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The Identity Theory of Truth
The simplest and most general statement of the identity theory of
truth is that when a truth-bearer (e.g. a proposition) is
true, there is a truth-maker (e.g. a fact) with which it is identical
and the truth of the former consists in its identity with the
latter. The theory is best understood by contrast with a rival such
as the correspondence theory, according to which the relation of
truth-bearer to truth-maker is correspondence rather than identity.
The theory is a response to certain intellectual pressures. One such
pressure is the wish that there should be no gap between mind and
world: that when we think truly, we think what is the case.
Another is dissatisfaction with the correspondence theory of truth, of
the sort expressed by Frege [Frege (1918), p. 3]:
A correspondence, moreover, can only be perfect if the corresponding
things coincide and so are just not different things. ... It would
only be possible to compare an idea with a thing if the thing were an
idea too. And then, if the first did correspond perfectly with the
second, they would coincide. But this is not at all what people
intend when they define truth as the correspondence of an idea with
something real. For in this case it is essential precisely that the
reality shall be distinct from the idea. But then there can be no
complete correspondence, no complete truth. So nothing at all would
be true; for what is only half true is untrue. Truth does not admit
of more and less.
Frege then goes on to deploy a charge of circularity against the
likely reply that all the correspondence theory requires is
correspondence in a certain respect. He himself concluded that truth
was indefinable; but some have thought it possible to formulate an
identity theory of a recognizably Fregean sort.
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This theory is notably absent from textbook discussions of truth; and
there is controversy over whether it is a theory of truth at all.
Those who think that it is not are likely to make one or both of the
following objections: it is obviously absurd; no one has ever held it.
The remainder of this section is devoted to considering these two
Can the absurdity charge be met?
The identity theory is clearly absurd from the point of view of those
who, for instance, believe that truth-bearers are sentences and
truth-makers non-linguistic states of affairs. But it may be
available to those who hold the kinds of metaphysical views which
make truth-bearers and truth-makers more alike. (For ease of
expression, I shall from now on use the vocabulary of
‘judgments’ and ‘facts’ for truth-bearers and
truth-makers respectively, recognizing that these terms can be
tendentious -- especially in expressing the views of philosophers who
Making judgments more like facts
Some philosophers have tried to make judgments more like facts.
Russell, reacting against idealism, at one stage adopted a view of
judgment which did not regard it as an intermediary between the mind
and the world: instead, the constituents of judgments are the very
things the judgments are about. This involves a kind of realism about
judgments, and looks as though it offers the possibility of an
identity theory of truth. But since both true and false judgments are
equally composed of real constituents, truth would not be
distinguished from falsehood by being identical with reality; an
identity theory of truth is thus unavailable on this view of judgment
because it would be rendered vacuous by being inevitably accompanied
by an identity theory of falsehood. Those who have held this sort of
view of judgments, such as Moore and Russell, have accordingly been
forced to hold that truth is an unanalyzable property of some
judgments. If one looks for an identity theory here, one finds what
might be called an identity theory of judgment rather than of truth.
[Less brutally condensed accounts of these matters can be found in
Baldwin (1991), Candlish (1989) and Candlish (1996).]
Making facts more like judgments
Other philosophers, notably those who have held the idealist view that
reality is experience, have implied that facts are more like
judgments. One such is F.H. Bradley, who explicitly embraced an
identity theory of truth, regarding it as the only account capable of
resolving the difficulties he finds with the correspondence theory.
[See Bradley (1907).] The way he reaches it is worth describing in a
little detail, for it shows how he could avoid allowing the theory to
be rendered vacuous by an accompanying identity theory of falsehood.
Bradley argues that the correspondence theory's view of facts as real
and mutually independent entities is unsustainable: the impression of
their independent existence is the outcome of the illegitimate
projection on to the world of the divisions with which thought must
work, a projection which creates the illusion that a judgment can be
true by corresponding to part of a situation: as, e.g., the remark
‘The pie is in the oven’ might appear to be true despite its (by
omission) detaching the pie from its dish and the oven from the
kitchen. His hostility to such abstraction ensures that, according to
Bradley's philosophical logic, at most one judgment can be true --
that which encapsulates reality in its entirety. This allows his
identity theory of truth to be accompanied by a non-identity theory of
falsehood, since he can account for falsehood as a falling short of
this vast judgment and hence as an abstraction of part of reality from
the whole. The result is his adoption of the idea that there are
degrees of truth: that judgment is the least true which is the most
distant from the whole of reality. Although the consequence is that
all ordinary judgments will turn out to be more or less infected by
falsehood, Bradley allows some sort of place for false judgment and
the possibility of distinguishing worse from better. One might argue
that the reason the identity theory of truth remains only latent in
Russell and Moore is the surrounding combination of their atomistic
metaphysics and their assumption that truth is not a matter of degree.
For Bradley, then, at most one judgment can be fully true. But even
this one judgment has so far been conceived as describing
reality, and its truth as consisting in correspondence with a reality
not distorted by being mentally cut up into illusory fragments.
Accordingly, even this one, for the very reason that it remains a
description, will be infected by falsehood unless it ceases altogether
to be a judgment and becomes the reality it is meant to be
about. This apparently bizarre claim becomes intelligible if
seen as both the most extreme expression of his hostility to
abstraction and a reaction to the most fundamental of his objections
to the correspondence theory, which is the same as Frege's: that for
there to be correspondence rather than identity between judgment and
reality, the judgment must differ from reality and in so far as it
does differ, to that extent must distort and so falsify it.
Thus Bradley's version of the identity theory turns out to be
misleadingly so-called. For it is in fact an eliminativist theory:
when truth is attained, judgments disappear and only reality is left.
It is not surprising that Bradley, despite expressing his theory in
the language of identity, talked of the attainment of complete truth
in terms of thought's suicide. In the end, then, even the attribution
of the identity theory of truth to one who explicitly endorsed it
turns out to be dubious. [For a more detailed version of this section,
see Candlish (1995). For other doubts about whether Bradley was an
identity theorist, see Walker (1998).]
A metaphysically neutral identity theory
More recently there have been attempts, consciously taking
inspiration from Frege, to defend a metaphysically neutral version of
the theory: holding that truth-bearers are the contents of thoughts,
and that facts are simply true thoughts rather than the
metaphysically weighty sorts of things envisaged in correspondence
theories. That is, the identity is not conceived as a (potentially
troublesome) relation between an apparently mind-dependent judgment
and an apparently mind-independent fact. A claimed benefit of this
version is that it is not immediately disabled by the inevitable
accompaniment of an identity theory of falsehood. The difficulty for
these attempts is to make out the claim that they involve a
theory of truth at all, since they lack independent accounts
of truth-bearer and truth-maker to give the theory substance. [See
Candlish (1995), Dodd and Hornsby (1992), Dodd (1996), Hornsby
The most thorough account of this type is found in Dodd (2000). But
although this book in its very title proclaims its author's adherence
to an identity theory, it actually defends a variety of deflationism:
‘truth is nothing more than that whose expression in a
language gives that language a device for the formulation of indirect
and generalized assertions’ (p. 133, emphasis Dodd's). What
became of the identity theory? The answer lies in the fact that Dodd
conceives his identity theory as consisting entirely in the denial of
correspondence and the identification of facts with true thoughts. It
actually has nothing to say about ‘the nature of truth’, as
traditionally conceived, offering no definition of ‘is
true’, no explanation of what truth consists in or of the
difference between truth and falsehood. This theory is
‘modest’, to use Dodd's expression, as opposed to
‘robust’ identity theories which begin from the bipolar
recognition of independent conceptions of fact (conceived as
truth-maker) and proposition (conceived as truth-bearer) employed in
correspondence theories, and then attempt in one way or another to
eliminate the apparent gap between them. Dodd's view is that his
‘modest’ theory gets some bite from its opposition to
correspondence theories; and he urges (as does Hornsby) that we
should anyway scale down our expectations of what a theory of truth
can provide. However, the history of identity theories of truth
reveals them as tending to mutate into other theories when put under
pressure, as one can see from the discussion in the present
article. Dodd holds that this is a problem only for robust
theories. Yet his theory also exemplifies a variety of this tendency:
in the end, it evolves into deflationism.
Can the no-holder charge be met?
Although it is difficult to find a completely uncontroversial
attribution of the identity theory, there is evidence of its presence
in the thought of a few major philosophers. As one might expect,
mystical philosophers attracted by the idea that the world is a unity
express views which at least resemble the theory (for example,
Plotinus, The Enneads: 5th Ennead, 3rd Tractate,
§5; 5th Ennead, 5th Tractate, §2). Bradley may also fall
into this category; in any case, he and Frege have already been
mentioned. Bolzano and Meinong are other possibilities: Findlay, for
example, believes Meinong to have held an identity theory, reminding
us that on his view, there are no entities between our minds and the
facts; facts themselves are true in so far as they are the objects of
judgments. [See Findlay (1933), Ch. III sec. ix.] C.A. Baylis
defended a similar account of truth in 1948, and Roderick Chisholm
endorsed a recognizably Meinongian account in his Theory of
Knowledge. A sketchy version of the theory is embraced in
Woozley's Theory of Knowledge. There are also the
attempts, once again already mentioned, to establish a metaphysically
neutral version: these show that there can be no doubt that some
philosophers have tried to defend something that they wished to call
an identity theory of truth.
Thomas Baldwin argues that the identity theory of truth, though
itself indefensible, has played an influential but subterranean role
within philosophy from the nineteenth century onwards, citing as
examples philosophers of widely different convictions. [See Baldwin
(1991). One of his attributions is queried in Stern (1993), others in
Candlish (1995).] Whether or not Baldwin is right -- and it is
possible that the theory is no more than an historical curiosity --
the identity theory of truth in its full-blooded form may turn out to
be best thought of as comparable to solipsism: rarely, if ever,
consciously held, but the inevitable result of thinking out the most
extreme consequences of assumptions which philosophers often just
take for granted.
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In each case, the date shown immediately after the author's name is
the date of original publication. A separate date is shown for the
edition cited only where this differs from the original.
- Baldwin, T. (1991), ‘The Identity Theory of Truth’,
Mind 100, pp. 35-52.
- Baylis, C.A. (1948), ‘Facts, Propositions, Exemplification and
Truth’, Mind, LVII, pp. 459-79.
- Bolzano, B. (1837), Wissenschaftslehre (Leipzig:
Felix Meiner 1929), Vol. I, sections 19-33.
- Bradley, F.H. (1907), ‘On Truth and Copying’, Essays on
Truth and Reality (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1914), pp. 107-26.
- Candlish, S. (1989), ‘The Truth about F.H. Bradley’,
Mind 98, pp. 331-48.
- -----. (1995), ‘Resurrecting the Identity Theory of
Truth’, Bradley Studies 1, pp. 116-24.
- -----. (1996), ‘The Unity of the Proposition and
Russell's Theories of Judgment’, in Bertrand Russell
and the Origins of Analytical Philosophy, ed. Ray Monk and
Anthony Palmer (Bristol: Thoemmes).
- -----. (1999), ‘Identifying the Identity Theory of
Truth’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society,
XCIC, pp. 233-40.
- -----. (1999), ‘A Prolegomenon to an Identity Theory
of Truth’, Philosophy, 74, pp. 199-221.
- Cartwright, R. (1987), ‘A Neglected Theory of Truth’, in his
Philosophical Essays (Cambridge, MA and London: The MIT
- Chisholm, R.M. (1966), Theory of Knowledge
(Englewood Cliffs, N.J.: Prentice-Hall), Ch. 7.
- Dodd, J. (1995), ‘McDowell and Identity Theories of Truth’,
Analysis 55, pp.160-5.
- -----. (1996), ‘Resurrecting the Identity Theory of Truth: A
Reply to Candlish’, Bradley Studies 2, pp. 42-50.
- -----. (1999), ‘Hornsby on the Identity Theory of Truth’,
Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, XCIC,
- -----. (2000), An Identity Theory of Truth
- Dodd, J. and Hornsby, J. (1992), ‘The Identity Theory of
Truth: Reply to Baldwin’, Mind 101,
- Findlay, J.N. (1933), Meinong's Theory of Objects
(Oxford: Oxford University Press).
- Frege, G. (1918), ‘Thoughts’, in his Logical
Investigations (Oxford: Blackwell, 1977).
- Hornsby, J. (1997), ‘Truth: The Identity Theory’,
Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society XCVII, pp. 1-24.
- -----. (1999), ‘The Facts in Question: a Response to Dodd
and to Candlish’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian
Society, XCIC, pp. 241-45.
- Plotinus (301), The Enneads, transl. Stephen
MacKenna (London: Faber and Faber 1917; 3rd edn revised by B.S. Page,
- Stern, R. (1993), ‘Did Hegel Hold an Identity Theory of
Truth?’, Mind 102, pp. 645-47.
- Walker, R.C.S. (1998), ‘Bradley's Theory of
Truth’, in Appearance versus Reality, ed. Guy Stock
(Oxford: Clarendon Press), pp. 93-109.
- Woozley, A.D. (1949), Theory of Knowledge (London:
Hutchinson), Ch. 7.
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[Please contact the author with suggestions.]
Bradley, Francis Herbert |
Frege, Gottlob |
Meinong, Alexius |
Moore, George Edward |
Russell, Bertrand |
truth: coherence theory of |
truth: correspondence theory of |
truth: deflationary theory of |
truth: revision theory of
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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy