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Turing Machine

A Turing machine is an abstract representation of a computing device. It consists of a read/write head that scans a (possibly infinite) one-dimensional (bi-directional) tape divided into squares, each of which is inscribed with a 0 or 1. Computation begins with the machine, in a given "state", scanning a square. It erases what it finds there, prints a 0 or 1, moves to an adjacent square, and goes into a new state. This behavior is completely determined by three parameters: (1) the state the machine is in, (2) the number on the square it is scanning, and (3) a table of instructions. The table of instructions specifies, for each state and binary input, what the machine should write, which direction it should move in, and which state it should go into. (E.g., "If in State 1 scanning a 0: print 1, move left, and go into State 3".) The table can list only finitely many states, each of which becomes implicitly defined by the role it plays in the table of instructions. These states are often referred to as the "functional states" of the machine.

A Turing machine, therefore, is more like a computer program (software) than a computer (hardware). Any given Turing machine can be realized or implemented on an infinite number of different physical computing devices. Computer scientists and logicians have shown that if conventional digital computers are considered in isolation from random external inputs (such as a bit stream generated by radioactive decay), then given enough time and tape, Turing machines can compute any function that any conventional digital computer can compute. (We won't consider whether Turing machines and modern digital computers remain equivalent when both are given external inputs, since that would require us to change the definition of a Turing machine.) Also, a ‘probabilistic automaton’ can be defined as a Turing machine in which the transition from input and state to output and state takes place with a certain probability (E.g. "If in State 1 scanning a 0: (a) there is a 60% probability that the machine will print 1, move left, and go into State 3, and (b) there is a 40% probability that the machine will print 0, move left, and go into State 2".)


Turing machines were first proposed by Alan Turing, in an attempt to give a mathematically precise definition of "algorithm" or "mechanical procedure". Early work by Turing and Alonzo Church spawned the branch of mathematical logic now known as recursive function theory.

Later Developments

The concept of a Turing machine has played an important role in the recent philosophy of mind. The suggestion has been made that mental states just are functional states of a probabilistic automaton, in which binary inputs and outputs have been replaced by sensory inputs and motor outputs. This idea underlies the theory of mind known as "machine functionalism".


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

artificial intelligence | Church-Turing Thesis | functionalism | Turing, Alan


The Editors would like to thank Stuart Shieber for pointing out that Turing machines need not have infinite, two-dimensional tapes, but that infinite, one-dimensional and bidirectional tapes suffice. We'd also like to thank Jef Raskin and Joshua Stern for helpful comments about the equivalence of Turing machines and conventional digital computers.

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