself in the third person, Vico records the course of his life and
the influence of various thinkers which led him to developing the
concepts central to his mature work. Vico reports on the importance
of reading Plato, Aristotle, the Hellenics, Scotus, Suarez, and the
Classical poets, and traces his growing interest in jurisprudence and
the Latin language (Vita, 116ff. passim). Vico describes how he came
to "meditate a principle of the natural law, which should be apt for
the explanation of the origins of Roman law and every other gentile
civil law in respect of history" (Vita, 119) and how he discovered
that "an ideal eternal law...should be observed in a universal city
after the idea or design of providence" (Vita, 122). According to
Vico's own account, his studies culminated in a distinction between
ideas and languages. The first, he says, "discovers new historical
principles of geography and chronology, the two ideas of history, and
thence the principles of universal history lacking hitherto" (Vita,
167), while the latter "discovers new principles of poetry, both of
song and verse, and shows that both it and they sprang up by the same
natural necessity in all the first nations (Vita, 168). Taken
together, these form the central doctrine of The New Science,
namely, that there is a "philosophy and philology of the human race"
which produces "an ideal eternal history based on the idea
of...providence...[and] traversed in time by all the particular
histories of the nations, each with its rise, development, acme,
decline and fall" (Vita, 169).
The text consists of an overview ("Idea of the Work") couched as an explication of a frontispiece depicting a female figure (Metaphysics), standing on a globe of the Earth and contemplating a luminous triangle containing the eye of God, or Providence. Below stands a statue of Homer representing the origins of human society in "poetic wisdom." This is followed by five Books and a Conclusion, the first of which ("Establishment of Principles") establishes the method upon which Vico constructs in 1112 numbered paragraphs a history of civil society from its earliest beginnings in the state of nature (stato di naturo) to its contemporary manifestation in seventeenth century Europe.
In the work, Vico consciously develops his notion of scienza (science or knowledge) in opposition to the then dominant philosophy of Descartes with its emphasis on clear and distinct ideas, the most simple elements of thought from which all knowledge, the Cartesians held, could be derived a priori by way of deductive rules. As Vico had already argued, one consequence and drawback of this hypothetico-deductive method is that it renders phenomena which cannot be expressed logically or mathematically as illusions of one sort or another. This applies not only most obviously to the data of sense and psychological experience, but also to the non-quantifiable evidence that makes up the human sciences. Drawing on the verum factum principle first described in De Antiquissima, Vico argues against Cartesian philosophy that full knowledge of any thing involves discovering how it came to be what it is as a product of human action and the "principal property" of human beings, viz., "of being social" ("Idea of the Work," §2, p.3). The reduction of all facts to the ostensibly paradigmatic form of mathematical knowledge is a form of "conceit," Vico maintains, which arises from the fact that "man makes himself the measure of all things" (Element I, §120, p.60) and that "whenever men can form no idea of distant and unknown things, they judge them by what is familiar and at hand" (Element II, §122, p.60). Recognizing this limitation, Vico argues, is at once to grasp that phenomena can only be known via their origins, or per caussas (through causes). For "Doctrines must take their beginning from that of the matters of which they treat" (Element CVI, §314, p.92), he says, and it is one "great labor of...Science to recover...[the] grounds of truth-truth which, with the passage of years and the changes in language and customs, has come down to us enveloped in falsehood" (Element XVI, §150, pp.64-5). Unveiling this falsehood leads to "wisdom," which is "nothing but the science of making such use of things as their nature dictates" (Element CXIV, §326, p.94). Given that verum ipsum factum-"the true is the made," or something is true because it is made-scienzia both sets knowledge per caussas as its task and as the method for attaining it; or, expressed in other terms, the content of scienza is identical with the development of that scienza itself.
The challenge, however, is to develop this science in such a way as to understand the facts of the human world without either reducing them to mere contingency or explaining their order by way of speculative principles of the sort generated by traditional metaphysics. They must be rendered intelligible, that is, without reducing them, as did the Cartesians, to the status of ephemera. Vico satisfies this demand by distinguishing at the outset of The New Science between il vero and il certo, "the true" and "the certain." The former is the object of knowledge (scienzia) since it is universal and eternal, whereas the latter, related as it is to human consciousness (coscienza), is particular and individuated. This produces two pairs of terms-il vero/scienzia and il certo/coscienza-which constitute, in turn, the explananda of philosophy and philology ("history" broadly conceived), respectively. As Vico says, "philosophy contemplates reason, whence comes knowledge of the true; philology observes that of which human choice is author, whence comes consciousness of the certain" (Element X, §138, p.63). These two disciplines combine in a method or "new critical art" (nuova'arte critica) where philosophy aims at articulating the universal forms of intelligibility common to all experience, while philology adumbrates the empirical phenomena of the world which arise from human choice: the languages, customs, and actions of people which make up civil society. Understood as mutually exclusive disciplines-a tendency evident, according to Vico, in the history of philosophy up to his time-philosophy and philology appear as empty and abstract (as in the rational certainty of Cartesian metaphysics) and merely empirical and contingent, respectively. Once combined, however, they form a doctrine which yields a full knowledge of facts where "knowledge" in the Vichean sense means to have grasped both the necessity of human affairs (manifest in the causal connections between otherwise random events) and the contingency of the events which form the content of the causal chains. Philosophy yields the universally true and philology the individually certain.
The text of The New Science then constitutes Vico's attempt to develop a method which itself comes to be in the course of applying it to human experience, and this takes the form of a history of civil society and its development through the progress of war and peace, law, social order, commerce, and government. "Thus our Science," Vico says near the beginning of the work, "comes to be at once a history of the ideas, the customs, the deeds of mankind. From these three we shall derive the principles of the history of human nature, which we shall show to be the principles of universal history, which principles it seems hitherto to have lacked" ("Poetic Wisdom," §368, p.112). Accomplishing this task involves tracing human society back to its origins in order to reveal a common human nature and a genetic, universal pattern through which all nations run. Vico sees this common nature reflected in language, conceived as a store-house of customs, in which the wisdom of successive ages accumulates and is presupposed in the form of a sensus communis or "mental dictionary" by subsequent generations. Vico defines this common sense as "judgment without reflection, shared by an entire class, an entire people, and entire nation, or the entire human race" (Element XII, §145, pp.63-4). It is also available to the philosopher who, by deciphering and thus recovering its content, can discover an "ideal eternal history traversed in time by the histories of all nations" (Proposition XLII, §114, p.57).
The result of this, in Vico's view, is to appreciate history as at once "ideal"-since it is never perfectly actualized-and "eternal," because it reflects the presence of a divine order or Providence guiding the development of human institutions. Nations need not develop at the same pace-less developed ones can and do coexist with those in a more advanced phase-but they all pass through the same distinct stages (cursi): the ages of gods, heroes, and men. Nations "develop in conformity to this division," Vico says, "by a constant and uninterrupted order of causes and effects present in every nation" ("The Course the Nations Run," §915, p.335). Each stage, and thus the history of any nation, is characterized by the manifestation of natural law peculiar to it, and the distinct languages (signs, metaphors, and words), governments (divine, aristocratic commonwealths, and popular commonwealths and monarchies), as well as systems of jurisprudence (mystic theology, heroic jurisprudence, and the natural equity of free commonwealths) that define them.
In addition to specifying the distinct stages through which social, civil, and political order develops, Vico draws on his earlier writings to trace the origin of nations back to two distinct features of human nature: the ages of gods and heroes result from memory and creative acts of "imagination" (fantasia), while the age of men stems from the faculty of "reflection" (reflessione). Vico thus claims to have discovered two kinds of wisdom-"poetic" and "philosophical"-corresponding to the dual nature of human beings (sense and intellect), represented in the creations of theological poets and philosophers, respectively ("Poetic Wisdom," §779, p.297). Institutions arise first from the immediacy of sense-experience, pure feeling, curiosity, wonder, fear, superstition, and the child-like capacity of human beings to imitate and anthropomorphize the world around them. Since "in the world's childhood men were by nature sublime poets" (Element XXXVII, §187, p.71), Vico reasons, nations must be "poetic in their beginnings" (Element XLIV, §200, p.73), so that their origin and course can be discovered by recreating or remembering the "poetic" or "metaphysical truth" which underlies them (Element XLVII, §205, p.74). This is manifest primarily in fable, myth, the structure of early languages, and the formations of polytheistic religion. The belief systems of early societies are thus characterized by "poetic metaphysics" which "seeks its proofs not in the external world but within the modifications of the mind of him who meditates it" ("Poetic Wisdom," §374, p.116), and "poetic logic," through which the creations of this metaphysics are signified. Metaphysics of this sort is "not rational and abstract like that of learned men now," Vico emphasizes, "but felt and imagined [by men] without power of ratiocination...This metaphysics was their poetry, a faculty born with them...born of their ignorance of causes, for ignorance, the mother of wonder, made everything wonderful to men who were ignorant of everything" ("Poetic Wisdom," §375, p.116). Incapable of forming "intelligible class concepts of things"-a feature of human mind realized only in the age of men-people "had a natural need to create poetic characters; that is, imaginative class concepts or universals, to which, as to certain models or ideal portraits, to reduce all the particular species which resembled them" (Element XLIX, §209, p.74).
From this genus of poetic metaphysics, Vico then extrapolates the various species of wisdom born of it. "Poetic morals" have their source in piety and shame ("Poetic Wisdom," §502, p.170), he argues, while "poetic economy" arises from the feral equality of human beings and the family relationships into which they were forced by need ("Poetic Wisdom," §523, p.180). Similarly, "poetic cosmography" grows from the seeing "the world as composed of gods of the sky, of the underworld...and gods intermediate between earth and sky" ("Poetic Wisdom," §710, p.269), "poetic astronomy" from raising the gods "to the planets and [assigning] the heroes to the constellations" ("Poetic Wisdom," §728, p.277), "poetic chronology" out of the cycles of harvest and the seasons ("Poetic Wisdom," §732, p.279), and "poetic geography" from naming the natural world through "the semblances of things known or near at hand" ("Poetic Wisdom," §741, p.285). As the faculty of reason develops and grows, however, the power of imagination from which the earliest forms of human society grew weakens and gives way finally to the power of reflection; the cognitive powers of human beings gain ascendance over their creative capacity, and reason replaces poetry as the primary way of understanding the world. This defines the age of men which makes philosophy, Vico reasons, a relatively recent development in history, appearing as it did "some two thousand years after the gentile nations were founded" (Element CV, §313, p.92).
Since history itself, in Vico's view, is the manifestation of Providence in the world, the transition from one stage to the next and the steady ascendance of reason over imagination represent a gradual progress of civilization, a qualitative improvement from simpler to more complex forms of social organization. Vico characterizes this movement as a "necessity of nature" ("Idea of the Work," §34, p.21) which means that, with the passage of time, human beings and societies tend increasingly towards realizing their full potential. From rude beginnings undirected passion is transformed into virtue, the bestial state of early society is subordinated to the rule of law, and philosophy replaces sentiments of religion. "Out of ferocity, avarice, and ambition, the three vices which run throughout the human race," Vico says, "legislation creates the military, merchant, and governing classes, and thus the strength, riches, and wisdom of commonwealths. Out of these three great vices, which could certainly destroy all mankind on the face of the earth, it makes civil happiness" (Element VII, §132, p.62). In addition, the transition from poetic to rational consciousness enables reflective individuals-the philosopher, that is, in the shape of Vico-to recover the body of universal history from the particularity of apparently random events. This is a fact attested to by the form and content of The New Science itself.
Although from a general point of view history reveals a progress of civilization through actualizing the potential of human nature, Vico also emphasizes the cyclical feature of historical development. Society progresses towards perfection, but without reaching it (thus history is "ideal"), interrupted as it is by a break or return (recurso) to a relatively more primitive condition. Out of this reversal, history begins its course anew, albeit from the irreversibly higher point to which it has already attained. Vico observes that in the latter part of the age of men (manifest in the institutions and customs of medieval feudalism) the "barbarism" which marks the first stages of civil society returns as a "civil disease" to corrupt the body politic from within. This development is marked by the decline of popular commonwealths into bureaucratic monarchies, and, by the force of unrestrained passions, the return of corrupt manners which had characterized the earlier societies of gods and heroes. Out of this "second barbarism," however, either through the appearance of wise legislators, the rise of the fittest, or a the last vestiges of civilization, society returns to the "primitive simplicity of the first world of peoples," and individuals are again "religious, truthful, and faithful" ("Conclusion of the Work," §1104-1106, pp.423-4). From this begins a new curso which Vico saw manifest in his own time as the "second age of men" characterized by the "true" Christian religion and the monarchical government of seventeenth century Europe.
In addition to his account of the origins and history of civil society developed in The New Science, Vico also advances a highly original thesis about the origin and character of Homeric poetry, which he refers to as "The Discovery of the New Homer." Vico observes that the "vulgar feelings and vulgar customs provide the poets with their proper materials" ("Discovery of the True Homer," §781, p.301), and, given that in the age of heroes these customs constituted a "savage" and "unreasonable" state of human nature, the poetry of Homer cannot be the esoteric wisdom or creative act of a single individual, as scholars have assumed, but represents the imaginative universals of the Greek people themselves. Homeric poetry thus contains the "models or ideal portraits" which form the mental dictionary of the Ancients, and explains the place Vico assigns to Homer in the frontispiece where his statue represents the origins of human society in poetic wisdom. Vico thus applies his doctrine of the imaginative universal to the case of Homer and concludes that the though it "marks a famous epoch in history it never in the world took place." The historical Homer was "quite simply a man of the people" ("Discovery of the True Homer, §806, p.308) and quite distinct from the ostensible author of the Odyssey and Iliad who was actually a "purely ideal poet who never existed in the world of nature...but was an idea or a heroic character of Grecian men insofar as they told their histories in song" ("Discovery of the True Homer, §873, p.323).