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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Discussions of the nature of time, and of various issues related to time, have always featured prominently in philosophy, but they have been especially important since the beginning of the 20th Century. This article contains a brief overview of some of the main topics in the philosophy of time -- Fatalism; the Topology of Time; Reductionism and Platonism with Respect to Time; McTaggart's Arguments; The A Theory of Time and The B Theory of Time; Presentism, Eternalism, and The Growing Universe Theory; Time Travel; and The 3D/4D Controversy -- together with some suggestions for further reading on each topic, and a bibliography.
A good deal of work in the philosophy of time has been produced by people worried about Fatalism, which can be understood as the thesis that whatever will happen in the future is already unavoidable (where to say that an event is unavoidable is to say that no human is able to prevent it from occurring). Here is a typical argument for Fatalism.
(1) There exist now propositions about everything that might happen in the future. (2) Every proposition is either true or else false. (3) If (1) and (2), then there exists now a set of true propositions that, taken together, correctly predict everything that will happen in the future. (4) If there exists now a set of true propositions that, taken together, correctly predict everything that will happen in the future, then whatever will happen in the future is already unavoidable. ------------------- (5) Whatever will happen in the future is already unavoidable.
The main objections to arguments like this have been to premises (2) and (4). The rationale for premise (2) is that it appears to be a fundamental principle of semantics, sometimes referred to as The Principle of Bivalence (or just Bivalence for short). The rationale for premise (4) is the claim that no one is able to make a true prediction turn out false.
A proper discussion of Fatalism would include a lengthy consideration of premise (4), and that would take us beyond the scope of this article. For our purposes it is important to note that many writers have been motivated by this kind of argument to deny Bivalence. According to this line, there are many propositions -- namely, propositions about matters that are both future and contingent -- that are neither true nor false right now. Take, for example, the proposition that you will have lunch tomorrow. On this view, that proposition either has no truth value right now, or else has the value indeterminate. When the relevant time comes, and you either have lunch or don't, then, on the view in question, the proposition that you have lunch on the relevant day will come to be either true or false (as the case may be), and from then on that proposition will forever be either true or false (again, depending on whether you had lunch at the relevant time).
The view that Bivalence is false, and that, in particular, there are sometimes propositions about the future that are neither true nor false, is sometimes referred to as the “Open Future” response to arguments for Fatalism. One important presupposition of the Open Future response is that it makes sense to talk about a proposition's having a truth value at a time, and that, moreover, it is possible for a proposition to have different truth values at different times. Thus, the Open Future response to arguments for Fatalism entails the following semantical thesis.
The Tensed View of Semantics:
- Propositions have truth values at times rather than just having truth values simpliciter.
- The fundamental semantical locution is ‘p is v at t’ (where the expression in place of ‘p’ refers to a proposition, the expression in place of ‘v’ refers to a truth value, and the expression in place of ‘t’ refers to a time).
- It is possible for a proposition to have different truth values at different times.
The Tensed View of Semantics can be contrasted with the following semantical view.
The Tenseless View of Semantics:
- Propositions have truth values simpliciter rather than having truth values at times.
- The fundamental semantical locution is ‘p is v’ (where the expression in place of ‘p’ refers to a proposition and the expression in place of ‘v’ refers to a truth value.
- It is not possible for a proposition to have different truth values at different times.
Other views that have (at least sometimes) been associated with the Open Future response to Fatalism include Taking Tense Seriously and The Growing Universe Theory, which will be discussed below.
Suggestions for Further Reading: Aristotle, De Interpretatione, Ch. 9; Lewis, “The Paradoxes of Time Travel;” Markosian, “The Open Past;” McCall, A Model of the Universe; Taylor, Metaphysics, Ch. 6; van Inwagen, An Essay on Free Will, Ch. 2.
One of the leading theories in contemporary cosmology is The Big Bang Theory, according to which the universe exploded into existence at a certain time in the past (some 15 to 25 billion years ago). If The Big Bang Theory is true, then the universe had a beginning. Does that mean that time also had a beginning? Or could it be that there was an infinite expanse of “empty” time before the universe ever popped into existence? Could it in fact be that, whether there was a beginning to the universe or not, time itself could not possibly have had a beginning?
Various philosophers have argued that time could not have had a beginning, while others have argued that time must have had (or at least contingently did have) a beginning. There is a corresponding controversy over the question of whether time will have an end. These controversies concern one aspect of the topology, or structure, of time.
Other issues concerning the topology of time include (i) whether time is branching or non-branching, (ii) whether time is open or closed, (iii) whether there can be two or more disconnected time streams, (iv) whether time has an intrinsic direction, and (v) whether time is dense or continuous or neither.
Suggestions for Further Reading: On the beginning and end of time: Aristotle, Physics, Bk. VIII; Kant, The Critique of Pure Reason, esp. pp. 75ff.; Newton-Smith, The Structure of Time, Ch. V; Swinburne, “The Beginning of the Universe;” Swinburne, Space and Time. On the linearity of time: Newton-Smith, The Structure of Time, Ch. III; Swinburne, Space and Time. On the direction of time: Price, “A Neglected Route to Realism About Quantum Mechanics;” Price, Time's Arrow and Archimedes' Point: New Directions for the Physics of Time; Savitt, Time's Arrows Today; Sklar, Space, Time, and Spacetime. On all of these topics: Newton-Smith, The Structure of Time.
What if one day things everywhere ground to a halt? What if birds froze in mid-flight, people froze in mid-sentence, and planets and subatomic particles alike froze in mid-orbit? What if all change, throughout the entire universe, completely ceased for a period of, say, one year? Is such a thing possible?
If the answer to this last question is Yes -- if it is possible for there to be a period of time during which nothing changes, anywhere (except, perhaps, for the pure passage of time itself, if there is such a thing) -- then it is possible that a worldwide “freeze” will occur between the time you finish reading this sentence and the time you start the next sentence. In fact, if it's possible for there to be a period of time without change, then it may well be that a billion years have passed since you finished reading the last sentence. (Or maybe it just feels that way.)
The question of whether there could be time without change has been debated by philosophers since the days of Plato and Aristotle, and has traditionally been thought to be closely tied to the question of whether time exists independently of the events that occur in time. For, the thinking goes, if there could be a period of time without change, then it follows that time could exist without any events to fill it; but if, on the other hand, there could not be a period of time without change, then it must be that time exists only if there are some events to fill it.
Aristotle and others (including, especially, Leibniz) have argued that time does not exist independently of the events that occur in time. This view is typically called either “Reductionism with Respect to Time” or “Relationism with Respect to Time,” since according to this view, all talk that appears to be about time and temporal relations can somehow be reduced to talk about events and relations among them.
The opposing view, normally referred to either as “Platonism with Respect to Time” or as “Absolutism with Respect to Time,” has been defended by Plato, Newton, and others. On this view, time is like an empty container into which events may be placed; but it is a container that exists independently of whether or not anything is placed in it.
Reductionism and Platonism with Respect to Time have spatial analogues, and the views about time have traditionally been taken to stand or fall with their spatial counterparts. Indeed, although there is some controversy over the degree to which time is similar to the dimensions of space, the Reductionism vs. Platonism dispute is almost universally thought to be one area in which the two dimensions are perfectly analogous.
Suggestions for Further Reading: Alexander, The Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence; Newton-Smith, The Structure of Time; Shoemaker, “Time Without Change.”
In a famous paper published in 1908, J.M.E. McTaggart argued that there is in fact no such thing as time, and that the appearance of a temporal order to the world is a mere appearance. Other philosophers before and since (including, especially, F.H. Bradley) have argued for the same conclusion. We will focus here only on McTaggart's argument against the reality of time, which has been by far the most influential.
McTaggart begins his argument by distinguishing two ways in which positions in time can be ordered. First, he says, positions in time can be ordered according to their possession of properties like being two days future, being one day future, being present, being one day past, etc. (These properties are often referred to now as “A properties.”) McTaggart calls the series of times ordered by these properties “the A series.” But he says that positions in time can also be ordered by two-place relations like two days earlier than, one day earlier than, simultaneous with, etc. (These relations are now often called “B relations.”) McTaggart calls the series of times ordered by these relations “the B series.” And McTaggart argues that the B series alone does not constitute a proper time series. I.e., McTaggart says that the A series is essential to time. His reason for this is that change (he says) is essential to time, and the B series without the A series does not involve genuine change (since B series positions are forever “fixed,” whereas A series positions are constantly changing).
McTaggart also argues that the A series is inherently contradictory. For (he says) the different A properties are incompatible with one another. (No time can be both future and past, for example.) Nevertheless, he insists, each time in the A series must possess all of the different A properties. (Since a time that is future will be present and past, and so on.)
One response to this argument that McTaggart anticipates involves claiming that it's not true of any time, t, that t is both future and past. Rather, the objection goes, we must say that t was future at some moment of past time and will be past at some moment of future time. But this objection fails, according to McTaggart, because the additional times that are invoked in order to explain t's possession of the incompatible A properties must themselves possess all of the same A properties (as must any further times invoked on account of these additional times, and so on ad infinitum). Thus, according to McTaggart, we never resolve the original contradiction inherent in the A series, but, instead, merely generate an infinite regress of more and more contradictions.
Since, according to McTaggart, the supposition that there is an A series leads to contradiction, and since (he says) there can be no time without an A series, McTaggart concludes that time itself, including both the A series and the B series, is unreal.
Philosophers like McTaggart who claim that time is unreal are aware of the seemingly paradoxical nature of their claim. They generally take the line that all appearances suggesting that there is a temporal order to things are illusory.
Suggestions for Further Reading: Bradley, Appearance and Reality; McTaggart, “The Unreality of Time;” Mellor, Real Time II; Prior, Papers on Time and Tense; Prior, Past, Present, and Future.
Needless to say, despite arguments such as McTaggart's, many philosophers have remained convinced of the reality of time (for it certainly seems like there is a temporal order to the world). But a number of philosophers have been convinced by at least one part of McTaggart's argument, namely, the part about the contradiction inherent in the A series. That is, some philosophers have been persuaded by McTaggart that the A series is not real, even though they have not gone so far as to deny the reality of time itself. These philosophers accept the view (sometimes called “The B Theory”) that the B series is all there is to time. According to The B Theory, there are no genuine, unanalyzable A properties, and all talk that appears to be about A properties is really reducible to talk about B relations. For example, when we say that the year 1900 has the property of being past, all we really mean is that 1900 is earlier than the time at which we are speaking. On this view, there is no sense in which it is true to say that time really passes, and any appearance to the contrary is merely a result of the way we humans happen to perceive the world.
The opponents of The B Theory accept the view (often referred to as “The A Theory”) that there are genuine properties such as being two days past, being present, etc.; that facts about these A properties are not in any way reducible to facts about B relations; and that times and events are constantly changing with respect to their A properties (first becoming less and less future, then becoming present, and subsequently becoming more and more past). According to The A Theory, the passage of time is a very real and inexorable feature of the world, and not merely some mind-dependent phenomenon.
(It is worth noting that some discussions of these issues employ terminology that is different from the A series/B series terminology used here. For example, some discussions frame the issue in terms of a question about the reality of tense (roughly, the irreducible possession by times, events, and things of genuine A properties), with A Theorists characterized as those who affirm the reality of tense and B Theorists characterized as those who deny the reality of tense.)
The A Theorist is normally happy to concede McTaggart's claim that there can be no time without an A series, but the typical A Theorist will want to reject the part of McTaggart's argument that says that the A series is inherently contradictory. For the typical A Theorist will deny McTaggart's claim that each time in the A series must possess all of the different A properties. That is, she will deny that it is true of any time, t, that t is past, present, and future. Instead, she will insist, the closest thing to this that can be true of a time, t, is (for example) that t was future, is present, and will be past, where the verbal tenses of the verb ‘to be’ in this claim are not to be analyzed away (just as the apparent references to the putative A properties pastness, presentness, and futurity are not to be analyzed away in favor of reference to B relations).
Thus the standard A Theorist's response to McTaggart's argument involves the notion that we must “take tense seriously,” in the sense that there is a fundamental distinction between (for example) saying that x is F and saying that x was F. The thesis can be put this way.
Taking Tense Seriously: The verbal tenses of ordinary language (expressions like ‘it is the case that’, ‘it was the case that’, and ‘it will be the case that’) must be taken as primitive and unanalyzable.
In virtue of her commitment to Taking Tense Seriously, the A Theorist will say that no time ever possesses all of the different A properties. Thus, according to the A Theorist, there is no contradiction in the A series -- i.e., no contradiction in saying of a time, t, that t was future, is present, and will be past -- and, hence, no contradiction to be passed along to the different times at which t was future, is present, and will be past.
In effect, then, the typical A Theorist makes exactly the move in response to McTaggart's argument that McTaggart anticipated, and explicitly rejected. Not surprisingly, then, many supporters of McTaggart's argument feel that the A Theorist's response fails.
Although some B Theorists deny that time really passes as a result of considering McTaggart's argument, many B Theorists have different reasons for saying that time doesn't really pass. Two other arguments against The A Theory (besides McTaggart's argument, that is) have been especially influential. The first of these is an argument from the special theory of relativity in physics. According to that theory (the argument goes), there is no such thing as absolute simultaneity. But if there is no such thing as absolute simultaneity, then there cannot be objective facts of the form “t is present” or “t is 12 seconds past”. Thus, according to this line of argument, there cannot be objective facts about A properties, and so the passage of time cannot be an objective feature of the world.
It looks as if the A Theorist must choose between two possible responses to the argument from relativity: (1) deny the theory of relativity, or (2) deny that the theory of relativity actually entails that there can be no such thing as absolute simultaneity. Option (1) has had its proponents (including Arthur Prior), but in general has not proven to be widely popular. This may be on account of the enormous respect philosophers typically have for leading theories in the empirical sciences. Option (2) seems like a promising approach for A Theorists, but A Theorists who opt for this line are faced with the task of giving some account of just what the theory of relativity does entail with respect to absolute simultaneity. (Perhaps it can be plausibly argued that while relativity entails that it is physically impossible to observe whether two events are absolutely simultaneous, the theory nevertheless has no bearing on whether there is such a phenomenon as absolute simultaneity.)
The second of the two other influential arguments against The A Theory concerns the rate of the alleged passage of time. According to this argument, if it is true to say that time really passes, then it makes sense to ask how fast time passes. But (the argument goes) if it makes sense to ask how fast time passes, then it is possible for there to be a coherent answer to that question. Yet, according to the argument, there is no rate that can be coherently assigned to the passage of time. (“One hour per hour,” for example, is said not to be a coherent answer to the question “How fast does time pass?”) Thus, the argument concludes, it cannot be true to say that time really passes.
This argument raises important questions concerning the correct way to talk about rates, but it has been argued that the A Theorist can answer those questions in a way that allows her to avoid any untoward consequences.
Suggestions for Further Reading: For general discussion of The A Theory and The B Theory: Le Poidevin, Questions of Time and Tense; Le Poidevin and McBeath, The Philosophy of Time; Mellor, Real Time II; Markosian, “How Fast Does Time Pass?;” McTaggart, “The Unreality of Time;” Prior, “Changes in Events and Changes in Things;” Prior, “The Notion of the Present;” Prior, Papers on Time and Tense; Prior, Past, Present, and Future; Prior, “Some Free Thinking About Time;” Prior, “Thank Goodness That's Over;” Sider, Four-Dimensionalism; Smart, Philosophy and Scientific Realism; Smart, “The River of Time;” Smith, Language and Time; Williams, “The Myth of Passage;” Zwart, About Time. For discussion of the argument from relativity against The A Theory: Godfrey-Smith, “Special Relativity and the Present;” Hinchliff, “The Puzzle of Change;” Markosian, “A Defense of Presentism;” Maxwell, “Are Probabilism and Special Relativity Incompatible?;” Prior, “The Notion of the Present;” Prior, “Some Free Thinking About Time;” Putnam, “Time and Physical Geometry;” Savitt, “There's No Time Like the Present (in Minkowski Spacetime);” Sklar, Space, Time, and Spacetime; Stein, “On Einstein-Minkowski Space-Time;” Stein, “A Note on Time and Relativity Theory;” Weingard, “Relativity and the Reality of Past and Future Events.” For discussion of the argument concerning the rate of the alleged passage of time: Markosian, “How Fast Does Time Pass?;” Prior, “Changes in Events and Changes in Things;” Smart, “The River of Time;” Williams, “The Myth of Passage;” Zwart, About Time.
According to The B Theory, time is very much like the dimensions of space. Just as there are no genuine spatial properties (like being north), but, rather, only two-place, spatial relations (like north of), so too, according to the B Theorist, there are no genuine A properties. According to The A Theory, on the other hand, time is very different from the dimensions of space. For even though there are no genuine spatial properties like being north, there are, according to the A Theorist, genuine A properties; and time, unlike space, can truly be said to pass, according to The A Theory.
There is another important respect in which some (but not all) A Theorists believe time to be unlike the dimensions of space. Some A Theorists believe that there are crucial ontological differences between time and the dimensions of space. For some A Theorists also endorse a view known as “Presentism,” and others endorse a view that we will call “The Growing Universe Theory.”
Presentism is the view that only present objects exist. More precisely, it is the view that, necessarily, it is always true that only present objects exist. (At least, that is how the name ‘Presentism’ will be used here. Some writers have used the name differently. Note that, unless otherwise indicated, what is meant here by ‘present’ is temporally present, as opposed to spatially present.) According to Presentism, if we were to make an accurate list of all the things that exist -- i.e., a list of all the things that our most unrestricted quantifiers range over -- there would be not a single non-present object on the list. Thus, you and the Taj Mahal would be on the list, but neither Socrates nor any future Martian outposts would be included. (Assuming, that is, both (i) that each person is identical to his or her body, and (ii) that Socrates's body ceased to be present -- thereby going out of existence, according to Presentism -- shortly after he died. Those who reject the first of these assumptions should simply replace the examples in this article involving allegedly non-present people with appropriate examples involving the non-present bodies of those people.) And it's not just Socrates and future Martian outposts, either -- the same goes for any other putative object that lacks the property of being present. All such objects are unreal, according to Presentism.
Presentism is opposed by Non-presentism, which is the view that there are some non-present objects. More precisely, Non-presentism is the view that, possibly, it is sometimes true that there are some non-present objects.
‘Non-presentism’ is an umbrella term that covers several different, more specific versions of the view. One version of Non-presentism is Eternalism, which says that objects from both the past and the future exist just as much as present objects. According to Eternalism, non-present objects like Socrates and future Martian outposts exist right now, even though they are not currently present. We may not be able to see them at the moment, on this view, and they may not be in the same space-time vicinity that we find ourselves in right now, but they should nevertheless be on the list of all existing things.
It might be objected that there is something odd about attributing to a Non-presentist the claim that Socrates exists right now, since there is a sense in which that claim is clearly false. In order to forestall this objection, let us distinguish between two senses of ‘x exists now’. In one sense, which we can call the temporal location sense, this expression is synonymous with ‘x is present’. The Non-presentist will admit that, in the temporal location sense of ‘x exists nowd’', it is true that no non-present objects exist right now. But in the other sense of ‘x exists now’, which we can call the ontological sense, to say that x exists now is just to say that x is now in the domain of our most unrestricted quantifiers, whether x happens to be present, like you and me, or non-present, like Socrates. When we attribute to Non-presentists the claim that non-present objects like Socrates exist right now, we commit the Non-presentist only to the claim that these non-present objects exist now in the ontological sense (the one involving the most unrestricted quantifiers).
According to the Eternalist, temporal location matters not at all when it comes to ontology. But according to a somewhat less popular version of Non-presentism, temporal location does matter when it comes to ontology, because only objects that are either past or present -- but not objects that are future -- exist. On this view, which we can call “The Growing Universe Theory,” the universe is always growing, as more and more things are added on to the front end (temporally speaking).
Despite the claim by some Presentists that theirs is the common sense view, it is pretty clear that there are some major problems facing Presentism (and, to a lesser extent, The Growing Universe Theory; but in what follows we will focus on the problems facing Presentism). One problem has to do with what appears to be perfectly meaningful talk about non-present objects, such as Socrates and the year 3000. If there really are no non-present objects, then it is hard to see what we are referring to when we use expressions such as ‘Socrates’ and ‘the year 3000’.
Another problem for the Presentist has to do with relations involving non-present objects. It is natural to say, for example, that Abraham Lincoln was taller than Napoleon Bonaparte, and that World War II was a cause of the end of The Depression. But how can we make sense of such talk, if there really are no non-present objects?
A third problem for the Presentist has to do with the very plausible principle that for every truth, there is a truth-maker. The problem is that it is hard to see what the truth-makers could be for such truths as that there were dinosaurs and that there will be Martian outposts.
Finally, the Presentist, in virtue of being an A Theorist, must deal with the arguments against The A Theory that were discussed above.
Suggestions for Further Reading: Adams, “Time and Thisness;” Bigelow, “Presentism and Properties;” Hinchliff, “The Puzzle of Change;” Keller and Nelson, “Presentists Should Believe in Time-Travel;” Markosian, “A Defense of Presentism;” McCall, A Model of the Universe; Sider, Four-Dimensionalism; Sider, “Presentism and Ontological Commitment;” Tooley, Time, Tense, and Causation; Zimmerman, “Persistence and Presentism;” Zimmerman, “Temporary Intrinsics and Presentism.”
We are all familiar with time travel stories, and there are few among us who have not imagined traveling back in time to experience some particular period or meet some notable person from the past. But is time travel even possible?
One question that is relevant here is whether time travel is permitted by the prevailing laws of nature. This is presumably a matter of empirical science (or perhaps the correct philosophical interpretation of our best theories from the empirical sciences). But a further question, and one that falls squarely under the heading of philosophy, is whether time travel is permitted by the laws of logic and metaphysics. For it has been argued that various absurdities follow from the supposition that time travel is (logically and metaphysically) possible. Here is an example of such an argument.
(1) If you could travel back in time, then you could kill your grandfather before your father was ever conceived. (For what's to stop you from bringing a gun with you and simply shooting him?) (2) It's not the case that you could kill your grandfather before your father was ever conceived. (Because if you did, then you would ensure that you never existed, and that is not something that you could ensure.) ------------------- (3) You cannot travel back in time.
Another argument that might be raised against the possibility of time travel depends on the claim that Presentism is true. For if Presentism is true, then neither past nor future objects exist. And in that case, it is hard to see how anyone could travel to the past or the future.
Despite the existence of these and other arguments against the possibility of time travel, there may also be problems associated with the claim that time travel is not possible. For one thing, many scientists and philosophers believe that the actual laws of physics are in fact compatible with time travel. And for another thing, as I mentioned at the beginning of this section, we often think about time travel stories; but it is very plausible to think that a story cannot depict things that are downright impossible. For example, it is natural to think that there could not be a story in which two plus two are five, or in which there is a sphere that both is and is not red all over. (This seems especially true if the story is told pictorially, as in the case of a movie.) Hence, if time travel is impossible, then we should not even be able to consider any story in which time travel occurs. And yet we do so all the time! One task facing the philosopher who claims that time travel is impossible, then, is to explain the existence of a huge number of well-known stories that appear to be specifically about time travel.
Suggestions for Further Reading: Earman, “Recent Work on Time Travel;” Keller and Nelson, “Presentists Should Believe in Time-Travel;” Lewis, “The Paradoxes of Time Travel;” Meiland, “A Two-Dimensional Passage Model of Time for Time Travel;” Thorn, Black Holes and Time Warps; Yourgrau, Gödel Meets Einstein: Time Travel in the Gödel Universe; Sider, Four-Dimensionalism.
It is uncontroversial that physical objects are typically extended in both space and time. But there is some controversy in the philosophy of time over whether extension in time is analogous to extension in space. Spatial extension is normally thought of as necessarily involving different spatial parts at different locations in space. (Although it should be noted that those who believe in extended mereological simples (i.e., objects without proper parts) would deny this.) A bicycle, for example, can be extended across a doorway in virtue of having some spatial parts inside the doorway and other spatial parts outside the doorway. Is temporal extension necessarily like this? That is, when a bicycle is extended from time t1 to time t2, does it have its temporal extension in virtue of having different temporal parts at the different times? Or does a bicycle manage to be extended in time from t1 to t2 in virtue of being “wholly present” (as opposed to merely partly present) at each of those times?
According to The 4D View, temporally extended objects have temporal parts, temporal extension is perfectly analogous to spatial extension, and time is one of four dimensions that are on a par, at least with respect to the manner in which objects are spread out in space-time. On The 3D View, however, temporally extended objects do not have temporal parts, temporal extension is very different from spatial extension, and time is unique among the four dimensions of the world, at least with respect to the manner in which objects are spread out in space-time.
On The 4D View, objects are to be thought of as four-dimensional “space-time worms,” each of which is made up of many different temporal parts, like the different spatial segments of an earthworm. An object at a time -- Descartes in 1625, for example -- is not the whole object but, rather, a mere part (a temporal part) of that object; and the relation between Descartes in 1625 and Descartes in 1635 is like the relation between the two wheels of a bicycle: they are different parts of a bigger whole. By contrast, on The 3D View, objects are to be thought of as three-dimensional things that are not made up of different temporal parts. On this view, an object at a time -- Descartes in 1625, for example -- is the same thing as the whole object -- Descartes. Thus, according to The 3D View, the relation between Descartes in 1625 and Descartes in 1635 is the relation of identity: each one is just the same thing as Descartes.
As in the case of the disputes between A Theorists and B Theorists, on the one hand, and Presentists and Non-presentists, on the other hand, the 3D/4D controversy is part of a general disagreement among philosophers of time concerning the degree to which time is dissimilar from the dimensions of space. That general disagreement has been an important theme in the philosophy of time during the last one hundred years, and will most likely continue to be so for some time to come.
Suggestions for Further Reading: Haslanger, “Endurance and Temporary Intrinsics;” Haslanger, “Humean Supervenience and Enduring Things;” Haslanger, “Persistence, Change, and Explanation;” Heller, The Ontology of Physical Objects; Hudson, A Materialist Metaphysics of the Human Person; Lewis, On the Plurality of Worlds; Quine, Word and Object; Rea, “Temporal Parts Unmotivated;” Sider, Four-Dimensionalism; Thomson, “Parthood and Identity Across Time;” van Inwagen, “Four-Dimensional Objects;” Williams, “The Myth of Passage;” Zimmerman, “Persistence and Presentism.”